Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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International Justice

First published Fri Jul 8, 2005

International justice has only recently become a serious topic within political philosophy. Philosophers have, of course, long debated certain moral aspects of international politics; the morality of warfare and international relations has always been a central focus of political ethics. It is only in the past thirty years, however, that a sustained effort has been made to develop ethical analyses of international politics drawing upon the traditional concerns of domestic justice. Topics such as rights, constitutionalism, toleration, and—perhaps most importantly—the distribution of scarce resources have now been placed at the forefront of discussions of international ethics. In this, philosophers have begun the project of extending their domestic analyses of justice into the international arena.

This extension has proven to be a challenging project. The extension of liberal political philosophy to the international realm has come up against what seems to be a basic contradiction in how liberalism ought to understand itself:

  1. Liberal political philosophy begins with the premise of moral egalitarianism. All human individuals, simply in virtue of their status as human, are entitled to equal moral consideration—however much philosophers disagree about what such consideration entails. Allowing differences in the administration of political justice to rest upon some morally arbitrary fact about persons is anathema to liberal theory. Nothing which is a matter of luck can be allowed to serve as the basis for a distinction in equality of treatment.
  2. Liberal political philosophy has traditionally applied its egalitarian guarantees only within the confines of the territorial state. Our best worked-out theories of justice do not begin with the entire population of the world, but with that small subset of humanity which shares the citizenship of a territorial state.

These two facts seem, at first glance, to be in tension. Citizenship and residency seem as morally arbitrary as race or gender; none of us, after all, freely chose our parents or our place of birth. But allowing the administration of justice to depend upon fortuitous birth strikes directly at the heart of liberal egalitarianism; it seems, as Joseph Carens puts it, to place an almost feudal notion of birthright privilege back into the heart of liberal theory (Carens 1992). State boundaries, after all, often divide not simply one administrative jurisdiction from another, but the rich from the poor as well. Being born on the right side of an arbitrary line can sometimes literally mean the difference between life and death. How, then, should theorists of international justice understand the moral status of national boundaries?

This article will attempt a critical survey of recent answers to this question. There have been three main forms of answer given to the question of liberalism and the justification of the domestic focus. The first is to dissolve the apparent conflict, by demonstrating that liberalism's impartiality is only properly applied within the national context. We must, on this account, necessarily favor our own, and this favoritism is not a source of embarrassment but rather the origin of human affiliation and communal ties.

The second approach, in contrast, asserts that the apparent contradiction above is a genuine incoherence in liberal thought; if liberalism is to prove a coherent and attractive school of political thought, it must live up to the globalism inherent in its self-description, and refuse to allow arbitrary facts of borders and citizenship to influence the administration of justice. Thus, on one popular construal of global liberalism, states must focus on the well-being of the least-advantaged members of the world's population—not simply the least well-off member of the state's current population—in the allocation of welfare payments and transfers. If this makes liberalism a considerably more radical thesis than we had hitherto suspected, well, so much the worse for our ordinary expectations. Liberalism was certainly a radical thesis when it was new, and was used to attack hierarchies of class and gender that had hitherto been thought natural and obvious. The hierarchies of nationality and citizenship are simply the latest objectionable inequality to be ruled out by the moral egalitarianism of liberal thought.

The third approach, recently articulated by John Rawls, replaces the liberal concern for impartiality with a related concern for reciprocity and toleration. On this analysis, the liberal concern for egalitarianism in distribution is misplaced when applied within the global context. Liberals have reason to develop principles constraining state action in the international context, and reason to ensure that these principles are acceptable both to liberal and illiberal but decent states. This methodology argues that what distributive principles exist internationally will not be as demanding as the egalitarian principles applicable in the domestic context. In this way, the above dilemma is not so much solved as dissolved; the implicit equation between nationality and categories such as race or gender is shown to be incorrect, so that we need not apply our domestic principles of distributive justice in the international arena.

All these responses have elements which make them attractive. None of them, however, is entirely without difficulties. What follows is a critical examination of these alternative responses. This entry attempts to demonstrate both how much work has already been accomplished in international justice, and how much work remains to be done. In the area of international justice, we have yet to understand how we might develop principles of distributive justice we have reason to accept.

1. Nationality and Partiality

The theorists examined in this section all argue that conventional liberalism as described above—including its reliance upon notions of impartiality—is either incomplete or incoherent. The nature of the national community—understood, crucially, in terms of cultural membership and shared self-understanding—is such that it legitimates or demands partiality towards fellow members. Nationality is here understood as generating reasons for preferring the interests of one's fellow nationals, in a manner markedly similar to that generally assumed to hold in such otherwise disparate contexts as relationships of family or friendship. The national group, on this understanding, demands loyalty and partiality which will contradict the liberal reliance upon impartial moral reasoning. The moral importance of community thus solves the dilemma posed above; it solves it by showing that liberalism cannot be coherently applied at the global level. If liberalism's impartiality has any value at all—a point about which these thinkers disagree—it will be important only within the confines of a local cultural community. The depiction of liberalism above is therefore at best incomplete; there is an inherent range-limitation on the applicability of liberal principles, one which prevents the application of liberal guarantees at the global context (see Waldron 1993).

There are at least two ways in which this argument has been made, and countless variants of approach within these broad argumentative strands. For the purposes of analysis, we may distinguish the arguments of the metaethical particularists from the cultural perfectionists (see Hurka, 1997, for more on this distinction). There is no bright line dividing theorists employing one approach from the other; the border between them is certainly porous, and theorists who primarily rely on one approach frequently make use of arguments from the other in their writings. Nevertheless, the distinction may prove a valuable one in unpacking the implications and viability of the approaches in question. Briefly put, the distinction goes to the manner in which the national community is used to construct a watershed division in the content of moral duties. For the metaethical particularists, duties to fellow nationals differ in kind because the national community is the source of the language and values employed in the practice of moral judgment; partiality to the interests of one's fellow nationals is therefore a consequence of the nature of morality. For the cultural particularists, by contrast, priority for the interests of one's fellow nationals is a consequence of the importance of community membership for the human good. On this account, distinct duties to one's fellow nationals flow from the importance of the flourishing and protection of the national community. We are now in position to examine the implications of each approach, beginning with the theorists of metaethical particularism.

1.1. Metaethical Particularism

Special obligations to one's fellow nationals, on the approach of metaethical particularism, flow from the nature of moral reasoning; moral reasoning flows begins in narratives provided by the cultural community in which we are situated. The preservation and defense of this community necessitates differential moral status for cultural insiders as opposed to outsiders. The contours of this argument begin with a dissatisfaction with the abstract and deracinated nature of philosophical reasoning, and finish with some degree of condemnation of the impartial moral principles which are generally taken to result from such reasoning. The group of thinkers making such arguments includes Alaisdair MacIntyre, Michael Walzer, and to some degree Michael Sandel (see MacIntyre 1977, 1984; Walzer 1977, 1984, 2003; and Sandel 1982, 1992; see also Margalit and Raz 1995). Walzer provides a good introduction to the dissatisfaction felt by such thinkers with the nature of traditional philosophical reasoning:

[T]he question most likely to arise in the minds of the members of the political community is not, What would rational individuals choose under universalizing conditions of such-and-such a sort? But rather, What would individuals like us choose, who are situated as we are, who share a culture and are determined to go on sharing it? And this is a question that is readily transformed into, What choices have we already made in the course of our common life? What understandings do we (really) share? (Walzer 1984, 5)

This alternate approach to moral inquiry—a more situated approach which begins with the local facts of shared history and language—easily gives rise to principles at odds with liberalism's traditional self-understanding. In particular, since morality itself is now understood as a situated, local endeavor, the preservation of the local community as a distinct entity is now taken to justify differential moral duties as regards insiders to the local community. Thus, Walzer defends the right of communities to close their borders against outsiders, even where those outsiders are more needy than those currently resident within the community—a conclusion which seems sharply at odds with liberal impartiality (a fact also noticed by Carens, 1992):

Admission and exclusion are at the core of communal independence. They suggest the deepest meaning of self-determination. Without them, there could not be communities of character, historically stable, ongoing associations of men and women with some special commitment to one another and some special sense of their common life. (Walzer, 1984, 62)

If Walzer is right, then the simple description of liberalism is wrong. If liberalism's egalitarianism is of value, it is of value within a more restricted domain than we had originally thought. Impartiality at the global level cannot be consistently defended, since to defend such a principle would be to ignore the situated nature of moral practices.

To get clearer on the contours of this argument, we may examine the arguments of Aliasdair MacIntyre in greater detail. MacIntyre is an even more thoroughgoing critic of liberalism than Walzer; MacIntyre's conclusion is not that the application of liberalism is more complex than generally supposed, but that liberal impartiality is radically incoherent as a moral foundation for political life. MacIntyre contrasts the morality of impartiality with the morality of patriotism, understood as a necessarily partial respect and gratitude for the achievements and merits of my nation simply because it is mine. Understood in this way, the morality of patriotism generates reasons to be partial to my fellow citizens—to prefer the goods of those citizens to the goods of others, and to promote those citizens' interests above those of human beings to whom I am not so related. Patriotism is therefore one of a class of what MacIntyre calls loyalty-exhibiting virtues, other members of which include “love of one's own family and kin, friendship, and loyalty to such institutions as schools and cricket or baseball clubs.” (MacIntyre, 1984, 4) This point of view is directly opposed to the impartiality of liberal thought:

[P]atriotism requires me to exhibit peculiar devotion to my nation and you to yours. It requires me to regard such contingent social facts as where I was born and what government ruled over that place at that time, who my parents were, who my great-grandparents were, and so on, as deciding for me what the question of virtuous action is—at least insofar as it is the virtue of patriotism which is in question. Hence the moral standpoint and the patriotic standpoint are systematically incompatible. (MacIntyre, 1984, 5)

This conflict, notes MacIntyre, may phrase itself in a variety of forms, including conflicts over resource use; when conflicts arise—as they assuredly will—over the appropriate distribution of scarce resources, liberalism requires that “everyone counts for one and no more than one,” while patriotism requires that “I strive to further the interests of my community and you strive to further those of yours.” (MacIntyre, 1984, 6)

So much for the contrast between patriotism and liberal morality. Why, given this picture, do we have reason to value patriotism? Why not simply abandon it, given its obvious and immediate conflict with our better moral understandings?

MacIntyre's answer is complex and subtle, but it can be understood in terms of the preconditions of moral agency. MacIntyre argues that a flourishing community of agents with shared moral norms and values is a necessary precondition of my continued existence as a moral agent; therefore, patriotism—understood as involving special obligations to maintain and defend my nation—is a precondition of morality. The argument has three prongs. In the first, MacIntyre notes that moral rules are learned only in the form of specific rules unique to a particular social community. As moral agents, we never see bare universalizable maxims of action; we see, rather, moral rules as incarnated in specific social settings—the highly specific morality, as MacIntyre has it, of some highly specific social order. The second prong notes that the goods by which morality is justified to the agent are constructed as goods only by the shared understandings of the local community—so that we would not, absent a local community defining the nature of these goods, have any reason to be moral at all. The final prong notes that morality is actually a difficult endeavor, one that is not easy at the best of times—but one that is virtually impossible for the lone moral hero, bereft of any community of shared moral understanding. As such, morality demands the existence of a community devoted to moral education and correction, which is able to remind us of the dictates of moral reasoning, and bring us back to proper moral functioning when we have strayed from the path.

The upshot of these three points, argues MacIntyre, is that we are unlikely to flourish as moral agents if deprived of a community of shared moral understandings. Hence, morality and patriotism cannot be meaningfully contrasted as distinct strands of normative thinking; patriotism is the precondition of moral functioning. Patriotism to one's national community is here understood as the very basis of morality, rather than as something in conflict with it:

Loyalty to that community, to the hierarchy of particular kinship, particular local community and particular natural community, is on this view a prerequisite for morality. So patriotism and those loyalties cognate to it are not just virtues but central virtues. (MacIntyre, 1984, 11)

There are two implications of this view which merit further attention. The first is that, on MacIntyre's account, the loyalty to one's nation is unconditional. Some parts of the national project must be treated as permanently exempt from critical examination, since the national community is the prerequisite of moral reasoning. MacIntyre is clear that this does not eliminate the possibility of moral criticism of aspects of one's national community—specific governments or institutions may be criticized, for example—but that the impossibility of anything stronger than this form of criticism does form a conflict with liberal morality, on which everything may be made the object of critical analysis. This conflict will have serious consequences as regards the moral evaluation of actions, in situations such as the one we face when we might do better for the world by harming the project of the nation. The patriot will choose to work within the nation, protecting its interests and continued existence as an historical fact, even if greater good—impartially understood—might be produced by abandoning the nation. MacIntyre acknowledges that this means that patriotism will be a continuing source of moral danger, but that it cannot be eliminated—since to do so would be to eliminate the possibility of moral agency itself.

