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Plato's Aesthetics

First published Fri Jun 27, 2008

If aesthetics is the philosophical inquiry into art and beauty (or, today, “aesthetic value”), then Plato's aesthetics is a rich subject—maybe too rich. For the striking feature of Plato's dialogues in this regard is that he devotes as much time as he does to both beauty and art, but treats the two oppositely. Art, mostly represented by poetry, is closer to a greatest evil than any other phenomenon Plato speaks of, while beauty is close to a greatest good. Can there be such a thing as “Plato's aesthetics” that contains both positions?

Perhaps Plato is better described as working through an exploratory aesthetics, seeking to discover the subject's vocabulary and issues. For this reason his readers might not find a single aesthetic theory in the dialogues. But for the same reason they are uniquely situated to watch core concepts of aesthetics being defined: beauty, imitation, inspiration.

The subject calls for careful reading. If perennially footnoted by later philosophers Plato has also been perennially thumbnailed. Clichés accompany his name. It is worth going slowly through the main topics of Plato's aesthetics—not in the search for some surprising theory unlike anything that has been said about him, but so that background shading and details may emerge, for a result that perhaps resembles the usual doctrine-summaries as a human face resembles the cartoon reduction of it.

1. Beauty

The English “beauty” only approximates to to kalon. When a passage in Plato speaks of a face or body someone finds kalon, or for that matter a spoon or statue, “beautiful” is a natural equivalent and the alternatives sound stilted. But the Greek adjective has broader applications than those, at times rather meaning “noble.” The compound kalos kagathos, referring to the aristocratic ideal of a man, very much does not mean “beautiful and good.” One is upright and admirable and a good warrior in order to be kalos kagathos; here one has to call the adjective an ethical term. Exact translators prefer to render kalon as “fine,” which while blander than “beautiful” is suitable to both ethical and aesthetic contexts (Woodruff 1983).

The telling criterion will be not philological but philosophical. Studying the Hippias Major each reader should ask whether Plato's treatment of to kalon sounds relevant to questions one asks about beauty today.

1.1 Hippias Major

For a long time scholars treated the Hippias Major as a spurious dialogue. Today the majority view is that Plato wrote it. This dialogue follows Socrates and the Sophist Hippias through a sequence of attempts to define to kalon. Socrates badgers Hippias, in classic Socratic ways, to identify beauty's general nature; Hippias offers three definitions. Quite preposterously for instance “a beautiful young woman is beautiful” (287e).

Socrates then puts three definitions forward. These are properly general but they fail too, and—again in classic Socratic mode—the dialogue ends unresolved. In one excursus Socrates says beauty “is appropriate [prepei]” and proposes defining it as “what is appropriate [to prepon]” (290d). Although ending in refutation this discussion (to 294e) is worth a look as prefiguring a modern debate. Philosophers of the eighteenth century argue over whether a beautiful object is so by virtue of satisfying the definition of the object or independently of definitions. (Is this a beautiful doorknob because it is so perfectly what a doorknob should be, or would one call it beautiful even in ignorance of doorknobs and what they do, simply impressed by its shape and color?) Kant calls the beauty that is appropriateness “dependent beauty” (Critique of Judgment, section 16).

Despite its inconclusiveness the Hippias Major reflects the view of beauty found in Plato's other dialogues:

  1. Beauty behaves as canonical Platonic Forms do. It possesses the reality that Forms have and is known by means of the same dialectic that brings other Forms to light. Socrates wants Hippias to explain the property that is known when any examples of beauty are known (essence of beauty), the cause of all occurrences of beauty, and more precisely the cause not of the appearance of beauty but of its real being (286d, 287c, 289d, 292c, 294e, 297b).
  2. Beauty is not just any Form. It bears some close relationship to the good (296d), even though Socrates argues that the two are distinct (296e ff., 303e ff.). It is therefore a Form of some status above that of other Forms.
  3. Socrates and Hippias appeal to artworks as examples of beautiful things but do not treat those examples as the central cases (290a–b, 297e–298a). So too generally Plato conducts his inquiry into beauty at a distance from his discussion of art.

These three aspects of Platonic beauty work together and reflect beauty's unique place in Plato's metaphysics, something almost both visible and intelligible.

1.2 Beauty and art

The Symposium contains Plato's other major analysis of beauty. Socrates claims to be quoting his teacher Diotima on the subject of love, and in the lesson attributed to her she calls beauty the object of every love's yearning. She spells out the soul's progress toward ever-purer beauty, from one body to all, then through all beautiful souls, laws, and kinds of knowledge, to arrive at beauty itself (210a–211d).

Two remarks suggest that works of art count as beautiful things. Diotima describes the poet's task as the begetting of wisdom and other virtues (209a). Ultimately moved by desire for what is beautiful the poet produces works of verse; and who would not envy Homer or Hesiod (209d)? And yet, aside from these parenthetical comments, the Symposium seems prepared to treat anything but a poem as an exemplar of beauty. (In a similar spirit the Philebus's examples of pure sensory beauty exclude pictures: 51b–d.)

The Republic contains several tokens of Plato's reluctance to associate poetry with beauty. The dialogue's first discussion of poetry, whose context is education, censors poems that corrupt the young (377b–398b). Then almost immediately Socrates is speaking of cultivating a fondness for beauty among the young guardians. Their taste for beauty will help them prefer noble deeds over ugly vulgar ones (401b–d, 403c). How can Plato have seen the value of beauty to education and not mentioned the subject in his earlier criticisms? Why couldn't this part of the Republic so much as concede that false and pernicious poems affect the young through their beauty?

If anything, Plato takes pains to prevent beauty from appearing in poetry. Republic 10 calls the beauty of poetic lines a deceptive attractiveness. Take away the decorative language that makes a poetic sentiment sound so right and put it into ordinary words, and it becomes unremarkable, much as young people's faces beautified by youth later show themselves as the plain looks they are (601b).

1.3 The Form of beauty

The fact is that Plato sees no opposition between the pleasures that beauty brings and the goals of philosophy. The Form of beauty makes its most dramatic appearance in the Symposium where it stands at the top of a hierarchy of beautiful items surpassing them all (210d–212a). Plato mentions no other Form in the Symposium; beauty is Form enough. Philosophers meet this beauty in an experience in which they consummate their deepest love while also attaining the loftiest knowledge.

