This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. |

- A Botched Suicide
- Why Do Time Travel Suicides Get Botched?
- Topology and Constraints
- The General Possibility of Time Travel in General Relativity
- Two Toy Models
- Slightly More Realistic Models of Time Travel
- Even If There are Constraints, So What?
- Quantum Mechanics to the Rescue?
- Conclusions
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

Well, one worry is the question as to why such schemes always fail.
Doesn’t the necessity of such failures put *prima facie* unusual
and unexpected constraints on the actions of people, or objects, that
have traveled in time? Don’t we have good reason to believe that
there are no such constraints (in our world) and thus that there is
no time travel (in our world)? We will later return to the issue of
the palatability of such constraints, but first we want to discuss an
argument that no constraints are imposed by time travel.

Imagine the following set-up. We start off having a camera with a black and white film ready to take a picture of whatever comes out of the time machine. An object, in fact a developed film, comes out of the time machine. We photograph it, and develop the film. The developed film is subsequently put in the time machine, and set to come out of the time machine at the time the picture is taken. This surely will create a paradox: the developed film will have the opposite distribution of black, white, and shades of gray, from the object that comes out of the time machine. For developed black and white films (i.e. negatives) have the opposite shades of gray from the objects they are pictures of. But since the object that comes out of the time machine is the developed film itself it we surely have a paradox.

However, it does not take much thought to realize that there is no paradox here. What will happen is that a uniformly gray picture will emerge, which produces a developed film that has exactly the same uniform shade of gray. No matter what the sensitivity of the film is, as long as the dependence of the brightness of the developed film depends in a continuous manner on the brightness of the object being photographed, there will be a shade of gray that, when photographed, will produce exactly the same shade of gray on the developed film. This is the essence of Wheeler and Feynman’s idea. Let us first be a bit more precise and then a bit more general.

For simplicity let us suppose that the film is always a uniform shade of gray (i.e. at any time the shade of gray does not vary by location on the film) The possible shades of gray of the film can then be represented by the (real) numbers from 0, representing pure black, to 1, representing pure white.

Let us now distinguish various stages in the chronogical order of the life of the film. In stage

Figure 0

Let us now be more general and allow color photography. One can represent each possible color of an object (of uniform color) by the proportions of blue, green and red that make up that color. (This is why television screens can produce all possible colors.) Thus one can represent all possible colors of an object by three points on three orthogonal lines x, y and z, that is to say, by a point in a three-dimensional cube. This cube is also known as the ‘Cartesian product’ of the three line segments. Now, one can also show that any continuous map from such a cube to itself must have at least one fixed point. So color photography can not be used to create time travel paradoxes either!

Even more generally, consider some system *P* which, as in the
above example, has the following life. It starts in some state
*S*_{1}, it interacts with an object that comes out of a
time machine (which happens to be its older self), it travels back in
time, it interacts with some object (which happens to be its younger
self), and finally it grows old and dies. Let us assume that the set
of possible states of *P* can be represented by a Cartesian
product of *n* closed intervals of the reals, i.e. let us assume
that the topology of the state-space of *P* is isomorphic to a
finite Cartesian product of closed intervals of the reals. Let us
further assume that the development of *P* in time, and the
dependence of that development on the state of objects that it
interacts with, is continuous. Then, by a well-known fixed point
theorem in topology (see e.g. Hocking and Young 1961, p 273), no
matter what the nature of the interaction is, and no matter what the
initial state of the object is, there will be at least one state
*S*_{3} of the older system (as it emerges from the time
travel machine) that will influence the initial state
*S*_{1} of the younger system (when it encounters the
older system) so that, as the younger system becomes older, it
develops exactly into state *S*_{3}. Thus without
imposing any constraints on the initial state *S*_{1} of
the system *P*, we have shown that there will always be
perfectly ordinary, non-paradoxical, solutions, in which everything
that happens, happens according to the usual laws of development. Of
course, there is looped causation, hence presumably also looped
explanation, but what do you expect if there is looped time?

Unfortunately, for the fan of time travel, a little reflection
suggests that there are systems for which the needed fixed point
theorem does not hold. Imagine, for instance, that we have a dial
that can only rotate in a plane. We are going to put the dial in the
time machine. Indeed we have decided that if we see the later stage
of the dial come out of the time machine set at angle *x*, then
we will set the dial to *x*+90, and throw it into the time
machine. Now it seems we have a paradox, since the mapping that
consists of a rotation of all points in a circular state-space by 90
degrees does not have a fixed point. And why wouldn’t some
state-spaces have the topology of a circle?

However, we have so far not used another continuity assumption which
is also a reasonable assumption. So far we have only made the
following demand: the state the dial is in at stage
*S*_{2} must be a continuous function of the state of
the dial at stage *S*_{3}. But, the state of the dial at
stage *S*_{2} is arrived at by taking the state of the
dial at stage *S*_{1}, and rotating it over some
angle. It is not merely the case that the effect of the interaction,
namely the state of the dial at stage *S*_{2}, should be
a continuous function of the cause, namely the state of the dial at
stage *S*_{3}. It is additionally the case that path
taken to get there, the way the dial is rotated between stages
*S*_{1} and *S*_{2} must be a continuous
function of the state at stage *S*_{3}. And, rather
surprisingly, it turns out that this can not be done. Let us
illustrate what the problem is before going to a more general
demonstration that there must be a fixed point solution in the dial
case.

