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Logic and Games

First published Fri Jul 27, 2001; substantive revision Sat Oct 16, 2004

Games between two players, of the kind where one player wins and one loses, became a familiar tool in many branches of logic during the second half of the twentieth century. Important examples are semantic games used to define truth, back-and-forth games used to compare structures, and dialogue games to express (and perhaps explain) formal proofs.

1. Games in the History of Logic

The links between logic and games go back a long way. If one thinks of a debate as a kind of game, then Aristotle already made the connection; his writings about syllogism are closely intertwined with his study of the aims and rules of debating. Aristotle's viewpoint survived into the common medieval name for logic: dialectics. In the mid twentieth century Charles Hamblin revived the link between dialogue and the rules of sound reasoning, soon after Paul Lorenzen had connected dialogue to constructive foundations of logic.

There are close links between games and teaching. Writers throughout the medieval period talk of dialogues as a way of ‘teaching’ or ‘testing’ the use of sound reasoning. We have at least two textbooks of logic from the early sixteenth century that present it as a game for an individual student, and Lewis Carroll's The Game of Logic (1887) is a more recent example in the same genre.

Mathematical game theory was founded in the early twentieth century. Although no mathematical links with logic emerged until the 1950s, it is striking how many of the early pioneers of game theory are also known for their contributions to logic: John Kemeny, J. C. C. McKinsey, John von Neumann, Willard Quine, Julia Robinson, Ernst Zermelo and others. In 1953 David Gale and Frank Stewart made fruitful connections between set theory and games. Shortly afterwards Leon Henkin suggested a way of using games to give semantics for infinitary languages.

The first half of the twentieth century was an era of increasing rigour and professionalism in logic, and to most logicians of that period the use of games in logic would probably have seemed frivolous. The intuitionist L. E. J. Brouwer expressed this attitude when he accused his opponents of causing mathematics ‘to degenerate into a game’ (as David Hilbert quoted him in 1927). Both Hermann Weyl and G. H. Hardy used the notion of games to explain Hilbert's metamathematics: mathematical proofs proceed like plays of a meaningless game, but we can stand outside the game and ask meaningful questions about it. Wittgenstein's language games provoked little response from the logicians. But in the second half of the century the centre of gravity of logical research moved from foundations to techniques, and from about 1960 games were used more and more often in logical papers.

2. Logical Games

From the point of view of game theory, the games that appear in logic are not at all typical. They normally involve just two players, they often have infinite length, the only outcomes are winning and losing, and no probabilities are attached to actions or outcomes. The barest essentials of a logical game are as follows.

There are two players. In general we can call them ∀ and ∃. The pronunciations ‘Abelard’ and ‘Eloise’ go back to the mid 1980s and usefully fix the players as male and female (though feminist logicians have asked about the propriety of this type-casting). Other names are in common use for the players in particular types of logical game.

The players play by choosing elements of a set Ω, called the domain of the game. As they choose, they build up a sequence


of elements of Ω. Infinite sequences of elements of Ω are called plays. Finite sequences of elements of Ω are called positions; they record where a play might have got to by a certain time. A function τ (the turn function or player function) takes each position a to either ∃ or ∀; if τ(a) = ∃, this means that when the game has reached a, player ∃ makes the next choice (and likewise with ∀). The game rules define two sets W and W consisting of positions and plays, with the following properties: if a position a is in W then so is any play or longer position that starts with a (and likewise with W); and no play is in both W and W. We say that player ∀ wins a play b, and that b is a win for ∀, if b is in W; if some position a that is an initial segment of b is in W, then we say that player ∀ wins already at a. (And likewise with ∃ and W.) So to summarise, a logical game is a 4-tuple (Ω, τ, W, W) with the properties just described.

We say that a logical game is total if every play is in either W or W, so that there are no draws. Unless one makes an explicit exception, logical games are always assumed to be total. (Don't confuse being total with the much stronger property of being determined — see below.)

It is only for mathematical convenience that the definition above expects the game to continue to infinity even when a player has won at some finite position; there is no interest in anything that happens after a player has won. Many logical games have the property that in every play, one of the players has already won at some finite position; games of this sort are said to be well-founded. An even stronger condition is that there is some finite number n such that in every play, one of the players has already won by the n-th position; in this case we say that the game has finite length.