Many passages in Plato claim that beauty has a Form: Cratylus 439c; Euthydemus 301a; Laws 655c; Phaedo 65d, 75d, 100b; Phaedrus 254b; Parmenides 130b; Philebus 15a; Republic 476b, 493e, 507b. Plato mentions beauty as often as he speaks of any property that admits of understanding and for which a Form therefore exists. He conceives of a beauty whose nature can be articulated without recourse to the natures of particular beautiful things (see especially Phaedo 79a, Phaedrus 247c, on properties of this Form).

Beauty is so frequently Plato's example of a Form because it bears every mark of the Forms. It is an evaluative concept as much as justice and courage are and suffers from disputes over its meaning as much as they do. The Theory of Forms mainly exists in order to guarantee stable meanings for disputed evaluative terms; so if anything has a Form, beauty will.

In general, a Platonic Form F differs from an individual F thing in that F may be predicated univocally of the Form: The Form F is F. An individual F thing by comparison both is and is not F; in this sense the same property F can only be predicated equivocally of the individual (e.g. Republic 479a–c). Plato's analysis of equivocally F individuals (Cratylus 439d–e, Symposium 211a) recalls observations that everyone makes about beautiful objects. They fade with time; require an offsetting ugly detail; elicit disagreements among observers; lose their beauty outside their context (adult shoes on children's feet). Odd numbers may fail to be odd in some hard-to-explain way, but the ways in which beautiful things fall short of their perfection are obvious to their most unphilosophical admirers.

Furthermore, physical beauty makes Platonic recollection more plausible than most properties do. The philosophical merit of things that are equivocally F is that they come bearing signs of their incompleteness, so that the inquisitive mind wants to know more (Republic 523c–524d). But whereas soft or large items inspire questions in minds of an abstract bent, and the perception of examples of justice or self-control presupposes moral development, beautiful things strike everyone. Therefore, beauty promises more effective reflection than any other property of things. Beauty alone is both a Form and a sensory experience (Phaedrus 250d).

This is why the Phaedrus (250d–256b) and Symposium ignore experiences of other properties when they describe the first movement into philosophizing. Beautiful things remind souls of their mystery as no other visible objects do, and in his optimistic moments Plato welcomes people's attention to them.

Beauty's unique pedagogical effects show why Plato talks about its goodness and good consequences, sometimes even its identity with “the good” (Laws 841c; Philebus 66a–b; Republic 401c; Symposium 201c, 205e; but the relationship between beautiful and good, especially in Symposium, is controversial: White 1989); and why Plato speaks so reluctantly of the beauty in art and poetry. For him the question is not whether poems are beautiful, and subsequently whether or not they belong in a theory of that prized aesthetic property. The prior question is whether poems can lead the mind toward knowledge and the Forms as things of beauty can. Typically they cannot. When poems or paintings set the mind running along unphilosophical tracks away from what is abstract and intelligible, the attractions they possess will be seen as meretricious. The corrupting cognitive effect that poems have demonstrates their inability to function as Plato knows the beautiful object to function.

The corrupting effect needs to be spelled out further. What prevents poems from behaving as beautiful objects do? The answer will have to address the orienting question in Plato's aesthetics, namely: What fosters philosophical enlightenment, and what obstructs it?

2. Imitation

“Imitation” is the commonest English translation of mimêsis. Alternatives include “representation” and “emulation.” To make things confusing, the Greek word sans diacritical mark and italics has come to be accepted as English (“mimesis”). All the translations capture something of the word's meaning in classical Greek. As long as “imitation” is used with awareness that it will not mean everything that mimêsis does, it makes a serviceable translation. “Imitate” functions well enough as the verb mimeisthai; so does “mimic.” (See Sörbom 1966 for thorough discussion.)

Of course it is no great trouble to use the Greek mimêsis, as this discussion will frequently do. For simplicity's sake some prefer the now-English “mimesis.” But this last choice brings a risk. The English word “mimesis” has begun picking up its own senses and particular uses, becoming English proportionately as it ceases to stand in for the Greek word.

Besides mimêsis Plato sometimes speaks of a mimêma. “Imitation” like mimêsis can refer either to a process or to that process's outcome; a mimêma however is a copy and not the act of copying that produced it.

2.1 Mimêsis in Aristophanes

Before Plato mimêsis had a vaguer meaning, neither specially applying to a poetic process nor necessarily implying fraud and counterfeit—with one important exception. The comedies of Aristophanes, so obsessed with Euripides in particular but really with tragedy as such (Birds 787, 1444; Clouds 1091; Plutus 423–4), introduce comments on tragic stagecraft that use mimeisthai and mimêsis in consistently pejorative ways.

Aristophanes has long been seen as Plato's precursor in the moralistic critique of poetry. They share conservative sensibilities that outweigh Aristophanes' attack on Socrates in Clouds (Nussbaum 1980). But Aristophanes' influence on Plato extends to mimêsis: He uses the word in a technical sense that describes what actors do in a play, and with suggestions of fraud or concealment.

In addition to Frogs with its face-off between Aeschylus and Euripides there is the more obscure Women Celebrating the Thesmophoria, which calls mimêsis a disruption of life and opposes it to nature. It can also be argued that Women Celebrating the Thesmophoria finds an ambiguity in dramatic imitation that anticipates Plato; for in that play, as in the Republic, mimêsis combines composition and performance, the invention of characters and the portrayal of them (Pappas 1999).

2.2 Republic 3: impersonation

Books 2 and 3 of the Republic assess poetry's role in the curriculum for the city's guardian class. The first part of this passage, mainly in Book 2, criticizes the images of gods and demigods that Homer and the tragedians have produced, both blaspheming and setting bad examples to the young (377e–392c). After this criticism of content Socrates turns to the “style [lexis]” of narration. Poetic narration can take place through narration alone, through mimêsis alone, or by means of a mix of those two (392d).

The differentiation is odd, as if one analyzed walking into pure walking, running, and a combination of the two—which would be curious enough—as a method for understanding running. The approach builds in a presumption that mimêsis must be the deviant manifestation. The subsequent pages continue treating mimêsis as anomalous. Socrates defines imitation, develops two arguments against it, and finally proclaims that no poetry of this type will be admitted into the city that the Republic is founding.