Forget time travel for the moment. Suppose that you and I each have a watch with a single dial neither of which is running. My watch is set at 12. You are going to announce what your watch is set at. My task is going to be to adjust my watch to yours no matter what announcement you make. And my actions should have a continuous (single valued) dependence on the time that you announce. Surprisingly, this is not possible! For instance, suppose that if you announce "12", then I achieve that setting on my watch by doing nothing. Now imagine slowly and continuously increasing the announced times, starting at 12. By continuity, I must achieve each of those settings by rotating my dial to the right. If at some point I switch and achieve the announced goal by a rotation of my dial to the left, I will have introduced a discontinuity in my actions, a discontinuity in the actions that I take as a function of the announced angle. So I will be forced, by continuity, to achieve every announcement by rotating the dial to the right. But, this rotation to the right will have to be abruptly discontinued as the announcements grow larger and I eventually approach 12 again, since I achieved 12 by not rotating the dial at all. So, there will be a discontinuity at 12 at the latest. In general, continuity of my actions as a function of announced times can not be maintained throughout if I am to be able to replicate all possible settings. Another way to see the problem is that one can similarly reason that, as one starts with 12, and imagines continuously making the announced times earlier, one will be forced, by continuity, to achieve the announced times by rotating the dial to the left. But the conclusions drawn from the assumption of continuous increases and the assumption of continuous decreases are inconsistent. So we have an inconsistency following from the assumption of continuity and the assumption that I always manage to set my watch to your watch. So, a dial developing according to a continuous dynamics from a given initial state, can not be set up so as to react to a second dial, with which it interacts, in such a way that it is guaranteed to always end up set at the same angle as the second dial. Similarly, it can not be set up so that it is guaranteed to always end up set at 90 degrees to the setting of the second dial. All of this has nothing to do with time travel. However, the impossibility of such set ups is what prevents us from enacting the rotation by 90 degrees that would create paradox in the time travel setting.

Let us now give the positive result that with such dials there will
always be fixed point solutions, as long as the dynamics is
continuous. Let us call the state of the dial before it interacts
with its older self the initial state of the dial. And let us call
the state of the dial after it emerges from the time machine the
final state of the dial. We can represent the possible initial and
final states of the dial by the angles *x* and *y* that the
dial can point at initially and finally. The set of possible initial
plus final states thus forms a torus. (See figure 1.)

Suppose that the dial starts at angle

Figure 1

Unfortunately there are state-spaces that escape even this argument. Consider for instance a pointer that can be set to all values between 0 and 1, where 0 and 1 are not possible values. I.e. suppose that we have a state-space that is isomorphic to an open set of real numbers. Now suppose that we have a machine that sets the pointer to half the value that the pointer is set at when it emerges from the time machine.

Suppose the pointer starts at value

Figure 2

Of course if 0 were a possible value *L* and *C* would
intersect at 0. This is surprising and strange: adding one point to
the set of possible values of a quantity here makes the difference
between paradox and peace. One might be tempted to just add the extra
point to the state-space in order to avoid problems. After all, one
might say, surely no measurements could ever tell us whether the set
of possible values includes that exact point or not. Unfortunately
there can be good theoretical reasons for supposing that some
quantity has a state-space that is open: the set of all possible
speeds of massive objects in special relativity surely is an open
set, since it includes all speeds up to, but not including, the speed
of light. Quantities that have possible values that are not bounded
also lead to counter examples to the presented fixed point
argument. And it is not obvious to us why one should exclude such
possibilities. So the argument that no constraints are needed is not
fully general.

An interesting question of course is: exactly for which state-spaces must there be such fixed points. We do not know the general answer.

General relativity thus appears to provide ample opportunity for
time travel. Note that just because there are CTC’s in a
space-time, this does not mean that one can get from any point in the
space-time to any other point by following some future directed
timelike curve. In many space-times in which there are CTC’s
such CTC’s do not occur all over space-time. Some parts of
space-time can have CTC’s while other parts do not. Let us call
the part of a space-time that has CTC’s the "time travel region"
of that space-time, while calling the rest of that space-time the
"normal region". More precisely, the "time travel region" consists of
all the space-time points *p* such that there exists a (non-zero
length) timelike curve that starts at *p* and returns to
*p*. Now let us start examining space-times with CTC’s a
bit more closely for potential problems.

