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Callicles and Thrasymachus

First published Wed Aug 11, 2004

Callicles and Thrasymachus are the two great exemplars in Plato — in all of ancient philosophy — of contemptuous challenge to conventional morality. In the Gorgias and Book I of the Republic respectively, they denounce the virtue of justice, dikaiosunê, as an artificial brake on self-interest, a sham to be seen through by the wise. Together, Thrasymachus and Callicles have fallen into the folk mythology of moral philosophy as ‘the immoralist’ (or ‘amoralist’). This is probably not quite the right word, but it is useful to have a label for their common challenge — more generally, for the figure who demands a reason to abide by moral constraints, and denies that this demand can be met.[1] Because of this shared agenda, and because Socrates' refutation of Callicles can be read as a sketchy, perhaps deliberately unsatisfying rehearsal for the Republic, it is tempting to assume that the two figures represent a single philosophical position. But in fact, Callicles and Thrasymachus are by no means interchangeable; and the differences between them provide an important case study both for Plato's methods and for the philosophical options open to the ‘immoralist’. This article discusses these two figures strictly as characters in Plato's fiction, with occasional reference to a third Platonic position, the speech of Glaucon in Republic Book II, and to the sophist Antiphon as a real-life counterpart (and perhaps the historical original) of all three. Thrasymachus was a real person, a famous rhetorician of whose views we know little (though see White 1995 for a brave reconstruction); of Callicles we know nothing, and he may even be Plato's invention. The discussion focuses on the two positions in their own right, and their significance for Plato; Socrates' arguments against them are discussed only insofar as they clarify what Callicles and Thrasymachus themselves have to say.

1. Justice

What exactly is it that both Thrasymachus and Callicles reject? Greek handily distinguishes between ‘justice’ as a virtue [dikaiosunê] and the abstractions ‘justice’ [dikê, sometimes personified as a goddess] or ‘the just’ [to dikaion, the neuter form of the adjective ‘just’, masc. dikaios]. The history of these concepts is complex, and it would be wrong to assume that Greek moral concepts were ever neatly defined or uncontested. Still, Hesiod's Works and Days (c. 700 B.C.), a very early and canonical text for traditional Greek moral thought, provides a useful baseline for later debates. Hesiod does not define justice, but the injustices he denounces include bribery, oath-breaking, perjury, theft, fraud, and the rendering of crooked verdicts by judges. There are two kinds of underlying unity to this list, each of which relates justice to another central concept in ancient Greek ethics. First, such actions are all prohibited by nomos. This crucial term may be translated either ‘law’ or ‘convention’, depending on the context; nomoi include not only written statutes but unwritten laws and traditional, socially enforced norms of behavior. Hesiod's just man is above all a law-abiding one, and the association of justice and nomos runs deep in Greek thinking. However, nomos is also an ambiguous and open-ended concept. In the fifth century B.C., as we will see, sophistic thinkers come to use it with the very different sense of mere convention — or, as we might now say, social construction. The second common denominator of Hesiodic injustice is that unjust actions are ones typically prompted by pleonexia, best translated ‘greed’ (see Balot 2001). The unjust man is motivated by the desire to have more [pleon echein]: more than he has, more than his neighbor has, more than he is entitled to, and, ultimately, all there is to get. These polarities of the lawful/unlawful and the restrained/greedy are later used to structure Aristotle's account of justice in Nicomachean Ethics V, which is in many ways a rational reconstruction of traditional Greek ideas.

Hesiod also sets out the origins, authority and rewards of justice. Here he is explicit:

The son of Kronos [i.e., Zeus] has set down this law [nomos] for human beings:
Fish and animals and winged birds
Eat each other, since there is no justice [dikê] among them.
But to humans he has given justice, which turns out the best
By far. And if one knows and is willing to proclaim what is just,
Zeus far-sounding gives him wealth. (276-81)

Justice derives from nomos in the sense of a divinely ordained Law; and Hesiod emphasises that Zeus' laws are reliably enforced. (He does seem at one point to waver, and allows that if this should not prove so, we would not have good reason to be just (270-3). Doubts about the reliability of divine rewards and punishments are an important part of the backdrop to the immoralist challenge; in Republic Book II, Adeimantus complains that the poets are inconsistent on this point, and anyway the rewards and punishments they promise do not show what is good and bad about justice and injustice in themselves (362d-367e).) Punishment may not be visited directly on the unjust individual: rather, a whole city suffers for the injustice of its leaders, and retribution may fall on a man's descendants.

Hesiod represents only one side of early Greek moral thought. The other foundational poet of the Greek tradition, Homer, has less to say explicitly about justice; more important for later debates is his broader conception of aretê, which can be equally well translated ‘virtue’ or ‘excellence’. Justice is understood to be a part of aretê; or, as we would say, it is a virtue. More particularly it is the virtue governing social interactions and good citizenship or leadership. In the world of the Iliad and Odyssey, aretê is understood as that set of skills and aptitudes which enables someone — paradigmatically, a noble warrior — to fulfil or function well in his social role. The key virtues of the Homeric warriors are courage and practical intelligence, the strengths demanded of an effective ‘speaker of words and doer of deeds’.[2]

Now this ‘functional’ conception of virtue, as we may call it, can easily come into conflict with Hesiodic ideas about justice. According to Meno in Plato's Meno, a man's virtue consists, as per the ‘functional’ conception, in the skills which make a gentleman effective in his political career: it amounts to the ability to rule others so as to harm one's enemies and help one's friends, without incurring harm to oneself (71e). Such a view would have been at least intelligible to Homer's warriors; but it seems to involve giving up on Hesiodic principles of justice altogether. When acting as a judge, does the virtuous man give verdicts in accordance with the law, or whatever verdicts (‘crooked’ ones by Hesiod's standards) will help his friends?