The defining example establishes mimêsis as impersonation. Homer's poems alternate between third-person accounts of events and directly quoted speeches of the characters involved in those events. When Homer relates Agamemnon's rebuke to the priest Chryses he uses the abusive language that a warriors' king would use when refusing to show mercy (393a–c). This direct presentation of character is a process ambiguous between the act of writing the words of a character like Agamemnon, and that of reciting (performing, acting out) the words. The ambiguity lets Socrates deploy more than one argument against the presentation of characters.

The main argument is blunt but clear, and plausible enough. What the new city really does not want is the presentation of base types, because acting such parts fosters the behaviors that are found in the persons being mimicked (395c–397e).

If acting a part does lead to taking on the characteristics of the part, then Plato has in one respect a powerful point and in another respect a dishonest argument. It is powerful inasmuch as it lets Plato ban all portrayals of vicious and ignoble characters but shield the portrayals of brave soldiers, philosophers, and other wholesome types from censorship. (Plato's list of things unworthy of imitation proves surprisingly commodious. Alongside villains one finds all women, slaves, animals, musical instruments, gears and pulleys, and sounds of water.)

The argument works dishonestly in that it exploits the ambiguity between impersonation as something a writer does and impersonation as the performer's task. In 1963 Eric Havelock stressed the importance of this ambiguity to Book 3; but Havelock understated the degree to which Plato exploited the ambiguity for anti-poetic purposes. For on one hand the most convincing part of Book 3 has to assume that mimêsis is performance, both because such effects as thunder and pulley wheels are mimicked in performance, not on the page; and because the bad effects of impersonation on character make more sense when describing young actors' playing a vicious role than grown playwrights in the act of writing that role.

On the other hand performance hardly threatens a whole population. It is true that young male Athenians formed the choruses for comedy and tragedy. Future farmers and doctors, generals and gentlemen, spent a season preparing for their time on stage. Even so, the extensiveness of the practice among young people does not justify barring all drama from the city and from the sight of each citizen, and that is what Plato's concluding ban comes to:

If a man were to arrive in the city whose wisdom [sophia] empowered him to become everything and to mimic all things—together with the poems he wanted to perform [epideixasthai]— we would worship him as someone holy [hieron] and wonderful and pleasant, but tell him there is no man like him in our city, nor by our traditional law [themis] can come to be here; and we would send him off to another city after pouring myrrh on his head and crowning him with wool. (398a)

The religious language is lavish and telling. No ordinary deeds are being excluded but rather ones that smell of sacred power. And Plato's censorship will be complete. The city fathers running mimetic poetry out of town have broadened their scope from the young guardians' education to the cultural life of an entire community. The literary representation of characters will receive no hearing anywhere in town. It is even doubtful whether the city will permit dramatic poems to exist and circulate in written form. The poet has had to bring his writings with him, and he cannot get his foot in the door.

Note that the poet is visiting. Poetry has no natural home in the philosophers' town. Moreover he arrives offering to recite his poems. That they are his makes him a poet, that he comes to recite them makes him a performer. He embodies the ambiguity built into Book 3's definition of mimêsis: a perfect target. If the fate of imitative composition stands or falls with the fate of imitative performance, a reasonable worry about the behaviors young people experiment with balloons into an argument against a mammoth body of literature. The grand conclusion that Plato wants depends on the ambiguity in his definition of imitation.

In Book 3 imitation is a formal concept. This is to say 1) that one can distinguish poetic mimêsis from poetic narration by looking for a formal element in the poetry; and 2) that mimêsis may make poetry more deleterious than it would otherwise be, but does not work these bad effects by itself, only when the characters represented are bad to begin with. The definition of imitation in Book 3 entails no general ideas of similarity or likeness. Mimêsis functions as a technical term with a narrowly literary meaning, no more inherently philosophical than is the distinction one would draw in English today between direct and indirect discourse.

Book 10 will look at imitation from a markedly different perspective. Space does not permit a review of all existing proposals about how to square the two passages. Whether Books 3 and 10 are compatible, and how they are, remains the most controversial question about Plato's aesthetics. (See especially Belfiore 1984, Halliwell 1988, Nehamas 1982; and for a superb summary of the main proposals, Naddaff 2002, 136n8.) Still one may say that Republic 10 revises the formal aspects of mimêsis with a picturing or portrayal that involves more than direct quotation. Unlike the word from Book 3 this enhanced concept cannot be understood without reference to the Republic's complete psychological theory. And in its expanded form the term refers to something bad in itself.

2.3 Republic 10: copy-making

The topic in this passage (595a–608b) is a mimêsis common to painting and poetry and much like picturing or copying.

As Book 10 begins Socrates establishes the continuity of the coming treatment with what Book 3 had said about imitation, but also the difference between the passages. What follows will defend Book 3's banishment of “imitative poetry” in terms that the Republic developed in Book 4 and afterwards, hence terms that Book 3 could not have used. “Now that we have differentiated the soul's eidê,” the danger of imitation becomes more evident (595a–b). An eidos is a kind, and “kinds of soul” here is most often taken to mean the parts of the soul that Book 4 distinguished (435b–441c). The earlier argument against poetry will expand to charge it with harming the balance among these parts.

In all Plato develops three theses:

  1. Poetic mimêsis, like the kind in a painting, is the imitation of appearance alone and its products rank far below truth. (596e–602c)
  2. Therefore poetic mimêsis corrupts the soul, weakening the rational impulse's control over the person's other drives and desires. (602c–608b)
  3. It should therefore be banned from the good city.

The argument supporting (1) seeks to spell out how badly poetry and painting fare at grasping and communicating knowledge. Partly because they do so badly, but also for other reasons, mimetic art forms bring moral and psychological ill effects (2).

The words “imitation of appearance” follow from Plato's three-way differentiation:

  1. Form (of bed, of table) made by a god.
  2. Individual things (beds, tables) made by humans.
  3. Paintings (of bed or table) made by imitators.

The carpenter works with eyes aiming “toward [pros]” the Form (596b)—significantly not with eyes on the Form—and the individual bed is something less than the Form. This shortcoming is an honest failing after a decent try. No illegitimate act brought the carpentered object into existence. If the Form is an object of knowledge, human creators at least possess true opinion (601e). Without being philosophers, they stand in a legitimate relationship to philosophical knowledge.