The second implication we will examine here follows on this latter fact. If morality flows from communal understandings, thereby necessitating partiality and favoritism for the members of our local community, what implications does this have for the liberal morality depicted above? Simply put, MacIntyre argues that such a morality can only be an illusion—and a dangerous one at that; liberal impartiality, in refusing to acknowledge the facts of social particularity and embeddedness, acts against the continued existence of the nation as an historical community—and, therefore, against the preconditions of moral functioning itself. If patriotism is therefore a source of continuing moral danger, then so is a morality which refuses to admit the need for partiality and particularity. MacIntyre concludes with the worry that the American polity—which he views as increasingly prone to arguments phrased in terms of reciprocity and impartiality, rather than in historical terms of national community—is becoming increasingly incoherent, and therefore increasingly unable to serve as the source of moral agency. Liberal morality, on this view, is not only incoherent but dangerous. The problem of national partiality is solved by the impossibility of impartiality.

Similar arguments may be made from metatethical concerns which do not offer quite so universal a condemnation of liberal tenets—Walzer's argument is a case in point—but the general conclusion of the argument is clear: the conflict described above, between liberalism and national partiality, is solved by making national partiality the very basis of moral reasoning and language itself.

MacIntyre’ project is complex, and has many facets we cannot explore here—the full project includes a reinterpretation of the history of political theory which serves as partial justification for the approach he chooses for the analysis of patriotism; see MacIntyre 1981 for more—but the foregoing is sufficient to start the analysis of his project. We may take an immanent approach to criticism of MacIntyre's project, and assume that he is right about the importance of local community in fostering and maintaining moral agency. The question to be asked is the following: if he is right on this score, does that imply that the moral claims of outsiders—those not members of our local community—necessarily have no pull on us? In the extreme case, this question becomes: is there no possibility of impartial moral thinking—even globally impartial moral thinking—being compatible with the acknowledged importance of communal ties for moral agency? (See Hurka, 1997, for related worries.)

One way to begin to answer this question is to inquire into the details of the argument by which the communal origins of moral language are supposed to give rise to special obligations to the community. How, exactly, does the need for a thriving national community serve to ground the moral permissibility of partiality to members of that community? In part, the argument turns on the importance of the survival of that community—since, in the absence of the community, morality itself would (we may assume with MacIntyre) prove impossible. MacIntyre—like Walzer before him—takes the continuing survival of the nation as a self-determining, self-defining entity as a basic good, able to support claims of partiality against the interests of needier outsiders (see Walzer, 1984, 31-62). There is, however, a difficulty here, and it is found in the ambiguous nature of the survival supposed to be a trump value for the purposes of political analysis. What exactly do we mean when we talk of national survival in this context?

There are a variety of things we might mean here, and in part it is the easy slippage between them that accounts for the appeal of the argument from national survival. One easy answer is to assimilate the continued survival of the nation to the literal survival of that nation's inhabitants. Such an interpretation of the concept of national survival is undoubtedly of great moral importance, but it hardly seems to be the sort of thing MacIntyre wants to discuss. We could not, under these circumstances, easily dismiss the claims of needier outsiders, since it is not clear that in such cases the notion of “needier outsiders” even makes any sense—if giving in to the claims of non-members would cause the literal destruction of the lives of members, then clearly they have claims at least as powerful (considered on the individual level) as any outsider's could conceivably be. At any rate, it is clear that MacIntyre's arguments do not presuppose such a literal reading of national survival, however much communitarian rhetoric sometimes makes it appear that their concerns are at such a level of moral importance (a fact also noticed by Williams, 1972, 22).

Another tempting reading is to see the concept of the nation as coextensive with the current normative practices of the national community at a given point in time. Such an interpretation would make sense of MacIntyre's concern with normative structures of community as a key precondition of moral functioning. Under this reading, when the claims of outsiders would force alteration to the practices and normative structures definitive of the nation, the nation itself might be understood to be destroyed—in a way inimical to the continued moral functioning of its inhabitants. However tempting, though, this reading of MacIntyre's concern would quickly court incoherence. Under this reading, the nation would become defined as simply those normative structures which happen to be in place at a given time within the bounds of the relevant community; justifying partiality by reference to the continued survival of these specific norms would seem to ignore the fact that these norms are, themselves, changing all the time. National survival, if it is to have any normative purchase at all, cannot be read as national stasis. An example employed by Will Kymlicka is appropriate here: when Quebec underwent the Quiet Revolution of the 1960s, it did not thereby cease to exist as a distinct cultural entity. Rather, Quebec continued to exist, while the norms within Quebecois society underwent a gradual process of modernization and change (see Kymlicka, 1995). Nations can—indeed, must—change the normative practices associated with membership in their national communities, to account for changing conditions and circumstances in the world. This is not to say that all such changes are morally legitimate; much might be said about the boundaries of legitimate influence of outside cultures. All that is presently at issue is the following thesis: any attempt to fix the meaning of national survival by reference to the practices currently found within the nation is bound to fail. It is as if we tried to fix the meaning of a given person's name by reference to all the attributes she happened to have at a given point in time; by this description, the slightest change in her attributes or attitudes would be comprehensible as the death of the person in question. Such an interpretation of national survival suggests that we are looking in the wrong place for an interpretation of this term.

The best interpretation of this term, instead, seems to follow on the analogy with natural persons just introduced, and views the nation as an historical entity, an ongoing project in the world. On this reading, the nation is understandable as a ground project, something with a trajectory through history—so that national survival means simply the continued existence of the nation as an historical entity. Respect for national survival, on this account, condemns actions and policies likely to lead to a premature end to the national project—ignoring, in the present context, the difficulties inherent in such a notion of “premature”—and so rules out policies likely to lead to forced assimilation, cultural decay, or the destruction of the nation as a source of identity, self-definition and shared morality. On this account, we might understand a concern for the continued survival of Germany as a concern for the continued survival of Germany understood as an historical entity within which people live and work, and by which they identify themselves and learn moral language.

Such an interpretation certainly seems to correspond with MacIntyre's description of the nation. The problem, however, is that it no longer seems as if this account of national survival can quite so easily justify partiality as MacIntyre would like. Look, for instance, back at the case of Adam von Trott, used by MacIntyre to introduce the consequences (which he admits may not always be morally perfect) of a patriotic morality:

Adam von Trott was a German patriot who was executed after the unsuccessful assassination attempt against Hitler's life in 1944. Trott deliberately chose to work inside Germany within the minuscule, but highly placed, conservative opposition to the Nazis with the aim of replacing Hitler from within, rather than to work for an overthrow of Nazi Germany which would result in the destruction of the Germany brought to birth in 1871. But to do this he had to appear to be identified with the cause of Nazi Germany and so strengthened not only his country's cause, as was his intention, but also as an unavoidable consequence the cause of the Nazis. (MacIntyre, 1984, 16)

MacIntyre is not best understood as offering a wholehearted defense of von Trott's actions, but he is clear that these actions are defensible from within the morality of patriotism he is endorsing. The defense he gives, however, seems somewhat inadequate. The moral basis for von Trott's actions is supposed to be the continued existence of the Germany brought to life in 1871, and it is far from clear that this continued existence—understood as we have seen it above, in terms of a continued historical presence—demanded von Trott to choose the course he did. Germany, certainly, continued to exist as an historical entity—albeit a divided one—after the end of the war. It would take a particularly implausible leap of faith to suppose that the aim of the Allies was to restore the pre-1871 state of affairs, so that Germany would be reduced to the distinct smaller Germanic states which preceded the 1871 unification.

It is similarly unlikely that the goal of the Allies was to destroy the post-1870 German identity; while the Allies undoubtedly sought a change in how (many) Germans understood their global role, their policies did not seem to focus on the destruction of a distinctively German self-understanding. The point here, however, is not simply the implausibility of reading the Allies' intentions as being the destruction of Germany as an historical entity. The point is that MacIntyre's reading of national destruction ignores the real contours of the concept of national survival. National survival is compatible with a great deal of mischief; the nation, as an historical entity, can survive even if it does not always find itself in the maximally powerful position. Given that, it is hard to find a justification based upon national survival for von Trott's actions. If our key concern is the survival of the nation as a norm-generating entity, then it seems clear that even military defeat—short of literal annihiliation—will not destroy the nation. It will change the content of the nation's history; but it will not change the fact that the nation has a history, and that members of the nation continue to see themselves as living within the normative structures generated by that historical community.

One could, of course, argue that the goal of Trott was to avoid a radical break in German self-understanding, by working instead for a more general process of de-Nazification. This interpretation, however, seems to ignore the ways in which even such “radical breaks” provide the tools MacIntyre insists cultures give to their members. Even such radical breaks as those experienced by Germany and Japan after the Second World War provided adequate cultural materials for self-understanding and moral agency by member individuals. MacIntyre's analysis here seems to confuse the content of the culture and the continued preservation of the culture as a distinct entity; a focus on the latter reveals that cultures can do their jobs even during quite radical changes in cultural content.

This idea is perhaps even more stark in what is implicitly our current focus, the issue of resource allocation. MacIntyre argues that

what your community requires as the prerequisites for your survival as a distinctive community and your growth into a distinctive nation may be exclusive use of the same or some of the same natural resources as my community requires for its survival and growth into a distinctive nation. (MacIntyre, 1984, 6)

This is perhaps true in limit cases—where the continued existence of two nations as historical entities is so tenuous that only one of them can be sustained, given the resources of the world—but it does not seem to have much applicability to the current problems of global underdevelopment and poverty. National survival, on the account given above, is compatible with less than the maximization of national self-interest. Although MacIntyre frequently writes as if the two are equivalent, it is entirely open for an observer to note that the continued existence of the United States is certainly compatible with greater aid to the Third World—indeed, it is compatible with a vast reduction in the standard of living of wealthy Americans. Present problems of resource development are not best understood as being ones of triage, in which one national group will necessarily disappear because of the inadequacy of natural resources. The world does, in fact, contain enough food to maintain all its current inhabitants (Young, 1997; Dreze and Sen, 1990); a fairer distribution of resources could be managed which would maintain all people—and all peoples—at an adequate level of well-being. A separate argument must be given, of course, in favor of such a distribution. The present essay argues only that, from within MacIntyre's position, such radical redistribution is not ruled out. The maintenance of historical communities does not require, in our current world, the sort of national self-interest that he thinks it does. Of course, such redistribution would require considerable adjustment in the specific norms and practices of Western society. But as we have already seen, it is not these specific norms which are at issue, but the continued existence of distinct national communities with the ability to generate such norms.

This argument has begun from the perspective of the theorist. It argues, in brief, that from within MacIntyre's theoretical perspective, we would have no reason to block considerations of international fairness and justice from the analysis of resource distribution. A nation might, in the limit case, decide that an impartial method of determining resource distribution in the global community is fairest; such impartiality, it seems, has nothing inherently inimical to the continued existence of national community. A self-interested national morality might, in some cases, maximize the chance for continued national survival. It should be clear, however, that such literal survival is rarely what is at issue. More often, what is at issue is national change, rather than national survival. Under such circumstances, it seems that the argument from national survival can do little to argue against the possibility of principles with global reach.

Another way of getting at this argument adopts the point of view of the inhabitant of the community, rather than the theorist discussing the community. From this perspective, the key point to notice is that the moral language we have used above, in connection with the resource claims of non-members, might well be perfectly comprehensible from within a moral framework developed, maintained and defined with reference to a communal moral structure. A member of one society might well develop a moral framework which included the inherent human value of all persons, members or not; they might, perfectly consistently, develop moral frameworks which did not legitimate the sources of partiality which MacIntyre argues they must. MacIntyre's argument, I think, is here trading on an illegitimate equation between the source of a moral duty and its range of applicability. If moral duties are not comprehensible in absence of a national community, argues MacIntyre, then surely there are special reasons to be partial to that national community. But this argument cannot be extended to imply the impossibility of moral duties towards outsiders; the mere fact of someone's being outside the community developing the moral norms does not mean that they are thereby necessarily outside the reach of the norms's range of application.