Fifth-century Greek moral debate is powerfully shaped by the struggles of various thinkers to reconcile these potentially conflicting ‘functional’ and ‘Hesiodic’ ideas about the virtues (see Adkins 1960). For our purposes, the point is just that Plato's characters inherit a complex moral tradition, in which the concept of justice is shaped by potentially conflicting pressures. And the Gorgias and Book I of the Republic take care to locate Callicles and Thrasymachus in just this context. In the Gorgias, Socrates' first interlocutor is the rhetorician Gorgias, who is led into self-contradiction by his unclarity on the question of whether his profession includes the teaching and practice of justice. His student Polus repudiates Gorgias' pretensions to justice, and claims that while it may be more admirable than injustice, injustice is more beneficial to its practitioner. Socrates shows that Polus' position too is ultimately incoherent, and thus the stage is set for Callicles to reject justice (as conventionally understood) altogether, arguing that it is neither admirable nor beneficial. The Republic depicts a strikingly similar dialectical progression, again from age to youth and from respectability to ruthlessness. It begins with a discussion between Socrates and the elderly, decent-seeming businessman Cephalus, who offers (or at any rate assents to Socrates' suggestion of) a markedly ‘Hesiodic’ account of justice as telling the truth and returning what one owes (331c). But Cephalus' son Polemarchus, on ‘inheriting’ the argument, glosses returning what one owes in Meno-esque terms: justice is rendering help to one's friends and harm to one's enemies (332a-b). We seem to move in one fell swoop from Hesiod to a degenerate version of the ‘functional’ conception, expressive of Athenian politics in an era of brutal, almost gangster-like factional strife. In sum, the Gorgias and Book I of the Republic both reveal a society in some moral disorder: they use generational change to dramatize moral conflict and instability, and perhaps a decline of traditional values. In both cases the upshot, to which Socrates must respond, is a fully formed challenge to commonplace conceptions of justice. Justice cannot be at the same time (1) the Hesiodic virtue of the law-abiding man, involving the restraint of pleonexia, and (2) a part of aretê functionally understood, in a society in which pleonexia and lawlessness (or self-serving lawmaking) may be keys to social success. Moreover, from the point of view of the functional conception, it is unclear why (1) picks out anything valuable — anything deserving the name of a virtue — at all.

2. Thrasymachus on Justice

Though the Gorgias was almost certainly written first of the two dialogues, Thrasymachus is the simpler figure with which to begin. His position is foreshadowed by his behavior: he enters the discusssion "like a wild beast about to spring" (336b), and this tone of impatient aggression is sustained throughout his discussion with Socrates. Yet despite his eagerness for debate, Thrasymachus, a professional sophist, withholds his definition of justice until Socrates' other interlocutors have promised him payment for it. So from the very start, Thrasymachus is depicted as torn between the characteristic drives of the two lower parts of the soul proposed in Book IV of the Republic: the appetitive part [epithumêtikon], which lusts after money, and the spirited part [thumos], which loves competition and victory. Though he proves quite a wily debater, Thrasymachus' reasoning abilities are used only as a means to these other, non-rational ends. And this relegation of rationality to a strictly instrumental role is, as we discover in Book IV, constitutive of injustice as Plato understands it.

Thrasymachus eventually proposes a resounding slogan: “Justice is nothing other than the advantage of the stronger” (338c; tr. Grube-Reeve here and throughout, sometimes with minor revisions). He explains that each kind of regime (democratic, oligarchic, and so on) makes laws in the interest of the ruling party in it (the mass of poor people, or the very rich, etc.). “And they declare what they have made — what is to their own advantage — to be just for their subjects…. This, then, is what I say justice is, the same in all cities, the advantage of the established regime.” (338e-339a). Thanks to this gloss of the ‘stronger’ in terms of the ruling power, Thrasymachus' position has often been interpreted as a form of ‘conventionalism’: justice in a given community is whatever the laws of that community dictate (i.e., so he cynically claims, whatever serves the ruling party's interests). This conventionalist reading of Thrasymachus is not quite right, but it makes a convenient starting point for seeing what he does have in mind. The conventionalist position can be seen as a more formal version of the Hesiodic association of just behavior with law-abidingness, and does not necessarily involve the cynical spin that Thrasymachus gives it: in Xenophon's Memorabilia, Socrates himself argues that the lawful [nomimon] and the just [dikaion] are the same (IV 4). Closer to Thrasymachus in spirit is the conventionalism to be found in the surviving fragments of On Truth by the sophist Antiphon. According to Antiphon, "Justice [dikaiosunê], therefore, is not violating the rules [nomima] of the city in which one is a citizen" (tr. Gagarin and Woodruff 1995). Antiphon goes on to contrast these rules of justice, which frustrate our nature and are only erratically enforced, with the authoritative laws of nature [phusis]. (This contrast between nomos and phusis is often, and plausibly, taken as central to sophistic thought: see below Section 4.)