Given a timelike orientation, a quasi-Cauchy surface
unproblematically divides the manifold into its *past* (i.e. all
points that can be reached by past-directed timelike curves from
*S*) and its *future* (ditto *mutatis mutandis*). If
the whole past of *S* is in the normal region of the manifold,
then *S* is a *partial Cauchy surface*: every
inextendible timelike curve which exists to the past of *S*
intersects *S* exactly once, but (if there is time travel in the
future) not every inextendible timelike curve which exists to the
future of *S* intersects *S*. Now we can ask a particularly
clear question: consider a manifold which contains a time travel
region, but also has a partial Cauchy surface *S*, such that all
of the temporal funny business is to the future of *S*. If all
you could see were *S* and its past, you would not know that the
space-time had any time travel at all. The question is: are there any
constraints on the sort of data which can be put on *S* and
continued to a global solution of the dynamics which are different
from the constraints (if any) on the data which can be put on a
Cauchy surface in a simply connected manifold and continued to a
global solution? If there is time travel to our future, might we we
able to tell this now, because of some implied oddity in the
arrangement of present things?

It is not at all surprising that there might be constraints on the
data which can be put on a locally space-like surface which passes
through the time travel region: after all, we never think we can
freely specify what happens on a space-like surface and on another
such surface to its future, but in this case the surface at issue
lies to its own future. But if there were particular constraints for
data on a partial Cauchy surface then we would apparently need to
have to rule out some sorts of otherwise acceptable states on
*S* if there is to be time travel to the future of *S*. We
then might be able to establish that there will be no time travel in
the future by simple inspection of the present state of the
universe. As we will see, there is reason to suspect that such
constraints on the partial Cauchy surface are non-generic. But we are
getting ahead of ourselves: first let’s consider the effect of time
travel on a very simple dynamics.

The simplest possible example is the Newtonian theory of perfectly
elastic collisions among equally massive particles in one spatial
dimension. The space-time is two-dimensional, so we can represent it
initially as the Euclidean plane, and the dynamics is completely
specified by two conditions. When particles are traveling freely,
their world lines are straight lines in the space-time, and when two
particles collide, they exchange momenta, so the collision looks like
an ‘X’ in space-time, with each particle changing its momentum at the
impact.^{[1]}
The dynamics is purely local, in that one can check that a set of
world-lines constitutes a model of the dynamics by checking that the
dynamics is obeyed in every arbitrarily small region. It is also
trivial to generate solutions from arbitrary initial data if there
are no CTCs: given the initial positions and momenta of a set of
particles, one simply draws a straight line from each particle in the
appropriate direction and continues it indefinitely. Once all the
lines are drawn, the worldline of each particle can be traced from
collision to collision. The boundary value problem for this dynamics
is obviously well-posed: any set of data at an instant yields a
unique global solution, constructed by the method sketched above.

What happens if we change the topology of the space-time by hand to
produce CTCs? The simplest way to do this is depicted in figure 3: we
cut and paste the space-time so it is no longer simply connected by
identifying the line
*L*
with the line *L*+. Particles "going in" to *L*+ from
below "emerge" from
*L* , and particles "going in" to
*L*
from below "emerge" from *L*+.

How is the boundary-value problem changed by this alteration in the space-time? Before the cut and paste, we can put arbitrary data on the simultaneity slice

Figure 3: Inserting CTCs by Cut and Paste

In this case the answer to the first question is *yes* and to
the second is *no*: there are no constraints on the data which
can be put on *S*, but those data are always consistent with an
infinitude of different global solutions. The easy way to see that
there always is a solution is to construct the minimal solution in
the following way. Start drawing straight lines from *S* as
required by the initial data. If a line hits
*L*
from the bottom, just continue it coming out of the top of *L*+
in the appropriate place, and if a line hits *L*+ from the
bottom, continue it emerging from
*L*
at the appropriate place. Figure 4 represents the minimal solution
for a single particle which enters the time-travel region from the
left:

The particle ‘travels back in time’ three times. It is obvious that this minimal solution is a global solution, since the particle always travels inertially.

Figure 4: The Minimal Solution

But the same initial state on *S* is also consistent with other
global solutions. The new requirement imposed by the topology is just
that the data going into *L*+ from the bottom match the data
coming out of
*L*
from the top, and the data going into *L*- from the bottom
match the data coming out of *L*+ from the top. So we can add
any number of vertical lines connecting *L*- and *L*+ to a
solution and still have a solution. For example, adding a few such
lines to the minimal solution yields:

The particle now collides with itself twice: first before it reaches

Figure 5: A Non-Minimal Solution

Knowing the data on *S*, then, gives us only incomplete
information about how things will go for the particle. We know that
the particle will enter the CTC region, and will reach *L*+, we
know that it will be the only particle in the universe, we know
exactly where and with what speed it will exit the CTC region. But we
cannot determine how many collisions the particle will undergo (if
any), nor how long (in proper time) it will stay in the CTC
region. If the particle were a clock, we could not predict what time
it would indicate when exiting the region. Furthermore, the dynamics
gives us no handle on what to think of the various possibilities:
there are no probabilities assigned to the various distinct possible
outcomes.

Changing the topology has changed the mathematics of the situation
in two ways, which tend to pull in opposite directions. On the one
hand, *S* is no longer a Cauchy surface, so it is perhaps not
surprising that data on *S* do not suffice to fix a unique
global solution. But on the other hand, there is an added constraint:
data "coming out" of
*L*
must exactly match data "going in" to *L*+, even though what
comes out of
*L*
helps to determine what goes into *L*+. This added consistency
constraint tends to cut down on solutions, although in this case the
additional constraint is more than outweighed by the freedom to
consider various sorts of data on *L*+/*L*-.