We can think, in this relation, of homely examples like higher vertebrate animals—entities which are surely not within the national community as MacIntyre understands it, but which may nonetheless be given a certain moral status by the moral norms which that nation generates. What is true for non-human animals is also true for human outsiders; the mere fact of non-membership is not the same as being morally null. It is open to any individual within a communal normative structure to ask whether those outside the structure might have certain claims that preclude our resource use. It is even open to such individuals to begin to argue that outsiders and insiders have equal moral entitlements to such resources, and to begin to argue from impartial premises. This means that the simple link between the morality of patriotism and the morality of partiality cannot be maintained; the full range of moral thinking is still required to justify partiality to fellow nationals, and even if the argument will proceed from within the local moral norms of a particular community, separate arguments are needed to justify the partialist's rejection of impartiality. The mere fact of nationality's importance for morality, it seems, cannot itself serve as a grounds for the moral permissibility of partiality.

This is not, however, the only point on which MacIntyre's particularism might be vulnerable. The demoralization of modern culture MacIntyre bemoans might be the result of its being perceived as hypocritical by those within such cultures—a fact which, if true, is especially damaging to MacIntyre's defense of national partiality. If the most successful national moralities contain elements of global impartiality, then it would no longer be true to denigrate such impartiality with reference to the needs of moral community. I will not, however, explore this complexity in the present context; I will, instead, raise one final question. What sort of community is it that could serve as an adequate context within which moral thinking and norms are to be understood? Clearly, not just any social aggregation can do the job:

[P]atriotism, in the sense in which I am understanding it in this paper, is only possible in certain types of national community under certain conditions. A national community, for example, which systematically disowned its own true history or substituted a largely fictitious history for it or a national community in which the bonds deriving from history were in no way the real bonds of the community (having been replaced for example by the bonds of reciprocal self-interest) would be one towards which patriotism would be—from any point of view—an irrational attitude. (MacIntyre, 1984, 16)

This picture of national community—which relies upon notions of “true histories” of identifiable national groups—is somewhat problematic, in a way which will have important consequences for the study of national partiality. The implication that there is such a thing as a true history of a national group, which suffices to distinguish it from outsiders, and which unifies it as a coherent and distinctive social group over time, simply does not account for the facts of nationality and nationalism as a social phenomenon. Social facts underdetermine what sorts of nationalities will exist as a method of self-identification; there are a variety of ways of carving up histories to create distinct nationalities. The ways in which people understand themselves, that is, cannot be easily read off from an unproblematic history; whether we identify as Yugoslav or Croat, for instance, depends very little upon simple facts of history, and a very great deal upon political reasons and structures which give us reason to identify in a certain way. As Benedict Anderson has it, nations are “imagined communities”—imagined not in that they are purely fictitious, but that they exist in the shared imaginings of those who consider themselves members of the nation (Anderson, 1991); the creation of these shared imaginings requires not simply memory (of shared aspects of history) but forgetting as well (of other sources of unified history, and of disunity within the national past.) Nations, it seems, are hardly the unproblematic entities MacIntyre assumes for the purposes of his analysis. As such, the place within his theory for political institutions seems flawed; the only place he allows for political institutions of governance is as the expression of an independently existing national history. Nations, on this account, precede and justify states. But the fluidity of national consciousness means that this approach cannot adequately capture the importance of political institutions in moral analysis of national partiality. Nationality, as a protean and changeable entity, more often follows political life than precedes it—a fact which will be examined in the next subsection in greater detail.

A further wrinkle with political institutions must here be examined as well. If nationality is often created and maintained for explicitly political reasons, it is also true that the majority of states within the world are now multinational states—in which more than one self-identified national group exists. MacIntyre's argument, even if it were correct, would seem to justify partiality only to the members of one's national group, understood in cultural terms as a normative community of shared moral discourse. But this does not seem to be the sort of partiality that really stands in need of moral analysis in the current world. Much inequality is currently found between states, rather than between nations; jurisdictional borders often mark the reach of welfare programs, price supports and so forth, with the implication that the legal line between states can mark the line between wealth and poverty. But none of MacIntyre's own arguments can be used to justify this pattern of inequality. What this suggests, perhaps, is that MacIntyre and thinkers like him are simply looking in the wrong place; the search for moral principles by which national partiality might be defended or condemned cannot be conducted by an examination of cultural or national practices. Examining what we owe to fellow citizens that we do not owe to everyone requires a more direct focus on those things that all and only fellow citizens share—which is to say, shared liability to the coercive instruments of state governance.

We may conclude by noting that this essay has focused on MacIntyre's arguments in this section only as exemplar of the ethical tradition which attempts to justify national partiality with reference to the preconditions of moral language. Such an attempt, it seems, cannot justify the legitimacy of partiality to one's own nation; and, further, such an attempt cannot apply its own analysis to the more relevant case of what we might call state partiality, rather than national partiality. In the next section, we will analyze related arguments, which attempt to derive special obligations to fellow nationals from the importance of national community for the human good. Such attempts, it seems, have many of the same failings as metaethical approaches, and are ultimately unsatisfying as methods of solving the tension within liberalism identified above.

1.2 Cultural perfectionism

Metaethical approaches to special obligations begin with the cultural preconditions of moral thinking. Cultural perfectionism begins, in contrast, with the moral importance of a flourishing cultural sphere. Thus, the focus is no longer on the requirements of having a morality, but on the specific content of what our moral theory demands, based upon the importance of cultural structures for the human good. There are numerous variants of this approach to special obligations; theories may proceed from the preconditions of public trust and the importance of social solidarity (Miller, 1995); from an image of the self which identifies the nation as having an impersonal value, not reducible to its value for individuals (Taylor, 1992, 1993, 1994); or from a more explicitly liberal approach, on which the culture is important for individual self-identification, so that respect for individual choice entails respect for cultural structures in a way mandating partiality (Tamir, 1993; see also Kymlicka, 1989; on the notion of perfectionism, see Raz, 1986). We may examine a variant of the latter approach in this section, that of Yael Tamir, although once again the responses offered to this approach may be usefully applied to other approaches defending the legitimacy of national partiality by reference to the moral importance of national cultures.

Tamir's argument begins with the importance of nationality for personal identity; membership in the nation, Tamir argues, is bound up with self-understanding, in a way which makes the flourishing of the nation inextricably linked to human flourishing itself:

Membership in a nation is a constitutive factor of personal identity. The self-image of individuals is highly affected by the status of their national community. The ability of individuals to lead a satisfying life and to attain the respect of others is contingent on, although not assured by, their ability to view themselves as active members of a worthy community. A safe, dignified, and flourishing national existence thus significantly contributes to their well-being. (Tamir, 1993, 73)

What is required for the flourishing of the nation is, asserts Tamir, a shared public space in which that culture can be expressed and enjoyed; there must be a public sphere in which the culture's practices and beliefs are reflected and protected. Tamir argues that this is only possible when each national group has its own political institutions, controlled by the members of the nation themselves and reflecting their national particularity. It is not enough that states protect or respect nationality; Tamir is insistent that cultural nations must possess political institutions, although she acknowledges that this may be accomplished through means less drastic than nationalist secession—such as federalism, supranational associations, and the like (Tamir, 1993, 72-73). Tamir is thus not blind to the practical impossibility of giving every nation its own state, but does insist that “all nations are entitled to a public sphere in which they constitute the majority” (Tamir, 1993, 150)—where this public sphere is understood to encompass the political institutions of governance, whether at the level of a sovereign state or not.

Tamir is of particular interest in our present discussion for two reasons. The first is her explicit acknowledgment of the problem introduced at the beginning of this essay; she insists that Rawlsian liberals are inconsistent in applying their egalitarianism only within the arbitrary confines of the state, and that only an approach like hers can ground political obligation—since her approach, which makes political institutions reflect and follow cultural groups, allows us to see political obligations as variants of the special obligations we have to fellow nationals (Tamir, 1993, 119; see also Dworkin, 1986; Scheffler, 1994, 2003). This approach is developed by Tamir in a particularly intriguing way: since Rawls accepts a world of dispersed sovereignty, in which a plurality of sovereign states exists, there must be some justification from within Rawlsian liberalism as to why this sort of world is legitimate. Since there is none to be found from within Rawls himself, Tamir asserts that she can be seen as remedying a defect within Rawls's theory, by providing the hidden nationalist basis for the justification of the state system itself (Tamir, 1993, 119-120).

We will examine Tamir's analysis of the state system in more detail later on. At present, it is necessary to introduce the second aspect of Tamir's approach which makes her particularly appropriate for analysis in the present context. Tamir is unusually forthcoming about the nature of the partiality towards fellow nationals she endorses. Since individual identity—and, hence, individual well-being—is understood to be bound up with that of our nation, the maintenance of the nation is therefore of primary moral importance; Tamir argues that this gives nationals duties of mutual care and responsibility, as a precondition “for the personal enjoyment of all goods derived from communal life.” (Tamir, 1993, 97). Tamir argues that partiality towards one's fellow nationals is compatible with an impartialist morality within that more restricted sphere:

Whereas partiality towards members is justified, one ought to be impartial among members…For example, one of the implications of the right to culture discussed earlier was that different cultural groups have a right to establish schools that cater to their specific needs. It is justified for these schools to favor children who belong to the group they are meant to serve, but it would be unjustified for them to discriminate in any way among these children. When hiring workers for an Afro-Carribbean community centre, it might be justified to prefer Afro-Carribbeans, but it would be unjustified for the Afro-Carribbean director to prefer her sister over all other candidates. (Tamir, 1993, 111)

Tamir is aware that this image of moral obligation will entail taking care of the interests of members over those of non-members even when the latter have stronger needs. This fact, however, is not seen by Tamir as particularly troubling. The pattern of special obligations created by the need for communal life is sufficient to take care of the interests of all, she argues. Given the multiplicity of identity-creating groups in which we are situated, enough “circles of membership” are created to ensure that every human individual will be adequately cared for from within the communal morality Tamir defends.

It is with this last contention that we may begin. The attempt to build a morality of special obligation out of concentric circles of affiliation seems to ignore the real world of human suffering, in which those who are least well-off are often those for whom the circles of affection have ceased to have any meaningful role:

Famine and ethnic war pulverize huge numbers of different individuals into exactly equal units of pure humanity…In the Ethiopian camps, highland Christians, lowland Muslims, Eritreans, Tigreans, Afars and Somalis were reworked on the anvil of suffering into the sameness of victimhood. In this process of fission, each individual is severed from the social relations that, in normal times, would have saved their lives. Each individual in the Ethiopian camps was a son, a daughter, a father, a mother, a tribesman, a citizen, a believer, a neighbor. But none of these social relations will sustain an appeal for help in a time of distress…The family, the tribe, the faith, the nation no longer exist as a moral audience for these people. If they are to be saved at all, they must put their faith in that most fearful of dependency relations: the charity of strangers…Obligations, it is always said, are social, contextual, relational, and historical. But what, then, is to be done for those whose social and historical relations have been utterly pulverized? (Ignatieff, 1998, 19-20)

If what Michael Ignatieff argues here is right, then the concentric-circle model of moral obligation is in danger of permitting a double punishment for those who are already facing the most extreme forms of starvation and immiseration. In addition to the deprivations which constitute their burden, they now face the additional burden of a morality which makes their claims impossible to hear.

This problem might be thought to misdescribe Tamir's approach to national partiality as a whole. She does not intend to describe a theory of the entirety of morality, only of the importance of special obligations to fellow nationals; and if her approach to the claims of foreigners is a bit weak, it only means that her theory is in need of revision or amendment—not wrong as a whole. And all of this is perhaps true, but there may be a deeper problem with her approach—and those of cultural partialists as a whole—lurking underneath this objection. It is that establishing the importance of cultural structures for the human good is often taken to be equivalent to establishing that cultural structures trump all other forms of human welfare; it is very rare to find any explicit acknowledgment of the claims of the utterly immiserated foreigner within the writings of the cultural partialists, and still rarer to find a theorist who explicitly acknowledges that these claims may have a weight that actually outweighs the importance of cultural distinctiveness and solidarity. But surely, if cultures are goods, then they may be evaluated as such; if they are morally important, they nonetheless may be outweighed in moral importance by other goods—such as the claims of non-members to, for instance, simply survive as human beings. Establishing the importance of a distinctive way of life does not establish that such a creature is more important than others' abilities to survive.

All this has just been to note the possibility that, even from within the cultural perfectionist's theory, it is open to us to decide that some goods in the world—such as bare human survival—are more important than the thriving of the culture in which we are situated; if this is true, then it might be true that outsiders have certain strong claims on us which could prevent us from showing absolute partiality to the interests of our fellow nationals. We may have strong duties of global redistribution even if everything Tamir argues about the importance of the national culture is correct; as such, Tamir cannot be read as a defense of the status quo in the area of international distributive justice.