Thrasymachus lacks the theoretical framework by which Antiphon makes his case, making no use of the concept of nature. Moreover, on closer examination, his slogan, ‘Justice is nothing other than the advantage of the rulers’, does not really look like conventionalism after all. For Thrasymachus treats it as interchangeable not only with ‘Justice is the advantage of the stronger’, but with a third slogan: ‘Justice is the advantage of another person’ (343c). Interpreters have debated about how, if at all, these slogans can be reconciled, since they hardly seem equivalent (see Chappell 1993). For instance, what about legislation by rulers which is advantageous only to themselves, and thus not to ‘another’? In obeying the laws citizens not in the ruling group would be serving ‘the advantage of another’, but would the rulers, then, be acting unjustly in making laws not to ‘another's advantage’? On reflection it is not obvious what Thrasymachus means by these slogans. If ‘the advantage of the stronger’ or ‘the advantage of the ruler’ is taken strictly as a general definition, then the self-serving behavior of a rapacious tyrant would have to count as just; but Thrasymachus, in conformity to normal usage, describes the tyrant as perfectly unjust (344a-c) – and praises him for being so.

The solution to the puzzle is straightforward. Thrasymachus does not intend his slogans as affirmations of conventionalism, though he may hope that they will inherit some plausibility from the superficial resemblance (cf. Chappell 1993). In fact, he does not intend them as definitions of justice at all. Rather, the slogans describe what Thrasymachus sees as the standard effects of just behavior, on a very traditional conception of justice as obedience to nomos and restraint of pleonexia. Thrasymachus aims not to replace or revise that Hesiodic conception, introduced earlier by Cephalus as the baseline for the discussion — not even to replace it with a fancy conventionalist account — but rather to offer a cynical commentary on justice so understood. The man who does as Hesiod commends will serve the powers that be; more generally, by passing up opportunities for self-enrichment, he serves all who are willing and able to — as we still say — take advantage of him. Combined with this point about the effects of justice is an equally cynical thesis about the language of ‘justice’. Thrasymachus claims that one important way in which the strong take advantage of the weak is by attaching a self-serving inflection to this powerful term.

In sum, Thrasymachus' agenda is to assert two debunking theses, one about the effects of justice and one about the use of the term ‘justice’: his concern is less with philosophical analysis than sociology. That is why he begins like a good social scientist, claiming to discern the underlying unity behind superficially diverse phenomena: laws differ from polis to polis, depending on the nature of the regime in force, but really they are everywhere the same in serving the established ruling party (338e). Hence too his proclamation that justice is ‘nothing other’ than the advantage of the stronger: the locution is one of cynical debunking, marking his own view as a ‘seeing-through’ and demystification.

However, this dismissive attitude is not, and could not be, grounded purely on philosophically neutral ‘sociological’ observation. Thrasymachus is relying on a further pair of assumptions, which we can also find on display in other sophistic and contemporary texts. One is that wealth and power, and the pleasures they can afford, are the goods in relation to which our ‘advantage’ must be assessed. The other is that these goods, wealth and power, are zero-sum: for one member of a community to have more of them is for another to have less. That is why my justice, which involves respecting the property and political rights of others, serves the ‘good’, ‘advantage’, and ‘happiness’ (all equivalent terms in this context) of other people and not my own (343b-344c). Only given these assumptions do Thrasymachus' debunking theses capture the most important facts about justice, as he clearly thinks they do. Indeed his boldest, albeit implicit claim is that there is nothing more to be said about it — no other level of analysis worth pursuing, such as the relation of justice to one's soul, or to the gods.

Thrasymachus makes assumptions about rationality to match: the intelligent man for him is one who, recognising these “facts,” acts clear-sightedly to obtain his own advantage. When Socrates asks whether, then, he holds that justice is a vice, Thrasymachus instead defines it as an intellectual failing: “No, just very high-minded simplicity,” while injustice is “good judgment” and is to be “included with virtue and wisdom” (348c-e). This conception of rationality as the enlightened pursuit of self-interest (i.e., one's own good, conceived exclusively in terms of wealth and power and the pleasures they afford) is also expressed in Thrasymachus' conception of the ‘real ruler’, which comes out during his interrogation by Socrates.