Thus category II is not a domain of imitation. The table in front of you though modeled on the Form of table does not mimic that Form; so the table in a painting is not—to use the words with which people misquote Book 10—the “imitation of an imitation.” Nevertheless Plato's phrase “imitation of appearance” does characterize artistic mimêsis as a compounded problem. Imitation intensifies a weakness present in existing objects; it not only fails but fails twice, or doubly. If categories I and II reflect knowledge and true opinion, respectively, category III is born of ignorance or even something worse.

But if painting and other visual arts exemplify an ill that lies upon the land, they are never Plato's main targets. He wants the mimêsis in painting to reveal by analogy something about mimêsis in poetry. Now he has to justify his analogy, so Socrates launches into a condemnation of tragedy and its “father” Homer. Homer was ignorant, never taught a useful thing to anyone (599b–600e). This apparent ad hominem attack is designed to show that poetry too imitates appearance. For that purpose it suffices to show that one esteemed poet writes without knowledge. If great poetry can come out of someone ignorant, then poetry as such must not require knowledge. Even if ignorance is not necessary for the composition of poetry Homer's example demonstrates that the two are compatible.

Sometimes a modern reader sets the Republic down objecting, “But someone can be ignorant and still write great poetry!” Plato nods in glum agreement. That is exactly the problem. What good will come of an activity that can not only be attempted ignorantly but even succeeded at in ignorance? Poetry too imitates no more than appearance.

It remains for Plato to argue that poetry therefore harms the soul. Poetry's illusions fortify the soul's worst part and turn it against the best. The first stretch of this argument (602c–603b) uses theoretical language—the Republic's psychological theory—while the second (603b–608b) appeals to generally observable phenomena surrounding the performances of tragedies.

Socrates returns to his analogy between poetry and painting. If you are partly taken in by a painting's tricked-up table apparition but you partly spot the falseness of it, which part of you does what? The soul's rational impulse must be the part that knows the table-painting is not a real table. But Book 4 established one fundamental principle: When the soul inclines in more than one direction, that conflict represents the work of more than one faculty or part of the soul (436b). So being taken in by an optical or artistic illusion must be the activity of some part of the soul that is not identical with reason.

Invoking Book 4's psychological theory integrates the critique of poetry of Book 10 into the Republic's overarching argument. The dialogue identifies justice with a balance among reason, the high-spiritedness that Plato calls thumos or to thumoeides, and the desires collectively known as epithumiai. This controlled balance is the happiest state available for human souls as well as the most moral; if imitation undoes the soul's justice, it brings both vice and misery.

Plato does not specify the irrational part in question in this passage, and indeed thinking the sun is the size of your hand does not feel like either anger overwhelming you or desires tempting. What do illusions have to do with irrationality of motive?

Part of the answer comes from Books 8–9, which sketch five character types—again eidê of soul—graded from best to worst. The pleasures of the lowest soul are illusory; one reason is that the body delights not in true beings but in “idols [eidôlois] of true pleasure” and painted images, eskiagraphêmenais (586b). Skiagraphia was an impressionistic manner of painting that juxtaposed contrasting hues to create illusionistic shadow and intensify color (Demand 1975), and Plato disapproved (Parmenides 165c–d, Phaedo 69b). Thus where Book 9 examines the desirous part of the soul and finds its objects to be mere idols, Book 10 determines mimêsis to be a show of mere idols and concludes that it keeps company with the soul's desirous part.

Notice the terminology in Book 9. The tyrant is “at the third remove” from the oligarch, his pleasure “a third-place idol [tritôi eidôlôi]” compared to the truth, alêtheia, of the oligarchic soul's pleasure (587c). The oligarch's soul in turn stands third below the “kingly man [tou basilikou]” (587d). Only ten pages later Book 10 will call the imitator “third from the king [basileôs] and from the truth [alêtheias]” (597e; cf. 602c). The language in Book 10 brings Book 9's equation of base pleasures with illusory ones into its attack on art. If it can show that an art form fosters interest in illusions it will have gone a long way toward showing that the art form keeps company with irrational desires.

But Plato commendably does not confine himself to reasoning by analogy from painting to verse. He recognizes that though analogies can illuminate a subject they also encourage lazy reasoning. Socrates proposes looking at imitative poetry on its own terms, not just as a painting made of words (603b–c). He exerts himself to show on independent grounds that poetry presents false representations of virtue, and that because of their falseness those images nourish irrational motives until all but the finest souls in the audience lose control over themselves.

An essential premise is that what Book 3 acknowledged as an exception to its critique, the imitation of virtuous and thoughtful characters, is not apt to happen. Socrates has tragedy in mind (comedy secondarily) and observes that playwrights neither know the quiet philosophical type nor profit from putting that type on stage before spectators who came to the theater to see something showily agitated (604e–605a). At one stroke Plato intensifies his condemnation of mimêsis, no longer a dangerous technique when it presents the wrong kinds of people but a technique that never presents any other kind.

Being as he is an impulsive impassioned man, the tragic hero behaves incompatibly with the dictates of reason. An illusion of virtue guides him. His son dies and he doesn't save the tears for a private moment but lets them flow publicly and at length (603e–604a). The spectators' reason is appalled; their other impulses rejoice (605c–e). Plato knows that even his upright contemporaries check their reason at the door when they enter the tragic theater. (Vincent Rama used this phrase in conversation.) They figure there is no harm in weeping along with the hero, enjoying the emotional release without the responsibility one has in real-life situations. And in this way dramatic illusion induces bad habits of indulging the passions, and the soul that had learned self-control sets about unlearning it.

Incidentally this part of the argument turns on an assumption that Plato asserts but never discusses, that mimêsis is the presentation of characters (e.g. 603c; 605a, c). Although Book 10 sometimes speaks of mimêsis in other terms (mimêsis of virtues: 600e), the argument about the encouragement of passions requires that objects of poetic representation be humans. When what are called literary works today practice what is called representation, Plato claims that they represent human beings. Character is the essence of epic and drama. (But see Halliwell 1988 for a different reading.)