This is, admittedly, a weak concession; Tamir would cheerfully admit the existence of duties to needy foreigners, even if the concentric-circle approach to obligation makes such duties difficult to understand. But all this has been assuming arguendo that what Tamir argues about national partiality is correct; and it is this assumption which might be challenged now. Consider her claim that nations, as identity-constituting groups, require the existence of a shared public space of political institutions which are controlled by that national group. The problem with such an assertion is that it seems to simply assume that the only way in which an identity-constituting group can maintain itself and foster a public culture is through the control of its own political institutions; and there simply is no evidence that such is the case. Consider, as a contrast, the culture of gay men in North American cities. Clearly, a public culture and shared public space is a part of gay life; gay life involves the creation and protection of a variety of public forums, rituals, gathering places, publications and events—all of which maintain and foster a vibrant public culture, in which gay men find their worth reaffirmed and acknowledged. And, just as clearly, being gay is a valid source of identity for gay men, whose self-identification is clearly implicated in their sexuality (see Appiah, 1993). But it would seem ludicrous to suggest that only a shared system of political institutions can guarantee the safety of this shared public sphere. Some system of governance is needed, of course, but there is no requirement that it be exclusively controlled by gays. What is required is that the state institutions do justice for all the inhabitants of the state, and this will include respecting their identities—sexual, ethnic, and otherwise. But there is a lot of distance between this claim and the claim that gay freedom requires a gay state.

What is true here seems to hold true for national groups within a multi-nation state. There does not seem to be any real reason to require that nations have states within which they are the majority; such a situation—far from being the ideal—seems instead to perpetuate the possibility of ethnic injustice, as minorities within such a state will face a state no longer designed to do justice for all but set up to perpetuate the interests of a majority national group. All that is required, for the continued existence of a public culture within which national identities are reaffirmed and supported, is the existence of a state able to maintain such conditions for all cultures and nationalities within the boundaries of the state. Tamir's choice of the former ideal, rather than the latter, seems difficult to motivate.

Another way of getting at this is to examine the case of Yugoslavia. Michael Ignatieff's analysis of the disintegration of Yugoslavia is not that easily distinguished nationalities fought each other for the right to control their own public spheres; Ignatieff recounts a conversation he had with a Serb soldier he had asked to inform him of the reason for the conflict. Ignatieff, who admits that he could not tell the difference between Serb and Croat, was quite horrified to discover that the participants in the conflict had the same difficulty. The Serb soldier, after considering and rejecting such markers of division as the different cigarettes smoked on the different sides of the conflict, finally admitted that there was no real marker of difference at all. Ignatieff notes that this makes nationalism and national fellow-feeling a much more problematic concept than we might have otherwise thought:

A Serb is someone who is not a Croat. A Croat is someone who is not a Serb. But when difference is relational, it is also an empty tautology. We are not what we are not. My dapper Serbian solder simply cannot tell me what he is fighting for, other than his own survival. But survival doesn't entirely explain why he is here, because he knows perfectly well that until a few years ago, his survival was not in question. How it has become so, why he now lives in a community of fear, united in hatred against another community of fear, is ultimately as mysterious to him as it is to me. (Ignatieff, 1998, 37)

This brings us back to an objection discussed above in connection with the metaethical particularists: the protean and political nature of national sentiment. It is particularly acute in the case of the Yugoslavian dissolution. Michael Ignatieff's post-mortem of the Bosnian conflict begins from the relative peace and stability of the Tito years, during which many Yugoslav citizens began to think of their national identity as Yugoslavian—up to a quarter of all Yugoslavians had, by 1990, abandoned any other ethnic marker than “Yugoslav” (Ignatieff, 1998, 41). When Tito died, however, the state he had founded died with him—for a variety of reasons, including the collapse of the Soviet Union, the particular nature of the Yugoslav regime, and a deepening economic crisis. Ignatieff argues that it was the crisis of fear that allowed ethnic demagogues such as Milosevic to step into the breach, redefining Yugoslavs into Serbs, and telling them that only Serbian political institutions could guarantee Serbian power. Milosevic was able to use the media—especially radio—to recreate a distinct Serb identity, and then gain control of the remaining political institutions in a way that made Croats and others legitimately worried about their safety; once this was accomplished, nationalism was a general curse throughout the former Yugoslavia. People become, for Ignatieff, nationalistic only when fear makes it rational; and the national identity they adopt has more to do with political realities than with any supposed fact about ethnicity.

The lesson of this story for Tamir, perhaps, is that it is a mistake to think that nations must own their own states to be safe. In the first place, what counts as a nation is often a consequence of the state, rather than its basis. And in the second place, even where states are multi-national, just and stable administration of justice can provide those human goods which her theory seeks to defend. There is no reason to think that the failure of Yugoslavia's government is inevitable for all multi-nation states. Yugoslavia, after all, worked tolerably well for fifty years; it simply seems unjustifiably pessimistic to abandon the search for just multi-national states, and demand instead that political control be given over to ethnically cleansed nationalities. Tamir seems to ignore the possibility of doing ethnic justice—as well as the possibilities of ethnic injustice and warfare her own theory would seem to entail.

The move from identity to partiality is also one which is problematic; converting the importance of nationality into the permissibility of partiality is a move less easily made than Tamir supposes. Tamir's argument establishes that identity-constituting groups like nations and cultures must be maintained and supported as a matter of justice. The problem here is that it is unclear how this maintenance necessarily requires partiality towards the interests of members. To see why this is so, imagine a particularly brutal caste system—say, the racial division of the antebellum South. A white Southerner would surely see himself as identified with the norms and practices of the white South; he would undoubtedly find his self-understanding bound up with the cultural norms and practices of his time, place and race. Tamir's argument would certainly seem to apply to such an individual as strongly as to any other member of any other cultural or national group. But it would seem strange—to put it mildly—to assert that such an individual had a duty to prefer the interests of white Southerners to those of black slaves. This may seem a bit unfair to Tamir, but it is important to note that she explicitly argues that communities need not be morally virtuous to produce associative duties (Tamir, 1993, 102). Even such thoroughly immoral cultures as that of white slaveholders would seem sufficient to ground the sorts of national partiality she defends.

The problem at issue here is not with the argument for national partiality itself, so much as it is with the specific sorts of partiality Tamir is defending. It might well be the case that members of oppressive and immoral communities do have certain sorts of special obligations; perhaps they, more than those they oppress, have moral duties to work for change in the norms of the oppressive culture, to uplift the public understanding, and so on. But there is no inference that this sort of special obligation includes an obligation to prefer the interests of our fellows to those of the most needy. Such an inference needs a separate argument; and, in the context of international justice, it seems that any such argument would be difficult to make convincing. Whatever special obligations I (as a Canadian) may have towards my fellow Canadians, for example—and I do not want to deny that some might exist—I would be quite surprised to learn that they involved making sure my money flowed to Canada, instead of the Sudan.

The final aspect of Tamir's approach to be discussed here is her analysis of Rawlsian justice, and her insistence that without a basis in associative obligation—special obligations borne of “belonging and connectedness”—Rawlsian justice can have no basis for its limitation to the domestic sphere, nor even its easy acceptance of a world of dispersed sovereignty. Rawls needs some justification for his decision to accept the carving of the world's population into distinct jurisdictional groups:

Unless liberal theory can satisfactorily explain why a social contract should include only certain individuals while leaving others out, a global contract seems the only possible option, “making the life prospects of the globally least advantaged the primary standard for assessing our social institutions.” Rawls does not choose this option and prefers, like other liberal writers, to start from “what is and grope towards the ought.” The “is” in this case is a world divided into nation-states. But a coherent liberal theory should either endorse this world order and explain its virtues, or reject it and suggest ways of changing it. Accepting it without explaining it seems unjustified. (Tamir, 1993, 120)

Tamir offers her own theory as a method of filling this gap in Rawlsian thought; although she suggests that this addition to conventional liberalism will motivate a change in liberal thinking, she nonetheless insists that without a nationality-based theory of demarcation, thinking about distributive justice is philosophically unwarranted.

This picture of liberal political philosophy is not without significant problems. Tamir insists that demarcation (asking: who is included within the scope of justice?) and distribution (asking: to what are they entitled?) are of a piece for the purposes of political philosophy; a theory which attempts to answer the latter question must first answer the former. Tamir is certainly right to raise the issue of demarcation, and we will see later that the distinction between distribution and demarcation is of primary importance for understanding international justice. But there is nothing which argues that her approach to the issue of demarcation—in which the issue of what states ought to exist, or whether they ought to exist at all, is on the table as much as is the question of distributive principles—is the only one we might profitably take. A plausible alternative is an institutional vision of political philosophy, in which we may legitimately take certain aspects of the world—whether as little as the fact of moderate scarcity, or as substantive as the existence of the current system of distributed sovereignty—as given constraints for the purpose of political theorizing. Tamir insists that any consistent liberal must raise the issue of demarcation and find principles by which state borders might be determined and defended; but there is no reason to think this is so. In the first place, we might perfectly well take the existence of state powers and institutions as a pretheoretical given, and then ask simply: what, if anything, might justify the coercive grasp of these powers? Such a question asks a justificatory question, and it is such a question Rawls is best understood to have asked. In the second place, the attempt to derive principles of demarcation from special obligations to fellow nationals seems exceedingly problematic at the methodological level, ignoring radical differences involved in altering the reach of state institutions, as opposed to developing principles by which their use of their coercive power might be justified to all. There is an asymmetry between altering the reach of a state and developing principles which would legitimate that state's coercive grasp. This brings us back to a problem raised earlier, in connection with the metaethical particularists: the metaethical particularists are able, if at all, to justify special obligations only to fellow nationals (a cultural matter), not to fellow citizens (a political matter). The same problem recurs with the cultural perfectionists. They are able to justify special obligations to fellow citizens only by insisting that only one's fellow nationals should be allowed to be one's citizens. But this tactic ignores the real costs of secession, ethnic cleansing, and widespread migration; it ignores the fact that one valuable service of political philosophy is to identify the conditions under which present political institutions might be legitimated in the use of their coercive power. We might, perfectly consistently, decide that the task of political philosophy is much more situated and local than Tamir's image allows.

We may close with one final reason to dispute the theorists of cultural perfectionism. Tamir argues that her ideal is that every nation be in majority control of a set of political institutions. One immediate problem with this is the continued existence of a minority within the territory ruled by those political institutions; members of that minority culture, on her theory, do not have the same rights to cultural protection and respect as members of the majority culture—the political institutions are not set up “for their benefit,” as they are for those in the cultural majority. But on a more institutional vision of political philosophy, the task of the political philosopher is to identify the circumstances under which coercive state powers might be justified to all those who inhabit the territory controlled by the state. Tamir uses the analogy of an Afro-Carribbean community center, set up to defend the Afro-Carribbean community and therefore entitled to be partial towards that community. Such an analogy, however, seems to ignore the real differences between community centers and states. States are territorial monopolies on the (legitimate) use of coercive force, which direct and determine the lives of all those citizens—both minority and majority—living within the jurisdiction of their legal systems. What states can do demands justification to all those so affected; and it stands as a significant problem with her theory that no such justification can be plausibly given to members of minority cultures within the majority-controlled states she imagines being set up.

What has been said about Tamir, again, may be sufficient to argue against the defenses of the cultural perfectionists more generally. Any attempt to defend partiality by reference to the moral importance of nationality will likely run into similar difficulties. Both the cultural perfectionists and the metaethical particularists, in defending the legitimacy of partiality, have run into significant difficulties that prevent their use as a method of repairing the internal dilemma of liberalism. What we must do now is turn to the camp of thinkers which embraces the other horn of the dilemma: the cosmopolitans, whose argument is that liberalism must revise itself on a global level before it is to be a coherent or attractive picture of political thought.

2. Cosmopolitan Liberalism

The debate between the cosmopolitan liberals and the partialist thinkers discussed above can be seen, without too much distortion, as resting upon choice of metaphors. If the partialist sees the nation, at some level, as akin to family, so that special obligations of partiality and preference are morally legitimate, the cosmopolitans see nationality as akin to race—as, that is, simply another deep contingency which cannot serve to ground any differentiation in the administration of justice. The basic intuition of cosmopolitanism is that, since citizenship is as morally arbitrary as any other aspect of the person, rearranging our liberal theory to limit principles of justice to the domestic sphere is morally illegitimate. Liberalism, instead of seeking some ad hoc limitation on the scope of its guarantees and principles, ought to live up to the globalism inherent in its self-description, and apply its tenets as consistently abroad as it does at home.