Given Thrasymachus' apparently conflicting slogans, Socrates has no difficulty in generating an initial classic Socratic elenchus — i.e., a refutation which elicits a contradiction from the interlocutor's own beliefs (339b-340b). This employs three putatively Thrasymachean premises: (1) to do what the rulers prescribe is just; (2) to do what is to the rulers' advantage is just; (3) sometimes rulers prescribe what is not to their advantage. It follows that (4) in some cases, it is both just and unjust to do as the rulers prescribe. On the assumption that nothing can be both, one of claims (1)-(3) must be given up. It comes as a bit of a surprise that Thrasymachus unhesitatingly rejects (3), which seems to be a matter of obvious fact, rather than (2): in the latter case, justice, instead of being ‘the advantage of the rulers', would have to be ‘what the rulers think is to their advantage’. Rather than accept that revision, he affirms that, ‘strictly speaking’, no ruler ever errs. His point is that a ruler is a practitioner of a craft [technê], like a doctor; when in premises (1) and (2) he speaks of the ruler it is qua ruler ‘in the strict sense’, as one who by definition acts as the craft demands. This fits well with his subsequent insistence that injustice and intelligence go together: a ruler who imposed laws that he merely thinks are to his advantage, when they are not, could hardly be credited with great intelligence.

Thrasymachus, it turns out, is passionately committed to this ideal of the rational ruler, construed as the intelligently exploitative tyrant, and Socrates' arguments against him soon zero in on it. Moreover, the ideal of the rational ruler, who alone is a ruler ‘in the strict sense’, is the keystone of Plato's own political philosophy, soon to be elaborated as the ‘philosopher-king’ of Republic V-VII (and again later in his dialogue Statesman). So it is very striking that it is first introduced in the Republic not as a Socratic but a Thrasymachean concept. Plato thus seems to mark it as an idea appropriated from the sophistic enemy; it is at any rate a precious piece of common ground which can provide a starting-point for argument.

Before turning briefly to Socrates' counterarguments, it is worth asking what Thrasymachus‘s ideal of the ‘ruler in the strict sense’ adds to his account of justice. It seems to confirm that he is no conventionalist, since that view involves treating all actual laws as equal while on Thrasymachus' account not every regime counts as the real thing. More problematically, Thrasymachus' glorification of tyranny renders retroactively ambiguous his slogan, ‘Justice is the advantage of the stronger’. His praise of the expert tyrant (343b-c) suggests that, in addition to the debunking theses noted earlier, this slogan may also mean something like: it really is right and proper, part of the due order of things, for the strong to take advantage of the weak. This is precisely the claim that, as we will see, is expressed in the Gorgias by Callicles' theory of ‘natural justice’. If Thrasymachus too means to make this claim then he, like Callicles, evidently has what we may call a moral world-view — a view, that is, about how the world ought to be. However, as we have seen, Thrasymachus only flirts with the revision of ordinary moral language which this view would imply; when Socrates suggests that according to him justice is a vice and injustice a virtue, he weasels out. So perhaps we should read Thrasymachus as caught in a delicate and unstable dialectical way-station: his debunking comes ‘in between’ conventionalism and a full-blown Calliclean reversal of moral values, and marks a point at which the language of ‘justice’ has been left destabilized and ambiguous.

3. Socrates vs. Thrasymachus

Setting aside the opening elenchus which elicits Thrasymachus' conception of the real ruler, Socrates offers five arguments against Thrasymachus. The first three revolve around the shared hypothesis that ruling is a craft [technê]. Socrates' first argument (341b-342e) is that real crafts, such as medicine, are disinterested, serving some good distinct from the good of the practitioner: the end served by the doctor qua doctor is the health of the patient. So Thrasymachus' self-serving ideal ruler is not practising a craft; the real ruler properly understood is the one who knowledgeably serves his weaker subjects. This argument is bitterly resisted by Thrasymachus (343a-345e). With what seems like genuine disgust, he upbraids Socrates for infantile naïveté: he might as well claim, absurdly, that shepherds and cowherds fatten their flocks for the good of the sheep and cows themselves. To reaffirm and clarify his position, Socrates offers a supplementary argument about wage-earning (345e-347d). It is precisely because real crafts (such as medicine and, Socrates insists, shepherding too) do not in themselves benefit their practitioners that extrinsic ‘wages’ are given in return; and the best ‘wage’ for a ruler is not to be governed by someone worse than himself. So again, the Thrasymachean ruler is not practising a craft.

Third, Socrates argues that Thrasymachean rule is formally or structurally unlike the real crafts (349a-350c). A craftsperson does not seek to ‘outdo’ [pleonektein] fellow craft practitioners but to do the same as they, i.e., to perform whatever action the craft requires. The just person, who does not seek to ‘outdo’ other just people, fits this pattern, while the Thrasymachean ruler again does not. And since craft is a paradigm of goodness and cleverness in its specialized area, "a just person has turned out to be good and clever, and an unjust one ignorant and bad" (350c); Socrates takes this as equivalent to showing that "justice is virtue and wisdom and that injustice is vice and ignorance" (350d). The use of pleonektein in this argument is confusing, and perhaps confused, but the important point seems to be that the goods realized by genuine crafts are not zero-sum. The doctor's restoration of the patient's health does not make anyone else less healthy; if one musician plays in tune, so may another.

All these arguments rely on the hypothesis that the ‘real ruler’ is practising a craft [technê], and appeal to various structural features of crafts to establish what real ruling consists in. This is not so tangential to Thrasymachus' account of justice as it might seem. The real ruler is, for Socrates and Thrasymachus both, an ideal of successful rational agency; and the recognized crafts provide a model for spelling out what that ideal must involve. By asking what ruling as a technê would be like — self-interested or other-directed, dedicated to zero-sum goals or not — they are really addressing a more general and still-vital question: what does practical reason consist in, and is it reducible to cleverness in the pursuit of self-interest (wealth and power)? And as this question suggests, the fundamental disagreement here is not about rationality but about the good, which the rational person is assumed to pursue.