Plato's emphasis on character predisposes him not to find philosophical worth in literature. A character speaks from a single point of view. Bring several characters together representing several idiosyncratic perspectives on the world and the very idea of deriving a general statement from the work becomes impossible. (Laws 719c–d elaborates upon this problem endemic to mimêsis and multiple characters.) Aristotle notably bases his appraisal of tragedy on the premise that tragedy imitates not people but actions. From his privileging of plot over character Aristotle goes on to find general statements in poetry, philosophical ones. In the process he concedes to Plato that if poetic mimêsis were indeed the mimêsis of characters it may indeed not issue in statements of epistemic merit.

2.4 Sophist and other passages

Plato's interpreters sometimes trumpet the passages in which he seems to counter the Republic's anti-poetic comments with hopeful assessments of imitation. According to the standard chronology of the dialogues (though many Plato scholars today downplay the chronological ordering), the relevant passages occur in dialogues written after the Republic. If Plato changed his views over time, these laudatory references to imitation could indicate that he ultimately disavowed the censorship of Republic 10.

The Statesman for instance calls existing constitutions mimêmata of moral truths as the philosophical legislators know those truths (297c). Such likeness-making is not treated as fraud, for its outcome remains something worthy of respect. One can say the same for scientific theories in Plato's Timaeus, whose main speaker Timaeus argues that discourse about the natural world mimics the intelligible world (47c). The Laws sees imitation in music as a potentially accurate process (668b); the hard-to-date Menexenus urges the young to imitate their elders' virtues (236e, 248e). All these passages from different angles suggest a rehabilitation for the process that Plato elsewhere demeans as mere counterfeiting.

These passages however are only references to mimêsis. What Plato says about imitation when he has set out to define and evaluate it ought to weigh more heavily than a use of the word he makes briefly. Anyway, the later dialogues do not speak as one. Plato's Sophist, a companion to the Statesman, devotes much of its length to understanding mimêsis, and the context is derogatory almost without relief.

The Sophist looks into imitation mainly in order to define what a Sophist is. But the Sophist—whom the main speaker here, the Eleatic Stranger, calls an imitator (mimêtês) and sorcerer (goêtês) (235a)—is not far removed from the deceiving poet. And although the Sophist's theory of imitation diverges from the one in Republic 10 in some details, similarities between the two passages preponderate. Like the Republic the Sophist characterizes imitation mockingly as the creation of a whole world, and accuses imitation of misleading the unwary (234b–c), even if it more optimistically predicts that people grow up to see through false likenesses (234d). Again as in Republic 10 imitation is contrasted with a god's work—except that in the Sophist gods make all living things (265c–d) and also images, eidôla (266a): dreams, shadows, reflections.

Most importantly, the representation that Plato charges the Sophist with is fraudulent. It is the kind that makes not an honest likeness (eikasia) but an illusory image, a phantasma (235d–236b). In drawing the distinction between these kinds of representations the Sophist does strike a conciliatory tone not found in Republic 10, for it seems that a branch of the mimetic profession retains the power it has in the Laws and Timaeus to produce a reliable likeness of an object. But the consolation proves fleeting. Reliable imitation plays no role in a definition of Sophists, would presumably play no role in talk of poets either, and seems to make its appearance here only for the purpose of being shuffled offstage as the excluded mimêsis, that which the imitation being talked about is not.

The Sophist decisively marginalizes positive imitation when it takes up mimêsis again and fine-grains the earlier distinction. The Stranger subdivides the production of illusions further to identify a species in which imitators use their own voices and bodies: “This part is called imitation [mimêsis]” (267a). He recognizes that he has appropriated the general word for the specific act of enacting false images. “Let's designate this to be what we call the imitative art [mimêtikon]”; everything else in the large genus can go by some other name (267a).

Narrowing the process down to impersonation should make clear that Plato finds a Sophist's imitativeness much like a poet's. Moreover this development neutralizes the suggestions that mimêsis has its good side. The imitative technê will have many manifestations, including those legitimate practices that the Statesman and other dialogues refer to, but the real work of mimêsis, the one that matters and is worth defining and applies to dominant art forms, is mendacious impersonation. Just as Republic 3's taxonomy left the imitation it defined looking like a freakish variety of narration, this use of a word both generically and specially excludes good imitation as the exception and the problem case. Really the art of mimêsis is a bad and lying art.

After all, as the Stranger says only a little later, there is a shortage of names for types of mimêsis. The ancients did not work hard enough making all relevant philosophical distinctions (267d). It is as if Plato were saying: “Colloquial language being what it is, I will sometimes use mimêsis in the broader sense that contains epistemically sound practices, even though the core sense of the word is pejorative.”

Whether Plato should be permitted to juggle words' meanings is another question. His quest to condemn imitation leaves him open to criticism. But he does not consciously change his theory in the direction of imitation positively understood.

2.5 Closing assessment

The Sophist's divine copy-making invites another worry. The images that gods produce in their kind of imitation are shadows and reflections, and the products of truly bad mimêsis are to be something worse than that. But what could be metaphysically lower than a shadow? Coming back to the Republic one finds shadows and reflections occupying the bottom-most domain of the Divided Line (510a). Where could a poetic imitation go, then?

One comes to the same worry even remaining with the Republic's terms. Shadows and reflections belong in the category of near-ignorance. Imitation works an effect worse than ignorance, not merely teaching nothing but engendering a positive preference for ignorance over knowledge. Plato often observes that the ignorant prefer to remain as they are (Symposium 204a), but this perverse turn toward ignorance is different. Why would anyone choose to know less? That theoretical question is a practical one. If mimêsis poisons the soul, why do so many people swallow it? Plato's attack on poetry saddles him with an aesthetic problem of evil.

Republic 10 shows signs of addressing the problem with language of magic. Socrates begins by promising that insight into mimêsis operates as a countercharm (595b). People need countercharms because the imitator is a “sorcerer [goêtês]” and thereby a deceiver (598d; cf. 602d). The Republic has already said that sorcery robs people of knowledge (413b–c). Finally the catalog of Homer's kinds of ignorance ends by saying his poetry casts a spell (601b). This noun kêlêsis can mean “appeal” but also something explicitly magical, a spell or conjuration. Poetry works magically to draw in the audience that it then degrades.