There are, of course, many variants of cosmopolitanism, just as there are many variants of partiality. The best way to explain the approaches of the cosmopolitans is therefore to examine the recent history of cosmopolitan writing. This history begins with the approach of what we might call the developmentalists—the theorists who took their primary focus of theoretical interest as being the famine and underdevelopment at large in the world today. If such famine could not be legitimated from within liberal theory, then such conditions in the world as gave rise to that famine were in need of alteration. This approach, however—as will be shortly discussed—seemed to underdetermine the sorts of duties actually owed across borders, since it is possible to accept the moral illegitimacy of avoidable starvation and nonetheless disagree widely about the scope of duties to foreign citizens. Thus, the developmentalist approach has been supplemented with an approach which attempts to define more precisely what duties are owed internationally by arguing that they are equivalent to that set which liberalism has traditionally found within the nation-state. Since these thinkers begin, in general, by an extension of Rawls's own theory of justice to the international sphere, we may refer to this camp as the Rawlsian cosmopolitans; their work will be discussed after an introduction to the developmentalist critique.

It should be noted that these two approaches need not be seen as exhaustive of cosmopolitan thinking (see, for instance, Cohen 1996, which includes a variety of alternative methodologies). The current state of the field in liberal cosmopolitanism, however, tends to involve commitments emblematic of one of the two forms discussed here—either focusing upon underdevelopment and famine, without focusing on what more stringent duties to foreign citizens might exist, or arguing that no differentiation of duties between foreign citizens and domestic citizens is possible. We may therefore take this division as instructive in our analysis of contemporary thinking on global distributive justice.

2.1 Famine and Development

The locus classicus of the early work on global distribution and global liberalism remains Peter Singer's seminal 1972 article on the moral legitimacy of famine. Singer's article remains influential, in part because of its singular potency in pointing to the gap between our moral principles and our practical agency in the area of international development. The argument has been much discussed on a variety of dimensions, and we need not review the literature on Singer's article here (see Unger, 1996, for a critical analysis of some of this literature). Since Singer can be plausibly viewed as originating the internationalist movement within political philosophy, we may here to analyze his work prior to the later cosmopolitan liberals whose approaches will be analyzed in §2.2.

Singer's argument is potent, in part, because of its simplicity. It begins with two premises which, Singer thinks, are likely to be uncontroversially true:

  1. [S]uffering and death from lack of food, shelter, and medical care are bad.
  2. [I]f it is within our power to prevent something bad from happening, without thereby sacrificing anything of comparable moral importance, we ought, morally, to do it. (Singer, 1985)

The moral duty to sacrifice so as to prevent death seems intuitive and clearly present in certain cases: Singer imagines that I pass a pond in which a small child is drowning, whom I could save only at the cost of wading in and ruining my suit (let us imagine it is worth $500.) The existence of a duty to save the child seems impossible for all but the most hidebound nihilist to deny. Singer's argument, however, is that the two principles described above seem to imply duties equally as strong in the international arena, in which deaths from famine and malnutrition are endemic. If I could prevent at least one such death by sacrificing some money—say, again, $500—then it appears my duty is as strong to donate the money to the impoverished foreigner as it would be to save the drowning child. Accepting these two weak principles, Singer argues, seems to imply stronger financial duties of famine relief than are generally admitted by our moral theories.

Singer's argument acknowledges that his conclusions will prove demanding, but it certainly seems that this simply implies that morality is more demanding than we had thought. Ad hoc limitations on donation from proximity or from others who might also contribute seem unable to prevent Singer's conclusions; while proximity might have been relevant in an earlier technological period, we are now able to overcome distance and ensure that the funds in questions did actually save human lives—if, that is, we were to live up to our moral duties and actually sacrifice that money. And the mere fact that others who might also donate are refusing to do so fails to reduce the appeal of the argument; their merely possible donations do not change the actual situation, in which our donation might prevent endemic poverty and death (a conclusion rejected in Murphy, 1993). Singer concludes that morality requires a radical revision of our moral duties; donating to famine relief is not a matter of charity or supererogation; such donations are not optional gifts, but duties, and those who do not donate are acting in an immoral way on any plausible interpretation of our moral thinking.

Singer's argument is difficult to refute, and the present essay will not attempt a critique of his conclusions. What we will examine in the present context is instead the ways in which his argument does not address the wider scope of international political morality. Individual agents may have duties beyond those discussed by Singer in the present context; a complete account of global justice, moreover, would have to include not simply an account of individual agency, but also of global institutional reform. Establishing that individual agents have moral duties to prevent avoidable starvation and immiseration at the global level, to begin with, does not tell us much of what else such agents owe to people simply in virtue of their humanity. The mere avoidance of premature death is—however much change it would require, if we were consistently to defend it in the global arena—a comparatively less demanding duty than the egalitarian duties liberals generally argue hold within the domestic sphere. Liberalism remains potentially incoherent if we establish no more than that foreign citizens ought not be exposed to avoidable starvation. (To see this, imagine a domestic society in which the only duty of political morality was the elimination of the sorts of premature mortality prevalent in the third world today; it does not take much theorizing to see that liberal theories of justice would argue that this society still had a long way to go in the area of social justice.) We have not begun, moreover, to address the ways in which political institutions affect and constrain individual agency at the global level. Not all of politics is best understood as individual agency; the institutions within which individuals act are themselves an important and independent focus for political theorizing.

This is not meant as a criticism of Singer's work; Singer is clearly focused upon a highly specific topic, that of underdevelopment, and his argument is a significant achievement in itself. His argument, moreover, is deliberately vague, since he wants his conclusions to follow logically from a variety of ethical positions—from his own consequentialism, on which we would have a duty to transfer our own resources to the point where marginal utility could not be increased, to a comparatively weaker position which would only entail that we give up wealth until something “of moral importance” needs be sacrificed. Singer's argument is intended only to establish the proposition that, on any credible moral theory, we ought to give much more in the area of famine relief than we currently do. All that must be noted here is that establishing this proposition will not tell us anything about the precise scope of moral duties to foreigners once these duties in the area of avoidable starvation are satisfied—nor how these stronger duties, if they are distinct from those owed to citizens, might be made to comport with an impartial and egalitarian liberalism.

Another way of making this point might be to note the following: Singer takes the central case of his analysis as being that of an agent facing a moral choice. The agent—sometimes represented as a government, but more often as an individual—is faced with the alternatives of spending money on personal projects or desires, or of spending money to save lives. The debate raised by Singer's article has thus tended to focus on the capacity of moral agents to live up to the demands posited by Singer's perspective. The problem with such an approach is that, in the domestic arena, we have a focus not simply upon individual morality, but upon the moral evaluations of social institutions and practices;—upon, that is, social justice, as distinct from morality. Liberal justice does not concern itself primarily with such moral choices as Singer discusses, but with the background institutions within which these choices are made:

[W]e must keep sharply distinct…how the ground rules of a social system ought to be assessed/designed, from the (secondary) subject of how actors (including individuals, associations, the government) may and should act within an ongoing scheme whose terms are taken as fixed. The former of these subjects, justice, is concerned with the moral assessment and justification of social institutions; the latter, morality, with the assessment of conduct and character. (Pogge, 1989, 17)

In the domestic sphere, principles of political morality govern the actions and setup of such social institutions as the government and the legal system. The liberal theory of justice does not go simply towards the legitimacy of individual choices, but to the legitimacy of the social system within which these choices are made. It analyzes, in Rawls's phrase, the basic structure of society, rather than simply the individual decisions made as to the use of resources. A fuller extension of the globalization of morality, therefore, requires an examination of the form and nature of the global society, so as to inquire as to whether the liberal principles ought not to hold at the global level as well. A logical extension of Singer's project, then, is the examination of the institutions and practices which hold sway in the global arena, to see if these might not be governed by the same liberal principles which are generally applied only within the domestic context. It is this extension which is provided by the Rawlsian cosmopolitans.

2.2 Rawlsian Cosmopolitanism

We may refer to the cosmopolitans addressed in this section as Rawlsian cosmopolitans because the theorists we consider have, in general, taken off from Rawls's theory of justice—as the best worked-out theory of justice of recent times—and applied it to the global arena (see Pogge, 1989, 1992, 1994; Beitz, 1973, 1979, 1985; Scanlon 1973). Their Rawlsianism, however, is not the integral part of their cosmopolitanism; what marks them out as cosmopolitan is their application of the liberal theory of justice to the global arena, in a way which refuses to differentiate citizen and stranger. These theorists agree in the following conclusion: that Rawls's own limitation of his two principles of justice to the circumstances of a domestic society is a morally illegitimate limitation on his theory, so that a consistent liberalism taking off from Rawls's arguments must apply its liberal principles at the global level—and, therefore, the well-being of the worst-off representative member of the global society, rather than the domestic, ought to be our starting-point for the justification of inequality. In this way, liberalism is made coherent once again; rather than seeking some arbitrary fact to serve as a limitation on the liberal theory of justice, the cosmopolitans argue that we ought to live up to the globalism inherent in liberalism's self-understanding.

Rawlsian cosmopolitanism begins with the effort to examine the forms of institution and relationship prevalent at the global level, so as to see what the liberal theory of justice would have to say about these institutions' legitimacy and moral acceptability. In fact, the intuition identified above—that, since citizenship is morally arbitrary, the limitation on the two principles of justice to the domestic arena simply must be morally unacceptable—is the real motivation, and the analysis of the relationships and forms of cooperation in the international arena is guided and constrained by this intuition. See, for instance, Thomas Pogge's analysis of liberalism's domestic focus:

Nationality is just one further deep contingency (like genetic endowment, race, gender, and social class), one more potential basis of institutional inequalities that are inescapable and present from birth. Within Rawls's conception, there is no reason to treat this case differently from the others. And so it would seem that we can justify our global institutional order only if we can show that the institutional inequalities it produces tend to optimize (against the backdrop of feasible alternative global regimes) the worst social position. (Pogge, 1989, 247.)

Again, in this analysis the partialists and the cosmopolitans might be thought to differ from one another in choice of metaphor. For the cosmopolitans the nation is uncomfortably akin to race—a mere contingency of birth and fate, and therefore not something legitimately able to ground a differentiation in the administration of justice. (See Pogge, 2002, for a distinct argument to similar conclusions.)

This guiding intuition, however, must—for a cosmopolitan theorist taking off from Rawls's theory of justice—face up to the fact that Rawls includes some institutional prerequisites for the applicability of his liberal principles. Rawls's theory does not seek to apply to persons independent of what relationships and institutions they share; it is, instead, a theory of justice worked out for a specific subject, which Rawls calls the basic structure of a society. The basic structure, the way in which the major social institutions distribute fundamental rights and duties and determine the division of advantages from social cooperation, necessarily makes reference to individual persons cooperating in a social environment. Thus Rawls does not seek to apply his principles to social practices in general, but to a specific case (Rawls, 1971, 7). In order to isolate this case, Rawls makes the simplifying assumption that the societies in question are self-sufficient nation-states; the form of cooperation in question is therefore that experienced between persons sharing citizenship in a territorial state.

The first task of the cosmopolitans, therefore, is to establish that Rawls's limitation of his principles to the domestic arena is arbitrary, since the forms of cooperation relevant for the application of his theory are found as much within the international arena as within the domestic. Both Beitz and Pogge therefore dispute Rawls's interpretation of the basic structure, which begins with the classical notion of society as a cooperative venture for mutual advantage (Rawls, 1971, 4). Rather than defining societies as self-sufficient, they argue, we ought to examine what forms of cooperation exist in the international arena; there, they argue, will we find a closed system of cooperative activity of the sort amenable to analysis through Rawls's theory of justice. Beitz argues, thus, that economic, trade, and cultural links between individuals in various nations suffice to form a global system of social cooperation—so that Rawls's theory of justice must be applied at this level, to dictate the just allocation of advantages from such cooperation:

[I]f evidence of global economic and political interdependence shows the existence of a global scheme of social cooperation, we should not view national boundaries as having fundamental moral significance. Since boundaries are not coextensive with the scope of social cooperation, they do not mark the limits of social obligation. Thus the parties to the original position cannot be assumed to know that they are members of a particular national society, choosing principles of justice primarily for that society. The veil of ignorance must extend to all matters of national citizenship, and the principles chosen will therefore apply globally. (Beitz, 1979, 151)

The principles—or, more specifically, the difference principle, since Beitz does not focus on the other aspects of Rawls's theory—must therefore apply to the set of persons in the world as a whole, so that global institutions be arranged so as to maxoptimize the expectations of the globally worst-off.