Once the craft paradigm has established that justice is to be classed with the crafts and virtues, Socrates turns directly to consider its nature and powers more directly. Injustice, he argues, is by nature a cause of disunity, strife, and, therefore, disempowerment and ineffectiveness (351a-352b). Even a gang of thieves can only function successfully when they are just amongst themselves. Likewise within the human soul: justice is what harmonizes the soul and makes a person effective. At this point Thrasymachus more or less gives up on the discussion, but Socrates adds a fifth argument as the coup de grace (352d-354c): justice, as the virtue of the soul (the conclusion of the third argument), is what enables the soul to perform its functions well, so that the just person lives well and happily.

The focus is now where, in Plato's view, it really belongs: on the psychology of justice, and its effects on the human soul. In fact, these last two arguments amount to an outline sketch of justice in the soul of which the rest of the Republic, and Book IV in particular, is largely a confirmation and elaboration. Justice is a virtue of the soul — in a way, it is the virtue par excellence, since by unifying the soul (as it does the city) it enables the other virtues to be exercised in successful action.

Taken together, it is striking what Socrates' arguments against Thrasymachus leave out. He makes no attack on the two opening debunking theses, and in fact it is not clear that Plato has much quarrel with either of them. Thrasymachus' cynical claims about the effects of just behavior (in terms of wealth and power yielded to others) are never really challenged, unless you count a strikingly perfunctory appendix to the argument in Book X (612a-3e). And the claim that all existing regimes pursue the rulers' selfish interests is later built into Socrates' own argument for the necessity of philosophical rule (520c-351a); the abuses of the language of justice by various regimes come out in his account of defective constitutions in Books VIII and IX. The Book I arguments instead take as their target deeper claims Plato does dispute: Thrasymachus' assumptions about rationality and advantage, deployed in his conception of the ‘real ruler’. Socrates' larger argument in Books II-IX will also focus on these deeper claims, providing alternative conceptions of the good, rationality, and the ‘real ruler’. However, this larger-scale vindication of justice is presented as a response not directly to Thrasymachus, but to the restatement of his argument which Glaucon and Adeimantus offer (in the hope of being refuted) in Book II. And since their version of the immoralist position departs in significant ways from its inspiration (see sect. 7 below), it would be somewhat misleading to treat the Republic as a whole as a response to Thrasymachus. This division of labor suggests rather that Thrasymachean debunking, in Plato's view, represents a prelude to discussion, rather than a fully fledged opponent.

4. Callicles on Natural and Conventional Justice

Nothing is known of any historical Callicles, and it is odd that such a forceful personality would have left no trace in the historical record. All we can say on the basis of the Gorgias itself is that he is an Athenian aristocrat with political ambitions and personal connections to Gorgias. E.R. Dodds notes that, given Plato's usual practices, “the probabilities are strongly against” Callicles' being simply a literary invention (1959, 12); but as Dodds also remarks, it is tempting to see in Callicles a fragment of Plato himself (1959, 14). Perhaps Callicles is less a historical personage than a projection — Plato's evil twin, or a frightening vision of what he might have become without Socrates. Thus the Gorgias repeatedly marks him as a kind of antithesis or double to Socrates as the paradigmatic philosopher. Socrates opens their debate with a somewhat jokey survey of how much the two have in common (481c-d); they later exchange speeches arguing for their diametrically opposed ways of life, with repeated allusions to the contrasted brothers Zethus and Amphion in Euripides' play Antiope (485e, 486d, 489e, 506b). These dramatic touches express the philosophical reality: Callicles is the most sophisticated representative in Plato's work of a comprehensively anti-Socratic moral standpoint.

Callicles' contempt for justice as normally understood turns out to involve four main ingredients: a critique of conventional justice, an account of ‘justice according to nature’, a theory of the virtues, and a hedonistic conception of the good.

Callicles begins with a diagnosis of Polus' failure in the preceding argument. Polus had accused Gorgias of succumbing to shame in assenting to Socrates' suggestion that he would teach justice to any student ignorant of it; Callicles accuses Polus of succumbing to shame, and being tricked by Socrates, whose arguments equivocate between natural justice and justice conventionally understood, and the naturally vs. the conventionally shameful. According to convention [nomos], doing injustice is more shameful than suffering it, as Polus allowed; but “by nature all that is worse is also more shameful, like suffering what's unjust” (483a, tr. here and throughout Zeyl, sometimes revised). Callicles locates the origins of the unnatural convention in a conspiracy of the weak: “the people who institute our laws are the weak and the many… they assign praise and blame with themselves and their own advantage in mind” (483b). This diagnosis of ordinary moral language as a mask for self-interest is reminiscent of Thrasymachus, but there is also a contrast, for Thrasymachus presented the laws as adapted to serve the strong, i.e., the rulers. The difference is perhaps that Callicles is concerned with a deeper level of analysis than Thrasymachus: he is explaining not why different states have come to have the particular nomoi they do, but why we have any nomos at all. Callicles focusses on the irrational, manipulative pressures by which nomos is supported: The many “mold the best and the most powerful among us … and with charms and incantations we subdue them into slavery, telling them that one is supposed to get no more than his fair share” (483e-484a).