The fact that the extra freedom outweighs the extra constraint also
points up one unexpected way that the supposed paradoxes of time
travel may be overcome. Let’s try to set up a paradoxical situation
using the little closed time loop above. If we send a single particle
into the loop from the left and do nothing else, we know exactly
where it will exit the right side of the time travel region. Now
suppose we station someone at the other side of the region with the
following charge: if the particle should come out on the right side,
the person is to do something to *prevent* the particle from
going in on the left in the first place. In fact, this is quite easy
to do: if we send a particle in from the right, it seems that it can
exit on the left and *deflect* the incoming left-hand
particle.

Carrying on our reflection in this way, we further realize that if
the particle comes out on the right, we might as well send
*it* back in order to deflect itself from entering in the
first place. So all we really need to do is the following: set up a
perfectly reflecting particle mirror on the right-hand side of the
time travel region, and launch the particle from the left so
that--*if nothing interferes with it*--it will just barely hit
*L*+. Our paradox is now apparently complete. If, on the one
hand, nothing interferes with the particle it will enter the
time-travel region on the left, exit on the right, be reflected from
the mirror, re-enter from the right, and come out on the left to
prevent itself from ever entering. So if it enters, it gets deflected
and never enters. On the other hand, if it never enters then nothing
goes in on the left, so nothing comes out on the right, so nothing is
reflected back, and there is nothing to deflect it from entering. So
if it doesn’t enter, then there is nothing to deflect it and it
enters. If it enters, then it is deflected and doesn’t enter; if it
doesn’t enter then there is nothing to deflect it and it enters:
paradox complete.

But at least one solution to the supposed paradox is easy to construct: just follow the recipe for constructing the minimal solution, continuing the initial trajectory of the particle (reflecting it the mirror in the obvious way) and then read of the number and trajectories of the particles from the resulting diagram. We get the result of figure 6:

As we can see, the particle approaching from the left never reaches

Figure 6: Resolving the "Paradox"

The paradox gets it traction from an incorrect presupposition: if
there is only one particle in the world at *S* then there is
only one particle which could participate in an interaction in the
time travel region: the single particle would have to interact with
its earlier (or later) self. But there is no telling what might come
out of
*L* : the only requirement is that
whatever comes out must match what goes in at *L*+. So if you go
to the trouble of constructing a working time machine, you should be
prepared for a different kind of disappointment when you attempt to
go back and kill yourself: you may be prevented from entering the
machine in the first place by some completely unpredictable entity
which emerges from it. And once again a peculiar sort of
indeterminism appears: if there are many self-consistent things which
could prevent you from entering, there is no telling which is even
likely to materialize.

So when the freedom to put data on
*L*
outweighs the constraint that the same data go into *L*+,
instead of paradox we get an embarrassment of riches: many solution
consistent with the data on *S*. To see a case where the
constraint "outweighs" the freedom, we need to construct a very
particular, and frankly artificial, dynamics and topology. Consider
the space of all linear dynamics for a scalar field on a lattice.
(The lattice can be though of as a simple discrete space-time.) We
will depict the space-time lattice as a directed graph. There is to
be a scalar field defined at every node of the graph, whose value at
a given node depends linearly on the values of the field at nodes
which have arrows which lead to it. Each edge of the graph can be
assigned a weighting factor which determines how much the field at
the input node contributes to the field at the output node. If we
name the nodes by the letters *a*, *b*, *c*, etc., and
the edges by their endpoints in the obvious way, then we can label
the weighting factors by the edges they are associated with in an
equally obvious way.

Suppose that the graph of the space-time lattice is
*acyclic*, as in figure 7. (A graph is *Acyclic* if
one can not travel in the direction of the arrows and go in a loop.)

It is easy to regard a set of nodes as the analog of a Cauchy surface, e.g. the set {

Figure 7: An Acyclic Lattice

Let us now again artificially alter the topology of the lattice to
admit CTCs, so that the graph now is cyclic. One of the simplest
such graphs is depicted in figure 8:
there are now paths which lead from *z* back to itself, e.g. *z*
to *y* to *z*.

Can we now put arbitrary data on

Figure 8: Time Travel on a Lattice

In the generic case, there will be a solution and the solution will
be unique. The equations for the value of the field at *x*,
*y*, and *z* are:

Solving these equations forx=vW+_{vx}zW_{zx}

y=wW+_{wy}zW_{zy}

z=xW+_{xz}yW._{yz}

which gives a unique value for z in the generic case. But looking at the space of all possible dynamics for this lattice (i.e. the space of all possible weighting factors), we find a singularity in the case where 1 Wz= (vW+_{vx}zW)W_{zx}+ (_{xz}wW+_{wy}zW)W_{zy},_{yz}

or

z= (vWW_{vx}+_{xz}wWW_{wy})/ (1 W_{yz}W_{zx}W_{xz}W_{zy}),_{yz}

Our toy models suggest three things. The first is that it may be
impossible to prove in complete generality that arbitrary data on a
partial Cauchy surface can *always* be continued to a global
solution: our artificial case provides an example where it
cannot. The second is that such odd constraints are not likely to be
generic: we had to delicately fine-tune the dynamics to get a
problem. The third is that the opposite problem, namely data on a
partial Cauchy surface being consistent with *many* different
global solutions, is likely to be generic: we did not have to do any
fine-tuning to get this result. And this leads to a peculiar sort of
indeterminism: the entire state on *S* does not determine what
will happen in the future even though the local dynamics is
deterministic and there are no other "edges" to space-time from which
data could influence the result. What happens in the time travel
region is constrained but not determined by what happens on *S*,
and the dynamics does not even supply any *probabilities* for
the various possibilities. The example of the photographic negative
discussed in section 3, then, seems likely to be unusual, for in that
case there is a *unique* fixed point for the dynamics, and the
set-up plus the dynamical laws *determine* the outcome. In the
generic case one would rather expect *multiple* fixed points,
with no room for anything to influence, even probabilistically,
*which* would be realized.

It is ironic that time travel should lead generically not to
contradictions or to constraints (in the normal region) but to
*underdetermination* of what happens in the time travel region
by what happens everywhere else (an underdetermination tied neither
to a probabilistic dynamics or to a free edge to space-time). The
traditional objection to time travel is that it leads to
contradictions: there is no consistent way to complete an arbitrarily
constructed story about how the time traveler intends to
act. Instead, though, it appears that the problem is
underdetermination: the story can be consistently completed in many
different ways. Let us now discuss some results regarding some
slightly more realistic models that have been discussed in the
physics literature.

The threat of paradox in this case arises in the following form. There are initial trajectories (starting in the non-time travel region of space-time) for the ball such that if such a trajectory is continued (into the time travel region), assuming that the ball does not undergo a collision prior to entering mouth 1 of the wormhole, it will exit mouth 2 so as to collide with its earlier self prior to its entry into mouth 1 in such a way as to prevent its earlier self from entering mouth 1. Thus it seems that the ball will enter mouth 1 if and only if it does not enter mouth 1. Of course, the Wheeler-Feynman strategy is to look for a ‘glancing blow’ solution: a collision which will produce exactly the (small) deviation in trajectory of the earlier ball that produces exactly that collision. Are there always such solutions?

Figure 9

Echeverria, Klinkhammer & Thorne found a large class of initial trajectories that have consistent ‘glancing blow’ continuations, and found none that do not (but their search was not completely general). They did not produce a rigorous proof that every initial trajectory has a consistent continuation, but suggested that it is very plausible that every initial trajectory has a consistent continuation. That is to say, they have made it very plausible that, in the billiard ball wormhole case, the time travel structure of such a wormhole space-time does not result in constraints on states on spacelike surfaces in the non-time travel region.

In fact, as one might expect from our discussion in the previous section, they found the opposite problem from that of inconsistency: they found underdetermination. For a large class of initial trajectories there are multiple different consistent ‘glancing blow’ continuations of that trajectory (many of which involve multiple wormhole traversals). For example, if one initially has a ball that is traveling on a trajectory aimed straight between the two mouths, then one obvious solution is that the ball passes between the two mouths and never time travels. But another solution is that the younger ball gets knocked into mouth 1 exactly so as to come out of mouth 2 and produce that collision. Echeverria et al. do not note the possibility (which we pointed out in the previous section) of the existence of additional balls in the time travel region. We conjecture (but have no proof) that for every initial trajectory of A there are some, and generically many, multiple ball continuations.

Friedman et al. 1990 examined the case of source free non-self-interacting scalar fields traveling through such a time travel wormhole and found that no constraints on initial conditions in the non-time travel region are imposed by the existence of such time travel wormholes. In general there appear to be no known counter examples to the claim that in ‘somewhat realistic’ time-travel space-times with a partial Cauchy surface there are no constraints imposed on the state on such a partial Cauchy surface by the existence of CTC’s. (See e.g. Friedman and Morris 1991, Thorne 1994, Earman 1995, Earman and Smeenk 1999.)

How about the issue of constraints in the time travel region
*T*? *Prima facie*, constraints in such a region would not
appear to be surprising. But one might still expect that there should
be no constraints on states on a spacelike surface, provided one
keeps the surface ‘small enough’. In the physics literature the
following question has been asked: for any point *p* in
*T*, and any space-like surface *S* that includes *p*
is there a neighborhood *E* of *p* in *S* such that
any solution on *E* can be extended to a solution on the whole
space-time? With respect to this question, there are some simple
models in which one has this kind of extendibility of local solutions
to global ones, and some simple models in which one does not have
such extendibility, with no clear general pattern. (See e.g.
Yurtsever 1990, Friedman et. al. 1990, Novikov 1992, Earman 1995,
Earman and Smeenk 1999). What are we to think of all of this?

Response 1. There is nothing implausible or new about such constraints. For instance, if the universe is spatially closed, there has to be enough matter to produce the needed curvature, and this puts constraints on the matter distribution on a space-like hypersurface. Thus global space-time structure can quite unproblematically constrain matter distributions on space-like hypersurfaces in it. Moreover we have no realistic idea what these constraints look like, so we hardly can be said to have evidence that they do not obtain.