Pogge's analysis of the situation is markedly similar, although he is more explicit than Beitz about the nature of the Rawlsian basic structure. For Pogge, the basic structure includes any set of ground rules known in advance which shape the interactions of individuals in the public arena; Pogge identifies this notion as a revision of Rawls's own idea of the basic structure, making more expansive a notion which Rawls renders much more narrow in his later work (see Rawls, 1993, 255-288). Among the reasons Pogge gives for this is the puzzle that—on the narrower construal of the term, by which the basic structure is linked to a political constitution—Rawls has nothing to say about social systems which lack such a basic structure. Pogge argues that this cannot be right; Rawls must be able to apply his theory to any social system involving cooperative activity:

On the wide notion of basic structure which I am presupposing, any comprehensive social system has a basic structure and thus falls within the purview of Rawls's conception of justice. (Pogge, 1989, 24)

Pogge, similar to Beitz, argues that there are sufficient global relationships—in particular, institutional relationships of trade and law—to justify thinking of the global order as a single social system; as such, Rawlsian principles of justice ought to apply at the global level. Pogge is more explicit than Beitz about what he thinks follows from this application of the original position to the global arena—he thinks, for instance, it will produce what he calls “international pluralism,” a respect for other states' methods of organizing their internal economies—but in the distributive realm, he follows Beitz in suggesting that the difference principle would be applied internationally, so that liberal justice would demand the maximization of the expectations of the representative global worst-off person.

We may begin our own discussion by focusing on the issue of the nature of the basic structure under discussion here. The theory of justice, as Rawls makes clear, must only be applied between people who are cooperating the appropriate way. We do not need to go behind the veil of ignorance with every one of our fellow human creatures—what relationships we share will dictate whether or not the full theory of justice, as produced by the original position as depicted in A Theory of Justice, is appropriate. The question then becomes: is the mere fact of economic interdependence, in isolation from other relational facts such as political institutions, sufficient to justify the applicability of the full liberal theory of justice? It seems plausible that what people share who engage only in trade, without any greater links such as shared political institutions, does not necessitate the same sort of justification as is found between persons who share also liability to the coercive mechanisms of the state. This point was noticed by Brian Barry, who responds to Beitz's theory as follows:

[I]t seems to be that trade, however multilateral, does not constitute a cooperative scheme of the relevant kind. Trade, if freely undertaken, is (presumably) beneficial to the exchanging parties, but it is not, it seems to me, the kind of relationship giving rise to duties of fair play.…Trade in pottery, ornamentation, and weapons can be traced back to prehistoric times, but we would hardly feel inclined to think of, say, the Beaker Folk as forming a single cooperative enterprise with their trading partners. No more did the spice trade unite East and West. (Barry, 1982, 233)

Barry's intuition is that there is something relevantly different about the duties owed between people who share liability to a common state, as compared with those people who share simply the facts of interdependence. One way of noticing this is to note that Beitz, in particular, severs the distributive component of Rawls's theory of justice from the other aspects of his theory—the political liberties, for instance, having no place to go in the international arena, there being no political institutions of governance available in which these liberties could be expressed. We might well question whether Rawls's theory is really as modular and divisible as this presentation would demand.

Beitz appears, in fact, to have accepted some version of this criticism, and has responded by revising his own approach to abandon any reliance upon cooperation. Now, all that is required for inclusion in the full original position is the capacity for cooperation—understood as possession of the two moral powers: the capacity for an effective sense of justice, and the capacity to form, revise, and pursue a conception of the good (Beitz, 1983). Any individuals holding such capacities—and we may assume this will include the world's population as a whole—will therefore form the relevant group within which Rawls's theory of justice is to be applied. The mere feasibility of cooperation, on Beitz's new approach, is all that is required—rather than, as he had earlier argued, the actual existence of cooperative ventures in the world.

This revision of Beitz's theory, unfortunately, seems as problematic as his earlier presentation of it. To see why, imagine two autarkic nations on opposite sides of the globe. They share nothing except the fact of moral agency, holding no links of trade, governance, or culture. Imagine further, to avoid the issue of mutual aid, that both nations exist at a flourishing level of well-being, each being quite well-supplied with all the material necessities of life—one being, as it happens, slightly better equipped than the other, so that the standard of living in one nation exceeds the (quite adequate) standard of living in the other. Could duties of justice be said to exist between these two societies, such that the richer nation had duties to maximize the position of the representative worst-off member of the less-rich nation? It is difficult to see what would license such a conclusion; certainly, there is no basis for such a conclusion from within Rawls's own approach. The two nations do not share the sort of cooperative scheme whose outcome requires justification; indeed, ex hypothesi, it does not appear that they share much of anything besides common humanity. While it might be charitable or decent of the richer nation to share its wealth with the other nation, justice certainly does not seem to require such a result. To say otherwise seems to fetishize the value of equality, and insist that egalitarianism in the distributive realm is a consequence of moral egalitarianism. This is not simply a misreading of Rawls's theory, but a wholly untenable conclusion; while there are good reasons within certain contexts to value material equality, such equality hardly seems to be the sort of thing which is universally to be demanded (see Frankfurt, 1988). The mere fact of shared human status, absent any further link, hardly seems to license such conclusions.

The focus of the criticism here is on the institutional prerequisites of Rawls's theory, and in particular with the applicability of his guarantees of distributive equality. Another way of motivating this critique is to look to the place given by these theorists to the institution of the territorial state. In each case, it seems, insufficient attention is given to the distinct powers of the state—to what it is that the state, by its very nature, is able to do. Charles Beitz, for instance, argues that no new institutions need be created for justice to exist at the global level; states might be conscripted into service as agents for the administration of the global difference principle—since “it may be that states, as the primary actors in international politics, are more appropriately situated than individual persons to carry out whatever policies are required to implement global principles” (Beitz, 1973, 153). The image here is of states existing as mere administrative units, whose policies can be premised only upon principles which are themselves impartial between their own citizens and foreign citizens. The state, for instance, would be unable to distinguish between its own poorest representative citizen and the poorest representative foreign citizen in the disbursement of welfare payments.

Pogge might reject this charge as inapplicable to his own theoretical framework. His approach distinguishes between the aims of agents within a given institution, and the justification of such institutions themselves. On this analysis, the domestic government could still favor its own, so long as the international institutions in which it acted were justifiable on Rawlsian grounds. This general distinction might be a beneficial addition to Pogge's overall analysis; some difficulties, however, seem to persist. Individual agents such as states would still, even on Pogge's analysis, have to give reasons to their own citizens for the coercion such citizens face. When such states act in accordance with international norms mandating a positive resource flow from wealthy to less developed nations, they face the difficulty of justifying that obedience to their own citizens. This process might require states to justify to their citizens both a limited range of coercive authority, and a much wider set of persons for whose benefit that coercion is exercised.

This image of the state seems deeply problematic. The notion of coercion seems to require distinguishing between the local and the global in a slightly more thoroughgoing way. The later Rawls, for instance, is clear that he intends his theory to exist as a justification of state powers to those who live their lives within the coercive sphere of state actions—within the coercive grasp of a common legal system. The mere fact that Rawls interprets his theory in this way does not give us dispositive reason to follow suit, of course, but it does seem that Rawls's vision is able to account for something the cosmopolitan vision is not. The territorial states permitted by Beitz would, presumably, continue to exercise all the powers of statehood—including the ability to coerce all and only their own citizens, in a way which seems to demand some justification to specifically those who face this coercion. Each state would continue to exercise the traditional powers of states in such areas as criminal law, the law of contracts, torts, and so on (see Goodin, 1988; Blake, 1997)—all of which involves the jurisdictional ability to determine the life chances of all and only a subset of the world's population; yet the state would be unable to differentiate between this subset and the world as a whole in the adjudication of distributive justice. It would, presumably, be able to tax only the members of the state; conscript only citizens into the national army; allow such differential rules in the taking of property of nationals and non-nationals as are currently found in international law; and so on. Yet it would not be able to create differential forms of justification dealing specifically with those citizens who face these distinct coercive rules. Such a setup seems, to put it mildly, contrary to our usual notions of political stability. It points the way, perhaps, to an understanding of the force of Barry's intuition that mere interdependent trade is not an adequate basis for the use of social contract theory as a basis for justice. For, although trade may have effects upon all parties, the nature of what a legal system can do to all and only its own citizens seems to demands some justification to specifically those citizens. The fact that Rawls intends his own theory to count as such a justification is apparent from his reliance upon notions such as the rule of law (Rawls, 1971, 235-243)—and, later, his insistence that the basic structure must be understood to include a territorially limited legal system (Rawls, 1993, 263). Such legal systems differ in kind from mere ground rules of voluntary cooperation, since the legal system is able to do something distinctive—to use coercive force in determining what entitlements and holdings will be defended and held. This difficulty also suggests that we were right to earlier suggest that the distributive component of Rawls's theory was not severable from the other aspects of his theory. If the theory is only appropriate within the context of the justification of a coercive legal system, then all the aspects of the theory—including the fair value of political liberties in determining the rules of that system—must be included as a piece in the justification of the legal system's nature and form (Blake, 2001). The cosmopolitan seems to ignore the distinctive role and nature of territorial legal systems in his global application of Rawls's theory.

Pogge's specific response to this is somewhat distinct from Beitz's. Pogge is eager to establish that a just world order would not require a world government, although he is more open than Beitz to the possibility of some governing institutions being developed at the global level. He therefore wishes to establish that no “final say” needs be had by any one governing agent, be it a hypothetical global state or the territorial states of the world—both sorts of institutions, he suggests, can work together to produce a just economic order. He begins by disputing the very notion of sovereignty itself—demanding that, in a just world order, states would give up some of their rights of territorial sovereignty to world institutions of governance (Pogge, 1989, 216-17; Pogge, 1992). He offers two reasons to think this is feasible, both of which go to the point that what is often deemed unworkable in theory seems in fact quite practicable—there needs be, he argues, no final resting point for sovereignty, no final court of appeal; a world order could exist in which no governing institution, global or local, had the final rights of sovereignty we generally give to states in theory. The first reason stems from the tripartite nature of American civil government, in which no one branch is given ultimate authority over the others—each branch could, conceivably, go to the limits of its authority and provoke a constitutional crisis, but in fact such crises are comparatively rare. The branches of the American government have learned to work together in the administration of justice, despite the absence of one final institutional agent able to assert its own unquestionable authority. The states of the world, he argues, might prove likewise able to work together in a world with neither fully sovereign states nor a single world government.

The argument is ingenious, but ultimately unsuccessful. The three branches of American government, however distinct their powers, ultimately owe their authority to the consent (tacit or hypothetical) of the same set of persons—those drawn within the coercive web of American law. This makes the case, however persuasive it may be that no single institutional agent need have the final say in the administration of justice, unable to overcome the problem of stability identified above in the context of Beitz's theory. The problem there was that states would be unable to differentiate between their own citizens and foreign citizens in the administration of justice—a problem, that is, of who it is to whom justifications are owed. This problem does not seem to be solved by the (relative) efficiency of American institutions of government. In the former case, states will not be able to justify their coercive powers specifically to those who face these powers. In the latter case, each part of the American government is responsible to the same sets of people, each in its own way. The fact that American government works is perhaps surprising, but it hardly seems to establish that institutions of government may legitimately refuse to differentiate between their own constituents and foreigners. The several states of the union might be a more appropriate analogy; here, however, it is tempting to suppose that the success of American federalism has more than a little to do with the legal supremacy of the United States Constitution—in which case a functioning global federal society might require more powerful global political institutions than many of us are ready to accept.

Pogge's second response is perhaps more telling, but leads the way to a different sort of problem. Pogge notes that federalist schemes exist within territorial states as they exist right now; so why should we not think that a global federalism, with coercive powers held both by global institutions and by territorial states, is impossible? This response seems plausible—a global federalism is difficult to rule out in advance—but it seems to indicate that Pogge's way of doing political philosophy has diverged sharply from Rawls's own. Rawls, throughout his writings—and most explicitly in The Law of Peoples—takes the existence and range of governing institutions for granted, and then seeks to find principles by which the power of those institutions might be justified. Although he refers to domestic society as a cooperative scheme for mutual advantage, for instance, he does not literally think that we are now in a situation of cooperation without state institutions to guide us—we are not faced, at the domestic level, with setting up a state where one did not exist before, but with developing principles by which that state's use of its powers might be legitimated. In his own theory, however, Pogge seems to be employing a different method—one which argues that the nature of economic interdependence in the world mandates the setting up of political institutions de novo. The two tasks are quite distinct; one sees the task of political philosophy as largely justificatory, while one sees it as revolutionary in quite a literal sense.