This rhetorically powerful genealogy of justice inaugurates a durable philosophical tradition: Nietzsche, Foucault, and their successors in various projects of ‘unmasking’ are all Callicles' heirs. In the ancient context, Callicles' speech belongs to a prominent sophistic genre in which the institutions of human society are explained by an account of their origins, just as Presocratic natural scientists tried to explain the natural cosmos by identifying the ‘first principles’ [archai] from which it developed. Callicles' genealogy of morals, like Glaucon's in Republic II, presents pleonexia as a first principle of human nature; and he goes further than either Thrasymachus or Glaucon in taking this nature as the basis for a positive norm.

Callicles' denunciation of conventional justice is bound up with a ringing endorsement of its opposite, the just ‘according to nature’; in fact his opening speech is perhaps our most important text for the sophistic contrast between nature [phusis] and convention [nomos]. Nomos is, as noted above, sect. 2, first and foremost Law in all its grandeur, described by Hesiod as the gift of Zeus. But in sophistic contexts, nomos is often used to designate some norm or institution as merely a matter of social construction. What is a matter of nomos thus may vary from polis to polis and nation to nation, and can be changed by our decisions. The natural, by contrast, is a kind of ethical and political ‘given’, outrunning our wishes or beliefs; and the contrast involves at least an implicit privileging of nature as an authority (see Kerferd 1981a, Chapter 10).

The implications of the nomos-phusis contrast depend on what is invoked as ‘natural’. Callicles appeals both to human nature and the animal world: “both among the other animals and in whole cities and races of men, it [nature] shows that this is what justice has been decided to be: that the superior rule the inferior and have a greater share than they” (483d). He adds two examples at the level of ‘cities and races’: the invasions of Greece by the Persian Emperor Xerxes, and of Scythia by his father Darius (483d-e). He also imagines an individual within society who would exercise superiority to the full: if a man of outsize ability manages to throw off our moralistic shackles, “he would rise up and be revealed as our master, and here the justice of nature would shine forth” (484a-b). What the justice of nature amounts to is for the superior man to appropriate the power and possessions of the inferior (484c).

For all its ranting sound, Callicles has a straightforward and logically valid argument here: (1) observation of nature can disclose the content of ‘natural justice’; (2) nature is to be observed in the realms where moral conventions have no hold, viz among states and among animals; (3) such observation discloses the domination and exploitation of the weak by the strong; (4) therefore, it is natural justice for the strong to rule over and have more than the weak. From a modern point of view, premise (1) is likely to appear the most dubious, for it violates the plausible principle, most famously advanced by David Hume, that no normative claims may be inferred from purely empirical premises (‘no ought from an is’). But then, legitimate or not, this kind of appeal to nature runs through almost all of ancient ethics: it can be traced in the moral theories of Plato, Aristotle, the Epicureans, and the Stoics, among others. So Plato's objection is instead to some combination of (2) and (3): Callicles gets nature wrong. In truth, Socrates insists once he has refuted Callicles, “partnership and friendship, orderliness, self-control, and justice hold together heaven and earth, and gods and men, and that is why they call this universe a world order, my friend, and not an undisciplined world-disorder” (507e-508a). Callicles advocates pleonexia only because he ‘neglects geometry’ (508a): instead of predatory animals, we should observe and emulate the orderly structure of the cosmos as a whole.

As with Thrasymachus, Socrates' arguments do not focus directly on the theses which Callicles enters the debate to advance. Instead, his strategy is to show that they involve further commitments which Callicles cannot coherently explain and defend. Socrates begins by raising two points of clarification. Callicles has said that nature reveals that it is just for the ‘superior’, ‘better’ or ‘stronger’ to have more: but who are they (488b-c)? In practice, as Socrates points out, ‘the many’, whom Callicles has condemned as weak, are in fact stronger: they are able, as Callicles himself has complained, to suppress the gifted few. So, like Thrasymachus when faced with the fact that rulers sometimes make mistakes in the pursuit of self-interest, Callicles now distinguishes the ‘strength’ he admires from actual political power. (This leaves it unclear whether we should still see the invasions of Darius and Xerxes as examples of the ‘strong’ exercising the ‘justice of nature’; since both their expeditions were notorious failures, the examples are rather perplexing anyway.)

Callicles goes on to articulate (with some help from Socrates) a conception of ‘superiority’ in terms of a pair of very traditional sounding virtues: intelligence [phronêsis], particularly about the affairs of the city, and courage [andreia], which makes men “competent to accomplish whatever they have in mind, without slackening off because of softness of spirit” (491a-b). These are the familiar virtues of the Homeric warrior, and the claim that such a man should be rewarded with a ‘greater share’ is no sophistic novelty but a restatement of the Homeric ‘warrior ethic’: the best fighter in the battle of the day deserves the best cut of the meat at night. At the same time, Callicles is interestingly reluctant to describe his ‘superior’ man as possessing the virtue of justice [dikaiosunê], which we might have expected him to redefine in terms of the justice of nature. Instead, he seems to dispense with any conception of justice as a virtue; and he explicitly rejects the fourth traditional virtue which Plato will take as canonical in the Republic: sôphrosunê, temperance or moderation.