Counterresponse 1. Of course there are constraining relations between the global structure of space-time and the matter in it. The Einstein equations relate curvature of the manifold to the matter distribution in it. But what is so strange and implausible about the constraints imposed by the existence of closed time-like curves is that these constraints in essence have nothing to do with the Einstein equations. When investigating such constraints one typically treats the particles and/or field in question as test particles and/or fields in a given space-time, i.e. they are assumed not to affect the metric of space-time in any way. In typical space-times without closed time-like curves this means that one has, in essence, complete freedom of matter distribution on a space-like hypersurface. (See response 2 for some more discussion of this issue). The constraints imposed by the possibility of time travel have a quite different origin and are implausible. In the ordinary case there is a causal interaction between matter and space-time that results in relations between global structure of space-time and the matter distribution in it. In the time travel case there is no such causal story to be told: there simply has to be some pre-established harmony between the global space-time structure and the matter distribution on some space-like surfaces. This is implausible.

Response 2. Constraints upon matter distributions are nothing new.
For instance, Maxwell’s equations constrain electric fields **E**
on an initial surface to be related to the (simultaneous) charge
density distribution _{} by the equation
_{} = div(**E**). (If we assume that
the E field is generated solely by the charge distribution, this
conditions amounts to requiring that the E field at any point in
space simply be the one generated by the charge distribution
according to Coulomb’s inverse square law of electrostatics.) This
is not implausible divine harmony. Such constraints can hold as a
matter of physical law. Moreover, if we had inferred from the
apparent free variation of conditions on spatial regions that there
could be no such constraints we would have mistakenly inferred that
_{} =
div(**E**) could not be a law of nature.

Counterresponse 2. The constraints imposed by the existence of
closed time-like lines are of quite a different character from the
constraint imposed by
_{} =
div(**E**). The constraints imposed by
_{} =
div(**E**) on the state on a space-like
hypersurface are: (i) local constraints (i.e. to check whether
the constraint holds in a region you just need to see whether it
holds at each point in the region), (ii) quite independent of the
global space-time structure, (iii) quite independent of how the
space-like surface in question is embedded in a given space-time, and
(iv) very simply and generally stateable. On the other hand, the
consistency constraints imposed by the existence of closed time-like
curves (i) are not local, (ii) are dependent on the global
structure of space-time, (iii) depend on the location of the
space-like surface in question in a given space-time, and (iv) appear
not to be simply stateable other than as the demand that the state on
that space-like surface embedded in such and such a way in a given
space-time, do not lead to inconsistency. On some views of laws
(e.g. David Lewis’ view) this plausibly implies that such
constraints, even if they hold, could not possibly be laws. But even
if one does not accept such a view of laws, one could claim that the
bizarre features of such constraints imply that it is implausible
that such constraints hold in our world or in any world remotely like
ours.

Response 3. It would be strange if there are constraints in the non-time travel region. It is not strange if there are constraints in the time travel region. They should be explained in terms of the strange, self-interactive, character of time travel regions. In this region there are time-like trajectories from points to themselves. Thus the state at such a point, in such a region, will, in a sense, interact with itself. It is a well-known fact that systems that interact with themselves will develop into an equilibrium state, if there is such an equilibrium state, or else will develop towards some singularity. Normally, of course, self-interaction isn’t true instantaneous self-interaction, but consists of a feed-back mechanism that takes time. But in time travel regions something like true instantaneous self-interaction occurs. This explains why constraints on states occur in such time travel regions: the states ‘ab initio’ have to be ‘equilibrium states’. Indeed in a way this also provides some picture of why indeterminism occurs in time travel regions: at the onset of self-interaction states can fork into different equi-possible equilibrium states.

Counterresponse 3. This is explanation by woolly analogy. It all goes to show that time travel leads to such bizarre consequences that it is unlikely that it occurs in a world remotely like ours.

Response 4. All of the previous discussion completely misses the
point. So far we have been taking the space-time structure as given,
and asked the question whether a given time travel space-time
structure imposes constraints on states on (parts of) space-like
surfaces. However, space-time and matter interact. Suppose that one
is in a space-time with closed time-like lines, such that certain
counterfactual distributions of matter on some neighborhood of a
point *p* are ruled out if one holds that space-time structure
fixed. One might then ask "Why does the actual state near *p* in
fact satisfy these constraints? By what divine luck or plan is this
local state compatible with the global space-time structure? What if
conditions near *p* had been slightly different?". And one might
take it that the lack of normal answers to these questions indicates
that it is very implausible that our world, or any remotely like it,
is such a time travel universe. However the proper response to these
question is the following. There are no constraints in any
significant sense. If they hold they hold as a matter of accidental
fact, not of law. There is no more explanation of them possible than
there is of any contingent fact. Had conditions in a neighborhood of
*p* been otherwise, the global structure of space-time would
have been different. So what? The only question relevant to the issue
of constraints is whether an arbitrary state on an arbitrary spatial
surface *S* can always be embedded into a space-time such that
that state on *S* consistently extends to a solution on the
entire space-time.