We may conclude by noting two things about Pogge's method. The first is that neither approach is obviously the correct one to take; political philosophy can include both theorizing which abstracts away from all current institutions and inquires after what we would set up if we were able, and theorizing which accepts the institutions with which we are currently provided, and seeks their justification to free and equal individuals. Some theorists take the latter to be the more pressing task, since they accept—with Rawls—that the state is an institution which is unlikely to disappear any time soon or give up its territorial sovereignty to some global institutions of government. The more pressing task for political philosophy, then, is the articulation of principles of justice for the institutional world in which we live. The second thing to be said about Pogge's method is that it is unclear that Rawlsian arguments can be used within the task he sets himself. Rawls's arguments take for granted, as has been noted, not simply the fact of interdependence and trade, but of coercive powers with a limited territorial reach. It seems hard to use Rawlsian arguments, as Pogge does, to suggest that the former fact (interdependence) is sufficient to mandate the creation of the latter (government). If Beitz was wrong to suggest that interdependence without government was an adequate basis for the use of the full theory of justice, Pogge is wrong to suggest that interdependence mandates the creation of such government. Neither theorist, in the end, is able to motivate the suggestion that the sort of global world we see now demands the globalization of the Rawlsian theory of justice.

Neither Beitz nor Pogge, then, fully succeed in motivating the application of the Rawlsian theory of justice at the global level. What we may do now is to examine the way in which Rawls himself thinks his theory should be applied. Rawls's own extension avoids many of the criticisms given above of Beitz's and Pogge's theories, but difficulties may be found with the assumptions Rawls makes in the course of his theorizing. We may now turn, therefore, to an examination of Rawls's approach.

3. Rawls's Law of Peoples

In a recent monograph, and an article prefiguring this monograph, Rawls lays out a subtle and complex analysis of the morality of international politics (Rawls, 1999a; 1993). Rawls begins his own analysis of international distributive justice by outlining a methodology similar to, but more general than, the approach he developed in A Theory of Justice. It is more general in that it does not rely on a particular conception of persons as free and equal moral agents. This conception, which Rawls defends as appropriate for the domestic context, is abandoned for the international arena, since Rawls believes it rests upon controversial premises which could not form the basis of agreement between political communities. As such, Rawls argues, it is unable to ground legitimate agreement on principles governing relationships between the agents in international politics, which Rawls now argues are corporate and political bodies akin to states—although Rawls employs the term “people” to signal that the traditional rights of sovereignty will not apply to such entities (compare Rawls, 1971, 377-79). The methodology is similar to that of A Theory of Justice in that is still contractarian and constructivist—the principles that are defended are those which would be agreed to by the states of the world, when appropriately placed within a morally defensible situation of choice. Rawls is clear, in this, that he rejects the reading of his theory given by Beitz and Pogge; both the agents to be discussed and the constraints on their knowledge in the original position will be altered as we move from the domestic to the international arena, since the principles which apply to constitutional democracies do not apply to the “distinct structure of the social framework” found in the international arena (Rawls, 1993, 47). In particular, there is no direct legal regulation of individual moral agents, and no political constitution within which such legal control is embedded. As a result, Rawls argues that there is no “basic structure”—understood, in the domestic case, as the primary subject of social justice—in the international arena; as such, the arguments of Beitz and Pogge are unmotivated, since they presume the equivalence of forms of cooperation which Rawls explicitly argues must be kept distinct. In the distributive arena, then, Rawls argues that the difference principle cannot be a demand of justice in the international realm for two distinct reasons; first, it relies upon controversial premises unsuitable to ground an overlapping consensus of liberal and (some subset of) illiberal peoples; second, the arguments for the difference principle only have merit between persons who are relevantly situated within the forms of cooperation found within a territorial state.

There is much here worthy of discussion. We may have questions about the concept of “peoples,” the distinct notion of human rights Rawls defends, and the idea of decent peoples who—while not liberal—nonetheless count as full members in the society of peoples. We will, in what follows, focus the discussion on two issues which seem relevant to what has gone before. We may examine, first Rawls's methodology, and the justification this methodology receives from Rawls's understanding of toleration. Why does Rawls insist that contractarian justice in the international realm must take the form of a contract between peoples, rather than between persons? This discussion will prove valuable to a second issue: Rawls's analysis of distributive justice between peoples, which represents a considerably more modest set of proposals than those Rawls defends in the domestic political context. What justifies Rawls's refusal to employ more egalitarian proposals in the area of international justice?

Rawls lays out his methodology, in the first instance, with the idea that such an agreement must to some degree respect the circumstances of the world as they currently are; these circumstances include the existence of both liberal and illiberal forms of government. Any agreement which simply assumed the truth of liberalism would, Rawls argues, be an intolerant theory—so long as states meet two minimal conditions of moral legitimacy, discussed below, their views must be respected, and the international original position must be set up in such a way that illiberal states can accept the principles it generates. Even states which violate traditional liberal tenets such as the equal moral worth of persons or rights of free speech and discussion are entitled to full and equal participation in this international original position. This respect for illiberal schemes of governance, Rawls argues, is a simple consequence of the liberal respect for autonomy and tolerance of diversity:

Just as a citizen in a liberal society must respect other persons' comprehensive religious, philosophical, and moral doctrines provided they are pursued in accordance with a reasonable political conception of justice, so a liberal society must respect other societies organized by comprehensive doctrines, provided their political and social institutions meet certain conditions that lead the society to adhere to a reasonable law of peoples. (Rawls, 1993, 43)

Rawls thus accepts as a settled fact for purposes of theory not simply the existence of plural political governments and distributed territorial sovereignty, but the existence of a diversity of methods by which states attempt to justify their coercive force to those within their bounds. The first fact he accepts—that the world is, and will continue to be, divided into a world of territorial states—is a consequence both of the need for plausible assumptions for political theorizing and of the likely injustice and inefficiency of world government. The second, and more contentious fact—of the continued existence of illiberal political regimes throughout the world—Rawls accepts as a consequence of liberalism itself, as the international analogue to the principle of toleration and respect for persons.

Rawls's methodology thus places peoples behind a suitable veil of ignorance, and inquires about what principles could be developed to guide the interactions between them. The analysis proceeds in three stages; the first develops the appropriate content of the veil of ignorance in this context, and discusses what principles could be developed between liberal peoples for their mutual interaction. The second extends the analysis to illiberal peoples, and tries to show the acceptability of the principles to illiberal peoples as well. The final stage extends these principles of ideal theory to such non-ideal contexts as partial compliance and unfavorable conditions.

The principles that such a method of analysis would produce, argues Rawls, would look somewhat familiar; they would include modified version of current international law, in which the primary rights are the rights of states to independence and non-intervention, together with such traditional legal norms as pacta sunt servanda and prohibitions on war as a method of policy. The construction would also produce guarantees of basic human rights, although such rights emphatically will not include such egalitarian guarantees as the fair value of political liberties and the difference principle. The full list of principles guiding international actions in a society of peoples is as follows:

  1. Peoples are free and independent, and their freedom and independence are to be respected by other peoples.
  2. Peoples are to observe treaties and undertakings.
  3. Peoples are equal and are parties to the agreements that bind them.
  4. Peoples are to observe a duty of non-intervention.
  5. Peoples have the right of self-defense but no rights to instigate war for reasons other than self-defense.
  6. Peoples are to honor human rights.
  7. Peoples are to observe certain specified restrictions in the conduct of war.
  8. Peoples have a duty to assist other peoples living under unfavorable conditions that prevent their having a just or decent political and social regime. (Rawls, 1999a, 37)

It is important here to note that the human rights identified by Rawls include nothing distinctively liberal at all—in particular, these rights do not include anything like a right to democratic governance. This becomes relevant in the second stage of Rawls's theory, in which he attempts to demonstrate that well-ordered illiberal states could agree to the principles developed in the first stage of his analysis. The illiberal peoples he considers in this context are states which do not respect the freedom and equality of persons, but which nonetheless obey two basic constraints on action; they are not expansionist, eschewing warfare as a means of foreign policy, and they contain legal systems of a sort able to impose moral duties upon citizens (see Soper, 1984). This last requirement, which is slightly ambiguous, is made more clear when Rawls discusses the requirements of what he terms decent societies. Such societies are not organized in accordance with the idea of the equality of persons, and so will not necessarily support liberal rights such as freedom of speech, but are nonetheless run by officials sincere in their belief that they are working towards the common good for all; they therefore offer all those affected by state action a chance to be heard at some point in the political process. Illiberal states obeying these requirements—by, say, offering dissidents a chance to be heard during the legislative process, even though they may be legitimately suppressed following enactment (see Teson, 1995)—are entitled to toleration, and principles of international justice must be acceptable to such states. Such requirements are the ground of international human rights, since they ground the list of rights which must be in place for a state to be entitled to membership in the international community—human rights are, for Rawls, a special class of rights designed to play a special role in a reasonable law of peoples (Rawls, 1993, 70). But it is important to note two things about such rights: first, they are much weaker than the political rights identified by Rawls in the domestic context; and, second, that they are completely discontinuous from such domestic rights—the latter being derived from the conditions of justification necessary for the administration of domestic justice, while the latter are designed only to place a limit on the acceptable forms of governance in international politics, by excluding some of the least legitimate forms of government from respect and membership in the international community.

The final stage in Rawls's project is to consider such outlaw regimes, and considerations of famine and immiseration, under the heading of nonideal theory. Rawls discusses outlaw regimes—those who violate the human rights discussed above—and argues that such regimes, like unreasonable comprehensive doctrines within the domestic arena, that are not to be accommodated by principle but simply dealt with as unfortunate facts of life. Rawls identifies as the most common case, oddly enough, societies which recognize no limits on the applicability of their philosophical or cultural views, such as (during certain periods in history) Spain, France, and the Hapsburg empire. Such societies, in refusing tolerance of other reasonable ways of organizing political life, are condemned by Rawls's law of peoples. The other form of non-ideal theory Rawls deals with is that of unfavorable circumstances—the circumstances, that is, of famine and immiseration. Rawls here limits his attention to reiterating his rejection of the cosmopolitan reading of his work, and articulating a principle that well-ordered societies (that is, states—liberal or illiberal—which are able to take charge of their collective political life and which maintain minimally decent political institutions and morally acceptable relations with outside nations) have a moral duty to ensure that all societies ought to be assisted to reach a similar condition of being well-ordered societies. Such a duty, however, is sharply distinguished by Rawls from anything like a liberal principle of distributive justice; it rests, instead, upon the notion of the international community as itself a well-ordered society of well-ordered societies, in which each state is enjoined to respect and tolerate the different methods of governance of each other state.

This conclusion brings us back to Rawls's starting point, which was the analogy between natural persons and states, and it is with this analogy that we may begin our critical analysis of Rawls's approach. Domestic states, liberalism assumes, must respect the diverse plans of life and comprehensive doctrines of those individuals who live within the legal system of that state. Rawls suggests that equivalent considerations hold with regard to foreign states, as well; respect for the autonomy of natural persons domestically leads inevitably to respect for the autonomy of states, including illiberal states, abroad. But this analogy seems flawed; states are not natural persons, but corporate entities holding coercive power over natural persons. Respecting autonomy in the two cases has radically different implications. Respecting the autonomy of natural persons means respecting their right to act as part authors of their own lives, to pursue their own plans of the good. Respecting the autonomy of illiberal states means respecting the rights of some individuals to deny the conditions of autonomy to citizens within their coercive grasp. The one form of respect does not, without some further argument, automatically entail the other (Blake, 2003). Respecting the rights of individuals to live their own lives in their own ways, as we claim to do domestically, hardly entails respect for the rights of foreign states to coercively prevent this autonomy from being enjoyed within their own spheres of influence. The point here is that respecting illiberal states amounts to respecting the rights of some states to prevent the conditions of autonomy that liberals generally take as morally primary. There may be good arguments for this international respect, but it certainly seems that mere consistency with liberal beliefs is not one of them.

Rawls, in contrast, insists that such accommodation is needed to express liberalism's “own principle of toleration for other reasonable ways of ordering society” (Rawls, 1999a, 43). This is, however, not the only conception of liberal toleration. Toleration has a multiplicity of meanings; on one vision, it reflects a substantive moral conception that individuals have a right to be treated as part authors of their own lives, and to be given those liberal tools necessary to develop their own conceptions of the good. If this notion has any currency, then there are at least two ways in which liberalism could express toleration in the international sphere. It could express a cosmopolitan spirit of toleration, in which the goal of international justice was to produce such forms of life for all persons, at home and abroad. It could, in contrast, decide to operate its guarantees of toleration in a corporate and political form, by regarding different forms of political governance as the international analogue to domestic conceptions of the good. As above, while there may be good reason to choose the latter form of toleration, it is far from the only conception available to the liberal; there is nothing inevitable about this approach to liberal toleration abroad.