The traditional quality of Calliclean ‘natural justice’ is worth emphasising, since Callicles is often read as a representative of the sophistic movement and their subversive ‘modern’ ideas. (Nietzsche, for instance, discusses the sophists — with immense admiration — in a way that is hard to make sense of unless we take Callicles as a principal source (1968, 232-4; and see Dodds 1958, 386-91, on Callicles' influence on Nietzsche's own thought).) Despite his opposition of nomos and phusis, and his association with Gorgias, this reading is somewhat misleading. Callicles is clearly not a professional sophist — indeed Socrates mentions that he despises them (520b; Gorgias is strictly speaking a ‘rhetorician’). And his ideas are no more expressive of sophistic thought (which was by no means uniform in any case) than of some very ancient Greek traditions.

Once the ‘strong’ have been identified as an elite of ruthless intelligence and daring, Socrates' second question arises: of what, exactly, do they deserve more? Socrates already pressed the point at the outset by, as is his wont, posing it in the lowliest terms: should the stronger have a greater share of food and drink, or clothes, or land? These suggestions are scornfully rejected at first (490c-d); but Callicles does in the end allow that eating and drinking, and even scratching or the life of a catamite (the passive male in homosexual sex), count as instances of the appetitive fulfilment he recommends (494b-e).

What pleasures Callicles himself had in mind is difficult to guess. All he says is that the superior man must “allow his own appetites to get as large as possible and not restrain them. And when they are as large as possible, he ought to be competent to devote himself to them by virtue of his courage and intelligence, and to fill him with whatever he may have an appetite for at the time” (491e-492a). This seems to leave the direction of those appetites entirely a matter of subjective preference. And Callicles eventually allows himself, without much resistance, to be committed by Socrates to a simple and extreme form of hedonism: all pleasures are good and pleasure is the good (495a-e). Their arguments over this thesis stand at the start of a fascinating and complex tradition of Greek debate over the nature and value of pleasure, here understood as the ‘filling’ or ‘replenishment’ of some painful lack (e.g., the pleasure of drinking is a replenishment in relation to the pain of thirst). However, it is difficult to see how much this discussion tells us about Callicles, since it is Socrates who elaborates the conception of pleasure as replenishment on which it depends. Even the strength of Callicles' commitment to the hedonistic equation of pleasure and the good is uncertain. At 499b, having been refuted by Socrates, he casually allows that some pleasures are better than others; and as noted above, hedonism was introduced in the first place not as a thesis he was keen to propound, but as an answer to the inescapable question, ‘have more of what?’ Callicles' philosophical enthusiasm is not, it seems, for pleasure itself but for the pleonexia, self-assertion and extravagance that accompany its pursuit on a grand scale: he endorses hedonism so as to repudiate the restraints of temperance, rather than the other way around. One way to understand this rather oddly structured position is, again, as inspired by the Homeric tradition. Callicles' somewhat inchoate ideal, the superior man, is imagined as having the arrogant, self-assertive grandeur of the larger-than-life Homeric heroes; but what his new breed of hero should fight for and care about remains cloudy to his imagination.

5. Socrates vs. Callicles

The most fundamental difficulty with Callicles' position is brought out by Socrates' final refutation at 497d-499b. This is a simple and elegant argument bringing into collision Callicles' hedonism and his account of the virtues (here, premises (1) and (3) respectively): (1) pleasure is the good; (2) good people are good by the presence of good things; (3) good people are the virtuous, i.e., the intelligent and courageous; (4) the foolish and cowardly sometimes experience as much pleasure as the intelligent and courageous, or even more; (5) therefore, bad people are sometimes as good as good ones, or even better — which is an obvious self-contradiction.

The problem is obvious: one cannot consistently claim both that pleasure is the good, and that courage and intelligence (which are manifestly not instances of pleasure, or derivative of it) are goods, so that their presence is what makes good people good. Callicles could perhaps respond that the virtues are instrumentally good: an intelligent and courageous person is good in the indirect sense that he is, overall and in the long run, more apt than others to obtain the good of pleasure. But this is not a very plausible claim — least of all in the warfare-ridden world of the Greek polis, where the coward might be at a significant advantage for survival. And this ‘instrumentalist’ option would in any case be false to Callicles' spirit. His praise of the virtues of the superior man is motivated by a genuine spirit of admiration, rather than by any sense of their instrumental utility. So Callicles is genuinely torn in two directions, urging us to pursue two ends which are not only different but sometimes incompatible: pleasure and the virtues as he understands them. Many later philosophers make much of this basic distinction and potential conflict between the motivations of pleasure and virtue (or in Kantian terms ‘inclination’ and ‘duty’): Callicles shows that the problem is a structural one, arising even if one's conception of virtue involves no thoughts of duty or altruism.