References to magic serve poorly as explanations but they acknowledge the need for explanation. Plato sees that some power must be drawing people to give up both knowledge and the taste for knowledge. But what is striking about the deus ex machina that explains poetry's attractiveness is what it does not say. In other dialogues the magic of poetry is attributed to one version or another of divine inspiration. Odd that the Republic makes no reference to such a phenomenon when dialogues as different as the Apology and the Laws mention its appearances, the Ion and the Phaedrus spell out how it works. Odder still, Plato almost never cites both imitation and divine inspiration together (the lone exception being Laws 719c), as if to say that the two are incompatible accounts of poetry. Will inspiration play a role ancillary to imitation, or do the two approaches to poetry finally have nothing to do with one another?

3. Divine Inspiration

In simplest form “inspiration” names the claim that poets are not in control of their own writing. At lucky moments a god takes them over and brings value to the poem that it could not have had otherwise.

When inspiration is described in those terms no one would contradict it. The idea is far from original with Plato; within Greek culture alone there are Homer and Hesiod, who begin their great works asking a Muse to “speak into” them. In this case, by contrast with that of imitation, Plato takes over an idea that has a cultural and specifically a religious meaning before him, and finds a new use for the idea (Ledbetter 2003, Murray 1981, Tigerstedt 1970).

Platonic characters mention inspiration in dialogues as far apart—in date of composition; in style, length, content—as the Apology and the Laws, though for different purposes. Socrates on trial, for instance, tells of his frustrated effort to learn from poets. Their verses seemed excellent but the authors had nothing to say about them (Apology 22b). Socrates concludes that poets work instinctively and while inspired, enthousiazontes, as prophets and soothsayers also do (theomanteis, chrêsmôidoi), as opposed to writing on the basis of sophia (22c). The opposition between wisdom and inspiration does not necessarily condemn poets: He says they write by some nature (phusei tini), as if inspiration were a normally occurring human instinct.

For its part Laws 719c links the effects of inspiration to the nature of drama and its multiple perspectives:

When the poet sits on the Muse's tripod [en tôi tripodi tês Mousês] he is not in his right mind [emphrôn] but ready to flow like a fountain; and because his profession [technê] is that of imitation [mimêseôs], then in creating people [anthrôpous] who are set against one another he is compelled to contradict himself frequently, and he does not know [oiden] whether these or the other thing of what he says are true [alêthê]. But it is not for a lawmaker to make two statements about a single topic in a law. (719c–d)

As in the Apology, inspiration means the poet has no truths to transmit. The coming of the god's power is the departure of the poet's. Lawmakers work differently; and for this dialogue to contrast the origin of laws with inspiration—this dialogue devoted to discovering the best laws for cities—shows how lowly it esteems inspiration.

But then the passage puts the poet on a tripod, symbol of Apollo's priestesses. Whatever brings a poet to write verse also brings divine wisdom out of priestesses; and Plato regularly defers to the authority of oracles. Even supposing that talk of inspiration denies individual control and credit to the poet, the priestess shows that credit and control are not all that matters. She is at her best when her mind intrudes least on what she is saying. Her pronouncements have the prestige they do, not despite her loss of control, but because of it.

Another passage in the Laws says as much when it attributes even reliable historical information to poets writing under the influence of the Muses and Graces (682a). For that matter the Meno makes inspiration its defining example of ignorant truth-speaking. Politicians are just like “prophets and soothsayers [chrêsmôidoi, theomanteis].” All three, “when inspired [enthousiôntes], speak truly [alêthê] about many things, but do not know what they are talking about” (99c). Removing all doubt about the origin of that truth, Socrates calls chrêsmôidous and manteis and also “every kind of poet” divine for this habit of speaking so well without possessing knowledge (99c–d).

Plato seems to be going out of his way to affirm 1) that inspiration is really divine in origin, and 2) that this divine action that gives rise to poetry guarantees value in the result. It may remain the case that the poet knows nothing. But something good must come of an inspiration shared by poets and priestesses, and often enough that good is a truth.

3.1 Ion

Plato's shortest dialogue, the Ion is the only one that most readers would call a work of aesthetics. It does not address poetry alone inasmuch as the character Ion is a performer and interpreter of Homer's poems, not a poet himself. For that matter most of what are classed as arts today—painting, sculpture, instrumental and vocal music—appear here as activities for which the problems of irrationality and knowledge signally fail to arise (532e–533c; for painting as technê see Gorgias 448c, Protagoras 312d). Nevertheless the Ion belongs in aesthetics by virtue of its focus on artistic inspiration, and the question it provokes of what inspiration implies about poetry's merits.

As a rhapsode Ion travels from one Greek city to another reciting and explicating episodes from Homer. Between the dramatically vigorous recitation and the subsequent interpretation, these performances offered much latitude for displays of talent, and Ion's talent has just won him first prize at a contest in Epidaurus.

His conversation with Socrates falls into three parts, covering idiosyncrasy (530a–533c), inspiration (533c–536d), and ignorance (536d–542b). The first and third sections both support the claims of the second. The idiosyncrasy in Ion's attachment to Homer shows that Homer, and Ion because of him, function thanks to a divine visitation. Because Ion resists accepting a claim according to which he is deranged in his performances, Socrates then produces a fall-back argument. Homer knows none of the important things that Ion claims him to know. Homer taught Ion everything he knows, so Homer's global ignorance implies Ion's ignorance too; and when forced to choose between divine inspiration and a very drab brand of knowing nothing Ion agrees to be called inspired.

This is to say that although poets' ignorance is indeed a fact for Plato, it is a fact in need of interpretation. Whether it means as in the Ion that gods inspire poetry, or as in Republic 10 that imitative poetry imitates appearance alone, ignorance matters less than the implications drawn from it.

The idiosyncrasy treated in this dialogue's opening section, by comparison, is for Plato irrational on its face. Idiosyncrasy emerges as soon as Socrates begins to ask Ion about his technê (530b). That essential Platonic word technê has been mistranslated “art” or “craft.” “Skill” is not bad; but perhaps a technê most resembles a profession in denoting both a paying occupation and the possession of expertise. In Ion's case Socrates specifies that the expertise for a rhapsode includes the ability to interpret poetry (530c). Ion rates himself superior at that task to all his competitors but admits—even insists—that he can only interpret Homer (531a). Even though Homer and other poets sometimes speak of the same subjects, Ion has nothing to say about those others. He confesses this without shame or apology, as if the difference in his responses reflected on the poets instead of on his talents. Something in Homer makes him eloquent, and other poets lack that quality.