But we know the answer to that question. A well-known theorem in
general relativity says the following: any initial data set on a
three dimensional manifold *S* with positive definite metric has
a unique embedding into a maximal space-time in which *S* is a
Cauchy surface (see e.g. Geroch and Horowitz 1979, p. 284 for
more detail), i.e. there is a unique largest space-time which has
*S* as a Cauchy surface and contains a consistent evolution of
the initial value data on *S*. Now since *S* is a Cauchy
surface this space-time does not have closed time like curves. But it
may have extensions (in which *S* is not a Cauchy surface) which
include closed timelike curves, indeed it may be that any maximal
extension of it would include closed timelike curves. (This appears
to be the case for extensions of states on certain surfaces of
Taub-NUT space-times. See Earman and Smeenk 1999). But these
extensions, of course, will be consistent. So properly speaking,
there are no constraints on states on space-like
surfaces. Nonetheless the space-time in which these are embedded may
or may not include closed time-like curves.

Counterresponse 4. This, in essence, is the stonewalling answer which we indicated at the beginning of section 2. However, whether or not you call the constraints imposed by a given space-time on distributions of matter on certain space-like surfaces ‘genuine constraints’, whether or not they can be considered lawlike, and whether or not they need to be explained, the existence of such constraints can still be used to argue that time travel worlds are so bizarre that it is implausible that our world or any world remotely like ours is a time travel world.

Suppose that one is in a time travel world. Suppose that given the global space-time structure of this world, there are constraints imposed upon, say, the state of motion of a ball on some space-like surface when it is treated as a test particle, i.e. when it is assumed that the ball does not affect the metric properties of the space-time it is in. (There is lots of other matter that, via the Einstein equation, corresponds exactly to the curvature that there is everywhere in this time travel worlds.) Now a real ball of course does have some effect on the metric of the space-time it is in. But let us consider a ball that is so small that its effect on the metric is negligible. Presumably it will still be the case that certain states of this ball on that space-like surface are not compatible with the global time travel structure of this universe.

This means that the actual distribution of matter on such a
space-like surface can be extended into a space-time with closed
time-like lines, but that certain counterfactual distributions of
matter on this space-like surface can not be extended into the same
space-time. *But note that the changes made in the matter
distribution (when going from the actual to the counterfactual
distribution) do not in any non-negligible way affect the metric
properties of the space-time.* Thus the reason why the global
time travel properties of the counterfactual space-time have to be
significantly different from the actual space-time is not that there
are problems with metric singularities or alterations in the metric
that force significant global changes when we go to the
counterfactual matter distribution. The reason that the
counterfactual space-time has to be different is that in the
counterfactual world the ball’s initial state of motion starting on
the space-like surface, could not ‘meet up’ in a consistent way with
its earlier self (could not be consistently extended) if we were to
let the global structure of the counterfactual space-time be the same
as that of the actual space-time. Now, it is not bizarre or
implausible that there is a counterfactual dependence of manifold
structure, even of its topology, on matter distributions on spacelike
surfaces. For instance, certain matter distributions may lead to
singularities, others may not. We may indeed in some sense have
causal power over the topology of the space-time we live in. But this
power normally comes via the Einstein equations. But it is bizarre to
think that there could be a counterfactual dependence of global
space-time structure on the arrangement of certain tiny bits of
matter on some space-like surface, where changes in that arrangement
by assumption do not affect the metric *anywhere in space-time in
any significant way*. It is implausible that we live in such a
world, or that a world even remotely like ours is like that.

Let us illustrate this argument in a different way by assuming that
wormhole time travel imposes constraints upon the states of people
prior to such time travel, where the people have so little
mass/energy that they have negligible effect, via the Einstein
equation, on the local metric properties of space-time. Do you think
it more plausible that we live in a world where wormhole time travel
occurs but it only occurs when people’s states are such that these
local states happen to combine with time travel in such a way that
nobody ever succeeds in killing their younger self, or do you think
it more plausible that we are not in a wormhole time travel
world?^{[4]}

A quantum system starts in state *S*1, interacts with its older
self, after the interaction is in state *S*_{2}, time
travels while developing into state *S*_{3}, then
interacts with its younger self, and ends in state
*S*_{4} (see figure 10).

Deutsch assumes that the set of possible states of this system are the mixed states, i.e. are represented by the density matrices over the Hilbert space of that system. Deutsch then shows that for any initial state

Figure 10

Similarly, suppose that:_{1}_{3}develops into_{2}_{4}.

Let us furthermore assume that there is no development of the state of the system during time travel, i.e. that_{1}_{3}develops into_{2}_{4},

_{1}_{3}develops into_{2}_{4}, and

_{1}_{3}develops into_{2}_{4}.

Now, if the only possible states of the system were and
(i.e. if there were no superpositions or
mixtures of these states), then there is a constraint on initial states:
initial state _{1} is impossible. For if
_{1} interacts with
_{3} then it will
develop into
_{2},
which, during time travel, will develop into
_{3},
which inconsistent with the assumed state
_{3}. Similarly if
_{1} interacts with
_{3} it will develop into
_{2}, which will then develop into
_{3}
which is also inconsistent. Thus the system can not start in state
_{1}.