Rawls is able to make this equation of natural persons and states seem intuitive because of an implicit equation of the interests of persons with the interests of their governments. Respect for persons, on this account, seems to imply respect for the ways in which they organize themselves into corporate bodies. This certainly seems to be the case when Rawls refers in the article version of his argument to illiberal societies as “accepting certain basic inequalities amongst themselves” (Rawls, 1993, 65); if the people involved accept these inequalities, who are we to condemn? The problem here, however, is that there is a great difference between the people as embodied in the current practices and policies of its (illiberal) government—which, let us imagine, does accept inequality as morally permissible—and the people understood as individual agents, who may well not be united in condoning the forms of inequality and marginalization to which they are subject. Which one of these two levels of analysis we choose—the people understood as the people, or the people understood as the government—will influence the sorts of coercive institution we are willing to condone. Rawls's phrasing—that the people accept inequality amongst themselves—ignores the distinction between these two levels of analysis, by suggesting that the people are united in agreement about the moral legitimacy of the inequality in question—or, at the very least, the people can all be given as individuals good reasons for the inequalities that exist amongst them. But it is just the hallmark of an illiberal government that it does not feel the need to give such justification to all; the project of justification to all citizens, based upon a recognition of moral equality, is what gives liberalism its characteristic individualism. So Rawls, in defending illiberal states in the ways he does, is defending the rights of states to enforce inegalitarian policies against its own citizens, even if those citizens are not united in agreement with the inegalitarian policy. Rawls is committed to the defense of the state, instead of the voice of the dissidents—even a majority of dissenters—as the “true” voice of the people.

It is important to recognize this fact, since it points the way to at least one set of problems within Rawls's project of international justice. But it is also important to notice how, in the international arena, Rawls is perfectly willing to accept the moral legitimacy of what he was so effective in condemning domestically: the ability of a state to ignore individual moral entitlements in favor of an aggregative common good. In the domestic theory of justice, the state must respect the separateness of persons by refusing to allow considerations of (say) aggregate utility to override individual rights. In the international theory, Rawls argues that liberalism demands respect for foreign states which do not treat their citizens as separate individuals, which sacrifice the interests of some individuals for the sake of a perceived higher goal. Saying this is not, of course, itself an argument against Rawls's theory of international justice, since accepting it as a definitive counter-example would imply that all states have to be liberal states and obey the domestic theory of justice—which would beg the question against Rawls's theory. But it does say that the liberal commitments to autonomy and individual self-determination with which we began seem to have gone curiously far afield in the methodology Rawls employs here. Rawls's project—by masking individual voices within a collective coercive “we” which is the sole agent entitled to moral respect—seems to permit the forms of substantive oppression fundamentally in tension with liberalism. The voices of women are too easily muted by a theory which asserts that the subjugation of women is something which the “people” in question accept—and this conclusion seems troubling no matter how sincere the beliefs of the relevant state officials that what they enforce is for the common good of society.

The difficulty with Rawls's project stems from a powerful and difficult dilemma for liberalism's project in the international arena. Liberalism seems, in the domestic arena, both justice and stability, and seeks to develop principles of liberal justice which are fair to individual moral agents and which generate their own support. The requirements of stability and justice act in unison when the theory is applied domestically. In the international arena, however, the primary agents are not individuals, but coercive states which themselves organize coercive legal systems controlling the lives of individual moral agents. Stability here requires the principled agreement not of individual agents, but of the states which are often opposed to or oppressive of the interests of individuals. Thus, what was a package in the domestic arena—stability and (individual) justice—now becomes a choice. We can attain institutional stability, at the price of leaving many members of the world's population to suffer under governments which do not view them as free and equal participants in the process of self-rule. Or, we can maintain our liberal commitment to the equal moral worth of all individuals, but at the cost of admitting that our principles will be anathema to many of the world's states as they are currently constituted. What we cannot do, it seems, is insist that the two values can be attained at the same time, by bootstrapping respect for illiberal states out of a respect of autonomous moral agents. We must, in the end, make a choice between competing visions of liberalism. Cosmopolitan theorists represent one vision of how liberalism might be extended; Rawls's own project represents another. The two approaches do not directly disagree so much as they represent different ideas of how the fundamental ideas of liberal political thought are to be extended given the distinct circumstances of international politics.

This last fact is equally relevant to a discussion of distributive justice. Perhaps the most noteworthy aspect of Rawls's project is the distinctively non-egalitarian approach to matters of international distribution. Cosmopolitan theorists defend an individualized notion of distributive justice in both domestic and international contexts; inequalities in wealth need to be justified generally with appeal to principles constraining the acceptable forms of wealth differential. Rawls, in contrast, argues that an egalitarian metric of distributive justice is uniquely appropriate in the domestic context. In the international context, in contrast, a much thinner notion of distributive justice applies; nations are compelled to provide aid to nations only to the extent that such aid is required for nations to become able to operate in accordance with a public conception of justice, whether decent or liberal. This means, in the end, that nations have the obligation only to provide aid when the absence of such aid would lead to an inability to run a functioning system of public law, able to give citizens reason to regard law as morally binding.

This duty of aid, it should be clear, is considerably less demanding than Rawls's domestic idea of the difference principle. It has, in the first instance, a cut-off point; permanent programs of transfer payments or reallocation of wealth are not demanded. Aid is only required in what Rawls believes are unusual, deeply non-ideal circumstances. There is, furthermore, no impetus towards equality as a value in itself. Neither the gap between wealthy and impoverished nations—nor the gap between rich and poor within foreign nations—is itself taken as morally relevant from the political standpoint (see Beitz, 2000, 688-694).

Why, given Rawls's own egalitarianism, should we defend such a minimal set of constraints on international poverty? Rawls provides several reasons. The two key reasons look to the causes of wealth and poverty, and the moral nature of objections to inequality as such. In neither case, Rawls asserts, does the international context give rise to a legitimate demand for egalitarian programs such as the difference principle.

The first argument looks to the internal nature of the circumstances giving rise to the wealth of nations. Rawls asserts that the difference between wealthy nations and impoverished nations are best understood as the result of local differences:

I believe that the causes of the wealth of a people and the forms it takes lie in their political culture and in the religious, philosophical, and moral traditions that support the basic structure of their political and social institutions, as well as in the industriousness and cooperative talents of its members.…Historical examples seem to indicate that resource-poor countries may do very well (e.g., Japan), while resource-rich countries may have serious difficulties (e.g., Argentina). The crucial elements that make the difference are the political culture, the political virtues and civic society of the country, its members' probity and industriousness, their capacity for innovation, and much else. (Rawls, 1999a, 108)

This descriptive assertion becomes a normative argument in two ways: first, it is no longer easy for any nation to work for distributive justice abroad, given the limited ways in which foreign action can alter the specific determinants of wealth and poverty. Secondly, and perhaps more importantly, Rawls argues that it is illegitimate for any given nation to be forced to foot the bill for another nation's lack of effective and productive political culture and decision-making. In this way, the domestic argument for distributive justice is shown to be inapplicable to the international context. We have no obligation to equalize resources across borders, given the ways in which the creation of such resources reflect local skills and preferences, rather than an international basic structure demanding political justification.

The second argument given by Rawls asserts that the reasons we care about the gap between the wealthy and the impoverished domestically can find no place in the international context. Inequality, for Rawls, is best understood not simply as a free-standing moral problem, but as something which stands in need of moral criticism only for certain reasons and in certain context. Domestically, argues Rawls, we have good reason to care about the relative deprivation of citizens: the notion of social stigmatization of the poor, as well as the functioning of a fair system of democratic politics, require us to be concerned not simply with the avoidance of poverty but with constraining the gap between the wealthy and the poor. Such reasons, asserts Rawls, simply do not apply internationally (Rawls, 1999a, 114) . We have, therefore, no moral reason to regard the gap between wealthy and impoverished nations as morally problematic.

We have some reason to question both of these arguments. To begin with the latter argument: it does not seem obviously correct to assert that there are no problems with inequality in the international arena. The arguments of cosmopolitans such as Pogge have gone a long way towards demonstrating that there exist institutional forms which do affect—to a greater or lesser degree—the wealth of nations, as well as their ability to run an independent form of political life. If comparative wealth creates unequal power in the negotiation of the terms of these institutions, then do we not have a good reason to be concerned about international distributive justice? The first argument, similarly, does not seem obviously compatible with a morally egalitarian theory such as Rawls's. Rawls noted in A Theory of Justice that family structure affected life prospects in a deep and thoroughgoing way; family practices, human capital, and so forth affect the ability of family members to strive and achieve in the competitive economy. Family culture, that is, may affect family wealth, just as national culture is deemed to affect national wealth. Rawls's solution here, however, was not to assert that it is unfair for efficient families to be made to subsidize inefficient families; the influence of family background upon individual wealth, in contrast, was to be constrained. The fact of lucky birth into a “good” family was an accident of birth, arbitrary from the moral point of view. Why are such conclusions not similarly appropriate in the international context?

The answer, it seems, goes back to Rawls's methodology. Rawls views the moral principles constraining international politics as those governing relationships between liberal and decent societies; as such, the controversial moral principles appropriate to domestic liberalism are legitimately rejected as too controversial. We are left with a much less powerful set of principles, whose very weakness is a sign of their power; inasmuch as they do not embody domestic liberalism, they become more suitable to form the core of an overlapping international consensus. All this we have rehearsed above. It is still open to Rawls's critic, however, to ask why Rawls felt the need to develop this sort of original position. An original position which focused upon individual lives, rather than corporate entities such as peoples, would not be agreed to by non-liberal states. But it is still open to a liberal to argue that it should guide the international actions of liberal states nonetheless. Rawls's methodology, which determines his relatively weak principles of international aid, stands in need of independent justification.

This justification, in the end, seems difficult to find within Rawls's own work. Why should we regard the international system as being so different from the domestic political context? Several distinct forms of reason might invoked to make the distinction; but it is unclear what basis Rawls himself employs. The notion of a people, perhaps, might do some work here; if we reject the alternative notion of “toleration” presented above, perhaps it is the case that individuals relate to their political context in such a way as to make Rawls's own extension of the liberal project uniquely appropriate. On this analysis, the only way to respect individuals is to respect the lives they have made together; this idea might serve to justify the respect given to divergent forms of political organization. An alternative approach, in contrast, might focus on the importance of coercion, by looking on how the institutional forms present within the domestic political context are relevantly different from those present internationally. Perhaps Rawls's egalitarian principles of distribution exist primarily as a way of justifying coercive legal structures specifically to those whose actions such structures constrain (Blake, 2001). If this is right, then the demands of distributive justice are not appropriately made outside the domestic context; international inequality is not the last remaining feudal privilege, but a form of inequality whose injustice cannot be established by Rawlsian analysis.

Rawls's work, in the end, is not so much wrong as incomplete. Rawls's analysis of distributive justice may be correct, but its truth can only be assessed with reference to the methodology he employs; this methodology, in turn, stands in need of justification. Such justification is likely available, but Rawls himself does little to provide it. Until such justification is provided, it appears that Rawls's cosmopolitan critics are still right to call into question the justice of the global distribution. Until Rawls's own approach to international contractarianism receives definitive justification, we would do well to listen to the voices of those facing relative deprivation both at home and abroad.

4. Conclusion

International justice remains a difficult topic for philosophical analysis. If what has been said above is correct, then none of our current theories are fully acceptable as means of understanding the moral status of national boundaries. National partialists, it seems, overstate the moral importance of the border; cosmopolitan theorists, in contrast, tend to assume away whatever moral relevance the border might have. John Rawls's own analysis, finally, employs a notion of international toleration we have reason to regard with suspicion. None of these approaches are fully able to come to grips with the liberal dilemma introduced at the beginning of this article.

This fact should, however, be regarded more as an opportunity than as a problem. For too long philosophers have restricted their attention to the domestic arena, ignoring the interests and rights of those located outside the political community. If taking account of those interests and rights has proven more difficult than we might have thought, that only goes to demonstrate how much work still remains to be done. Such work, moreover, is of vital importance, given the twin facts of international poverty and global integration. The world, it seems, stands in need of clear thinking about such matters; and we can only hope that in the area of international justice the best work still remains to be written.


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