Socrates argues that one who knows a field knows it whole (531e–532a). This denial of the knowledge of particulars in their particularity also appears at Charmides 166e; Phaedo 97d; Republic 334a, 409d. It is not that what is known about an individual thing cannot transfer to other things of the same kind; rather that treating an object as unique means knowing those qualities of it that do not transfer, knowing them as nontransferable qualities. This attitude toward particulars qua particulars is an obstacle to every kind of theoretical expertise.

It may well be that what Ion understands about Homer also holds true of Hesiod. But Ion himself does not make the move of generalizing from one to many poets, and such generalization is the move of the professional. Diotima's speech in the Symposium supplies a useful comparison. She differentiates between love that clings to particular objects and a philosophical erôs that escapes its attachment to particulars and pursues general knowledge (210b). Ion's investment in Homer, like the lover's lowest grade of attachment, marks an unwillingness to move toward understanding. And so Ion presents Socrates with a conundrum. Although the man's love for Homer prohibits him from possessing expertise, Socrates recognizes how well Ion performs at his job. What is success minus skill? Socrates needs to diagnose Ion by means of some positive trait he possesses, not merely by the absence of knowledge.

Socrates therefore speaks of both poets and those they inspire as entheous, inspired, and elaborates an analogy. Picture an iron ring hanging from a magnet and magnetized so that a second ring hangs from the first and another ring from the second. Magnets are Muses, the rings attached to them poets, the second rings the poets' interpreters, third the rhapsodes' audiences.

Plato's image captures the transferability of charisma. By being made of iron each ring can take on the charge that holds it. But magnetism resides in the magnet, not in the temporarily magnetized rings. No ring is itself the source of the next ring's attachment to it. Homer analogously draws poetic power from his Muse and attracts a rhapsode by means of borrowed power. Ion charged with Music energy collects enthusiastic fans, as if to his own person and as if by technê—only as if. Socrates can use this analogy to describe poets and rhapsodes as charismatic without giving them credit for the charisma.

He takes a further step to pit inspiration against technê and even against reason. “Epic poets who are good at all are never masters of their subject. They are inspired and possessed [entheoi ontes kai katechomenoi]” (533a). Now inspiration means additionally that poets are irrational. This superadded irrationality explains why Ion rejects Socrates' proposal. He is not unhinged during his performances; not katechomenos kai mainomenos, possessed and maddened (536d). Inspiration has taken on the feature of madness and the madness in it is what Ion tries to reject.

What went wrong? The image of rings and magnets is more subversive than it appeared. While the analogy rests transparently on one feature of magnetism, the transfer of attraction, it smuggles in a second detail. Socrates has the iron rings hanging in straight lines or branches: Although each ring may well have more than a single other ring dependent upon it, no ring hangs from more than one ring. But actual magnetized rings touch and cross in other ways, all the rings clumped against the magnet, or one ring clinging to two or three above it. Why does Socrates keep the strings of rings so orderly?

Here is one suggestion. Keeping Homer clung only to his Muse, Ion only to Homer, preserves the idiosyncrasy that had let Socrates deny expertise to Ion. After all, the magnet and rings by themselves might describe how genuine knowledge is transmitted. Say a Muse leads Hippocrates to diagnostic insights that he passes along to his students and they to their students and so on. That much divine help is all that the image of magnet and rings strictly implies, and no threat to a profession's understanding of itself. But no one would claim that a doctor can learn only from a single other doctor, or can treat only a unique group of adulatory patients. That constraint on medical practice would threaten its status as technê; and that is exactly the constraint added by the array of rings as Socrates describes it.

Analogies always introduce new traits into the thing being described. That is in the nature of analogical thinking and no grounds for suspicion. Plato's readers should become suspicious here because the feature that slips into his figure, this orderly hanging of the rings, is neither called for by the way iron transmits magnetic force, nor neutral in effect. Inspiration as such is accounted for by the magnet's magnetism, inspired madness by the straight lines of attraction. Plato has distorted magnetism to make it mean not possession simpliciter but something more additionally irrational.

The combination of possession and madness in the Ion's version of inspiration makes it hard to decide whether the dialogue approves of inspired poetry or condemns it. As described, enthousiasmos denies Ion's professional credibility, not to mention his sanity. But then there is the matter of religion. If not traditionally pious, Plato is not the kind of irreverent writer who would ascribe an action to divinities by way of mocking it. And consider the Ion's actual example of inspired verse. Socrates cites Tynnichus, author of only one passable poem, which was a tribute to the Muses (534d). It's as if the Muses wanted to display their power, Socrates says, by proving that their intervention could elicit a good poem even from an unskilled author. If this is Socrates' specially apt and defining example of inspired poetry, then whatever else inspiration might also explain it appears particularly well suited to producing praise of the gods. And praise of the gods is the lone poetic form that Plato respects and accepts (Republic 607a).

Finally there is a version of the same problem that arose regarding the Apology and Laws, that the Ion names the soothsayer and the diviner as possessed (chrêsmôidos, mantis: 534d). Their example would already seem to justify inspiration. Add in that Socrates calls the diviner's practice a technê (538e; cf. 531b) and this dialogue seems to be implying that an activity can be both legitimately professional and the result of divine possession. So what does the charge of madness mean? The word makes Ion recoil—but what does he know about higher states of understanding? Maybe madness itself needs to be reconceived. The Ion says far from enough to settle the question. But Plato's other sustained discussion of inspiration returns to the language of madness and finds some forms of it permissible, even philosophical.

3.2 Phaedrus

In the introduction to the Phaedrus's major speech on erôs (244a–250d), Socrates defines desirous love as a species of mania, madness, in a context that comments on philosophy and poetry with an aside about mimêsis a few pages later. Although other sections of the Phaedrus are relevant to Platonic aesthetics, this is the only part directly about inspiration.