But, says Deutsch, in quantum mechanics such a system can also be in
any mixture of the states and
. Suppose that the older
system, prior to the interaction, is in a state *S*_{3}
which is an equal mixture of 50%
_{3} and 50%
_{3}. Then the younger system
during the interaction will develop into a mixture of 50%
_{2} and 50%
_{2}, which will then develop into
a mixture of 50% _{3} and 50%
_{3}, which is consistent!
More generally Deutsch uses a fixed point theorem to show that no
matter what the unitary development during interaction is, and no
matter what the unitary development during time travel is, for any
state *S*_{1} there is always a state
*S*_{3} (which typically is not a pure state) which
causes *S*_{1} to develop into a state
*S*_{2} which develops into that state
*S*_{3}. Thus quantum mechanics comes to the rescue: it
shows in all generality that no constraints on initial states are
needed!

One might wonder why Deutsch appeals to mixed states: will
superpositions of states and
not suffice? Unfortunately
such an idea does not work. Suppose again that the initial state
is _{1}. One might suggest that that if state
*S*_{3} is
1/_{3} +
1/_{3}
one will obtain a consistent development. For one might think that
when initial state
_{1} encounters the superposition
1/_{3} +
1/_{3},
it will develop into superposition
1/_{2} +
1/_{2}, and that
this in turn will develop into
1/_{3} +
1/_{3}, as
desired. However this is not correct. For initial state
_{1} when it encounters
1/_{3} +
1/_{3}, will develop
into the entangled state
1/_{2}_{4} +
1/_{2}_{4}.
In so far as one can speak of the state of the young system after
this interaction, it is in the mixture of 50% _{2} and
50%
_{2}, not in the superposition
1/_{2} +
1/_{2}. So Deutsch
does need his recourse to mixed states.

This clarification of why Deutsch needs his mixtures does however indicate a serious worry about the simplifications that are part of Deutsch’s account. After the interaction the old and young system will (typically) be in an entangled state. Although for purposes of a measurement on one of the two systems one can say that this system is in a mixed state, one can not represent the full state of the two systems by specifying the mixed state of each separate part, as there are correlations between observables of the two systems that are not represented by these two mixed states, but are represented in the joint entangled state. But if there really is an entangled state of the old and young systems directly after the interaction, how is one to represent the subsequent development of this entangled state? Will the state of the younger system remain entangled with the state of the older system as the younger system time travels and the older system moves on into the future? On what space-like surfaces are we to imagine this total entangled state to be? At this point it becomes clear that there is no obvious and simple way to extend elementary non-relativistic quantum mechanics to space-times with closed time-like curves. There have been more sophisticated approaches than Deutsch’s to time travel, using technical machinery from quantum field theory and differentiable manifolds (see e.g. Friedman et al 1991, Earman and Smeenk 1999, and references therein). But out of such approaches no results anywhere near as clear and interesting as Deutsch’s have been forthcoming.

How does Deutsch avoid these complications? Deutsch assumes a mixed
state *S*_{3} of the older system prior to the
interaction with the younger system. He lets it interact with an
arbitrary pure state *S*_{1} younger system. After this
interaction there is an entangled state
*S* of the two systems. Deutsch computes
the mixed state *S*_{2} of the younger system which is
implied by this entangled state
*S*. His demand for consistency then is
just that this mixed state *S*_{2} develops into the
mixed state *S*_{3}. Now it is not at all clear that
this is a legitimate way to simplify the problem of time travel in
quantum mechanics. But even if we grant him this simplification there
is a problem: how are we to understand these mixtures?

If we take an ignorance interpretation of mixtures we run into
trouble. For suppose that we assume that in each individual case
each older system is either in state _{3} or in state
_{3} prior to the
interaction. Then we regain our paradox. Deutsch instead recommends
the following, many worlds, picture of mixtures. Suppose we start
with state _{1} in all worlds. In some of the many
worlds the older system will be in the _{3} state, let
us call them *A*-worlds, and in some worlds, *B*-worlds, it
will be in the
_{3}
state. Thus in *A*-worlds after interaction we will have state
_{2} , and in *B*-worlds we
will have state _{2}. During time travel the
_{2} state
will remain the same, i.e turn into state
_{3}, but the
systems in question will travel from *A*-worlds to
*B*-worlds. Similarly the _{2}
states will travel from the *B*-worlds to the *A*-worlds,
thus preserving consistency.

Now whatever one thinks of the merits of many worlds interpretations, and of this understanding of it applied to mixtures, in the end one does not obtain genuine time travel in Deutsch’s account. The systems in question travel from one time in one world to another time in another world, but no system travels to an earlier time in the same world. (This is so at least in the normal sense of the word ‘world’, the sense that one means when, for instance, one says "there was, and will be, only one Elvis Presley in this world".) Thus, even if it were a reasonable view, it is not quite as interesting as it may have initially seemed.

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and

*First published: February 17, 2000*

*Content last modified: March 9, 2000*