Callicles does not seem to realize how serious this problem is. He responds by making a rather shrug-like suggestion that (contrary to his earlier explicit insistence) some pleasures are of course better than others (499b). In the end, Callicles' position is perhaps best seen as a series of shifting suggestions or impulses — against conventional justice, for the Homeric self-assertion of the strong, against temperance and for pleasures, whether all or only some of them — rather than a properly worked out set of theses. The disunified, inchoate quality of Callicles' thought may be part of its perpetual power; almost all readers will find something to tempt them here, and we may be left with the lurking sense that the ‘real’ Calliclean position, whatever we might prefer it to be, remains unrefuted. This unease is strengthened by the way that Callicles calls into question the value of Socratic refutation itself. For a further Calliclean suggestion is that philosophizing, while a valuable part of liberal education, is a waste of time for a serious adult. The life of philosophy is unmanly and immature, the antithesis of an honorable public life; Socrates ought to "stop this refuting" and "leave these subtleties to others" (485e-486d). Callicles' anti-intellectualism does not prevent him from showing some skill in dialectic, and more commitment to its norms than most of Socrates' interlocutors (e.g., at 495a). But Callicles also claims that he argues only to please Gorgias (506c); and in the end, he opts out of the discussion altogether, retreating into surly silence. Socrates is left to complete the argument by himself, and eventually shifts gears from philosophy to a myth depicting the fate of the unjust in the underworld. Most disturbing here is Callicles' suggestion that Socrates' positions are self-serving expressions of his commitment to the philosophical life, rather than grounding for it. Socrates must change his practices to gain insight: "This is the truth of the matter, as you will know if you abandon philosophy and move on to more important things" (484c). Callicles is here the first voice within philosophy to raise the prospect that there are truths which philosophy may itself obscure. That is a possibility which Socrates clearly rejects; but it is hard to see how he could refute it.

6. Conclusion: Thrasymachus and Callicles

One way to frame a comparison of Thrasymachus and Callicles is to ask why Plato would choose to represent the former position in the Republic and the latter in the Gorgias. The answer seems to be that the differences between the two put them in very different relations to Socrates, and to the defense of justice (cf. Barney 1999). Socrates and Callicles are antitheses: they ask and answer the same questions. Each offers a positive account of the real nature of justice, grounded in a broader conception of human nature and the nature of things. Indeed, viewed at a high level of abstraction, and with the hindsight provided by the Republic, their positions are remarkably similar. For Plato in fact agrees with Callicles that the many should be ruled by the superior few — i.e., the intelligent and courageous — and that it is only natural and just for the latter to have greater happiness and pleasure than the many. Where they differ is in the content they give to this shared schema: above all, from Plato's point of view, Callicles is wrong about the nature of the good at which the superior man aims. Thrasymachus, on the other hand, stands as dialectically prior to both Socrates and Callicles, for while persuasively debunking justice as conventionally conceived, he fails to offer any replacement account of the virtues. The closest he comes to offering a substitute norm is in his praise of the expertly rational ‘real’ ruler – an ideal which is pursued and developed more fully, in connection with the virtues, both by Callicles in the Gorgias and Socrates in the Republic itself.

So a Thrasymachean debunking of convention can clear the ground for the development of either Platonic or anti-Platonic moral theory. In the Republic, the Calliclean path is represented by Glaucon's speech in Book II. Glaucon presents his attack on justice as a restatement of Thrasymachus' position (358c); but it represents a considerable advance in sophistication, and the differences bring it closer to Callicles' position. Like Callicles, Glaucon concerns himself explicitly with the nature of justice, classifying it as a merely instrumental good (or a necessary evil) and locating its origins in a social contract. By nature we are all pleonectic; but since we stand more to lose more than we could gain from unbridled pleonexia we have entered into a compact neither to do nor to allow injustice. As the famous ‘ring of Gyges’ thought-experiment shows, however, nobody has any real commitment to acting justly when they think they can get away with injustice; if someone can commit injustice undetected there is no reason for him not to. Thus Glaucon agrees with Callicles in identifying justice as a matter of convention, and in holding that it conflicts with our nature; he remains with Thrasymachus in not articulating any alternative moral norm; and he departs from both in not relying on the questionable complication of dividing mankind into exploiters and exploited. In sum, his position represents the immoralist challenge in a fully developed but streamlined form, as reducible to a simple question: given the conventional character of justice and our own pleonectic nature, why should any one of us be just, in any context in which injustice would be profitable?

This is also a basic challenge posed by the sophist Antiphon, in the surviving fragments of his discussion of justice in On Truth. And without wanting to deny the existence of other contemporary figures working similar terrain, we can easily read these dialogues as dividing Antiphon into two, the better to clarify the complex philosophical options involved in the immoralist stance. In doing so, Plato has created a dialectical monster: not one figure but two whose challenges, though they elicit some of Socrates' most memorable arguments, may well strike the reader as outrunning his ability to refute them.


For general accounts of the Republic, see the Bibliography to the entry, Plato's ethics and politics. The following are works cited in or having particular relevance to the present entry:

The immoralist challenge

Callicles and Thrasymachus: Social Context

Thrasymachus and the Republic

Callicles and the Gorgias

Other Internet Resources

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Related Entries

cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism, moral | ethics: ancient | Plato: ethics | Plato: ethics and politics in The Republic | Socrates