Socrates' speech begins by sorting out the category of mania. Madness comes in two general forms: the diseased state of mental dysfunction, and a divergence from ordinary rationality that a god sometimes brings (see 265a–b). Divine madness in turn takes different forms: love, Dionysian frenzy, oracular prophecy, and poetic composition (244b–245a). In all four cases the possessed or inspired person (enthousiazôn: 241e, 249e, 253a, 263d) can accomplish what is impossible for someone in a sane state. All four cases are associated with particular deities and traditionally honored.

The madness of the Phaedrus is separated from ordinary madness as the Ion's version is not, and pointedly called a good derangement. Being a god, Eros can't do anything bad (242d–e). (The Ion contains no theological pieties comparable to this claim or to similar statements in Laws, Republic, elsewhere.) The greatest blessings flow from divine mania (244a).

Not coincidentally this madness is not associated with idiosyncrasy. To account for the madness of love Socrates describes an otherworldly existence in which souls ride across the top of heaven enjoying direct visions of the Forms (247c–d). After falling into bodily existence a soul responds to beauty more easily than to any of the other qualities for which there are Forms. Accordingly it happens that a beautiful sight, like that of a lovely human form, inspires the turn toward philosophical contemplation as a just law or a self-controlled act do not. And in this arousal one grows attached to the beloved not as a unique particular but to the Form of beauty instantiated in the loved one.

Associating beauty with inspiration suggests that poetry born of (another kind of) inspiration might also have philosophical worth. But before welcoming the lost sheep Plato back to the poetry-loving fold, recognize the Phaedrus's qualifying remarks about which poetry one may now prize. It cannot be imitative. When Socrates ranks human souls depending on how much otherworldly being they saw before falling into bodily form—philosophers come in first on this ranking—the poet or other mimêtikos occupies sixth place, ahead only of manual laborers and farmers, sophists, and finally tyrants (248e). The argument only identifies one type of poem that the Muses call forth, namely the poem that “embellishes thousands of deeds of the ancients to educate [paideuei] later generations” (245a). Even in the argument against poetry that has earned him his reputation as boor and censor, Plato exempts hymns to gods and encomia of heroes from his anti-poetics (Republic 607a). Quite compatibly with this exemption the Ion specifies a hymn to the Muses as its example of inspiration and the Phaedrus describes the praise of heroes. Whenever possible Plato reserves the benefits of inspiration for the poems he does not have reason to condemn. And this restriction on which poems derive a true merit from being inspired leaves inspiration a long way from guaranteeing poetry's value.

4. Imitation, Inspiration, Beauty

Mimêsis fails in two ways. 1) It originates in appearance rather than in reality, so that judged as a being the imitation has an ignoble pedigree (Republic 603b). 2) The imitative arts direct a soul toward appearances, away from proper objects of inquiry. A mirror reflection might prompt you to look at the thing being reflected; an imitation keeps your eyes on the copy alone. In short, imitation has a base cause and baser effects.

Beauty by comparison begins in the domain of intelligible objects, since there is a Form of beauty (and no insignificant one, as Forms go). And more than any other property for which a Form exists, beauty engages the soul and draws it toward philosophical deliberation, toward thoughts of absolute beauty and even toward thoughts of other concepts.

Though Plato therefore hates to acknowledge that poems contain any beauty, he does not go so far as to call mimêsis beauty's opposite and accuse poems or paintings of ugliness. He hardly could. It is bad enough for his view that he does not account for an imitative poem's appeal; to deny the appeal would rob his account of all plausibility.

Nor can good imitation work as opposite to the poetic kind. Plato recognizes a salutary function that imitations sometimes have, even the function of drawing the mind toward knowledge. But Plato offers no more than suggestive hints about positive mimêsis. There is no account of sound imitation comparable to the attacks in the Republic. Anyway this is a constructive turn that never seems to be made available to poems. Still the idea invites a worthwhile question: Is there anything human beings can produce that would function oppositely to mimetic poetry? Inspiration is the most promising possibility, even if it is the least worked-out element of Plato's aesthetics.

Inspiration's cause is unimpeachable, for it begins in the divine realm. Is that therefore a realm of Forms? The Phaedrus comes closest to saying so, both by associating the gods with Forms (247c–e) and by rooting inspired love in recollection (251a). But this falls short of showing that the poets' mania likewise originates among objects of greater reality. Perhaps divine madness in poets traces back to the soul's disembodied vision of Forms, and perhaps not.

The Ion says less about poetry's divine origins than the Phaedrus, certainly nothing that licenses an interpreter to discover Forms within the Muse's magnetism. Laws 682a and Meno 99c–d credit the inspired condition with the production of truths, even in poetry. Neither passage describes the sorts of truths that philosophical dialectic would lead to, i.e. truths about Forms, but that might be asking too much. Let it suffice that inspiration originates in some truth.

What about the effects of inspired poetry? Could it turn a soul toward knowledge as beautiful faces do? Poetry's defenders will find scant support for that proposal. Inspired poetry has its merits but Plato rarely credits it with promoting philosophical knowledge. Indeed the Ion conceives inspiration as the cause of the worst cognitive state, for the poet's possession by the Muses is what causes the audience's attachment to that single poet. The Phaedrus does say that Muse-made poems teach future generations about the exploits of heroes. Inspired poetry at least might set a good example. But one can find good examples in verse without waiting for inspiration. Even Republic 3 allows for instances in which the young guardians imitate virtuous characters. The educational consequences of inspired poetry do not set it apart from imitative poetry, and they never include philosophical education.

A clear opposition between imitation and inspiration, or any clear relationship between them, would suggest a coherent whole that can be titled “Plato's aesthetics.” In the absence of such a relationship it is hard to attribute an aesthetic theory to Plato as one can so straightforwardly do with Aristotle.

If greater unification is possible for the elements of Plato's aesthetics, that may arrive from another direction. Religion has not yet been explored in connection with Plato's aesthetics to the degree that it should, even though a religious orientation informs what he has to say about beauty, inspiration, and imitation. He even forces divine considerations upon the subjects. Perhaps Plato's aesthetics will come together more satisfactorily within Plato's theology. The question is worth pursuing, especially now, for scholarship of recent decades has much advanced the study of Greek religion, providing unprecedented resources for an inquiry into how religious elements enter Plato's claims about beauty and art.


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