A strategy for a player is a set of rules that describe exactly how that player should choose, depending on how the other player has chosen at earlier moves. Mathematically, a strategy for ∀ consists of a function which takes each position a with τ(a) = ∀ to an element b of Ω; we think of it as an instruction to ∀ to choose b when the game has reached the position a. (Likewise with a strategy for ∃.) A strategy for a player is said to be winning if that player wins every play in which he or she uses the strategy, regardless of what the other player does. At most one of the players has a winning strategy (since otherwise the players could play their winning strategies against each other, and both would win, contradicting that W and W have no plays in common). Occasionally one meets situations in which it seems that two players have winning strategies (for example in the forcing games below), but closer inspection shows that the two players are in fact playing different games.

A game is said to be determined if one or other of the players has a winning strategy. There are many examples of games that are not determined, as Gale and Stewart showed in 1953 using the axiom of choice. This discovery led to important applications of the notion of determinacy in the foundations of set theory. Gale and Stewart also proved an important theorem that bears their name: Every well-founded game is determined. It follows that every game of finite length is determined — a fact already known to Zermelo in 1913. (A more precise statement of the Gale-Stewart theorem is this. A game G is said to be closed if ∃ wins every play of G in which she hasn't lost at any finite position. The theorem states that every closed game is determined.)

In most applications of logical games, the central notion is that of a winning strategy for the player ∃. Often these strategies (or their existence) turn out to be equivalent to something of logical importance that could have been defined without using games — for example a proof. But games are felt to give a better definition because they quite literally supply some motivation: ∃ is trying to win. This raises a question that is not of much interest mathematically, but it should concern philosophers who use logical games. If we want ∃'s motivation in a game G to have any explanatory value, then we need to understand what is achieved if ∃ does win. In particular we should be able to tell a realistic story of a situation in which some agent called ∃ is trying to do something intelligible, and doing it is the same thing as winning in the game. As Richard Dawkins said, raising the corresponding question for the evolutionary games of Maynard Smith,

The whole purpose of our search … is to discover a suitable actor to play the leading role in our metaphors of purpose. We … want to say, ‘It is for the good of … ‘. Our quest in this chapter is for the right way to complete that sentence. (The Extended Phenotype, Oxford University Press, Oxford 1982, page 91.)
For future reference let us call this the Dawkins question. In many kinds of logical game it turns out to be distinctly harder to answer than the pioneers of these games realised.

Just as in classical game theory, the definition of logical games above serves as a clothes horse that we can hang other concepts onto. For example it is common to have some laws that describe what elements of Ω are available for a player to choose at a particular move. Strictly this refinement is unnecessary, because the winning strategies are not affected if we decree instead that a player who breaks the law loses immediately; but for many games this way of viewing them seems unnatural. (For example in Jaakko Hintikka's semantic games, some steps expect a player to choose an element of the structure, whereas other steps require a player to choose a formula. We may as well make it a law that the players must choose elements of these kinds.) A subtler extension is to restrict the information available to the players, so that the games are of imperfect information. Hintikka has explored this possibility in his Game-Theoretic Semantics.

3. Semantic Games

In the early 1930s Alfred Tarski proposed a definition of truth. His definition consisted of a necessary and sufficient condition for a sentence in the language of a typical formal theory to be true; his necessary and sufficient condition used only notions from syntax and set theory, together with the primitive notions of the formal theory in question. In fact Tarski defined the more general relation ‘formula φ(x1,…,xn) is true of the elements a1,…, an’; truth of a sentence is the special case where n = 0. For example the question whether
‘For all x there is y such that R(x,y)’ is true

reduces to the question whether the following holds:

For every object a the sentence ‘There is y such that R(a,y)’ is true.

This in turn reduces to:

For every object a there is an object b such that the sentence ‘R(a,b)’ is true.

In this example, that's as far as Tarski's truth definition will take us.

In the late 1950s Leon Henkin noticed that we can intuitively understand some sentences which can't be handled by Tarski's definition. Take for example the infinitely long sentence

For all x0 there is y0 such that for all x1 there is y1 such that … R(x0,y0,x1, y1,…).

Tarski's approach fails because the string of quantifiers at the beginning is infinite, and we would never reach an end of stripping them off. Instead, Henkin suggested, we should consider the game where a person ∀ chooses an object a0 for x0, then a second peson ∃ chooses an object b0 for y0, then ∀ chooses a1 for x1, ∃ chooses b1 for y1 and so on. A play of this game is a win for ∃ if and only if the infinite atomic sentence

R(a0,b0,a1, b1,…)

is true. The original sentence is true if and only if player ∃ has a winning strategy for this game. Strictly Henkin used the game only as a metaphor, and the truth condition that he proposed was that the skolemised version of the sentence is true, i.e. that there are functions f0, f1, … such that for every choice of a0, a1, a2 etc. we have

R(a0,f0 (a0),a1,f1 (a0,a1),a2, f2(a0,a1,a 2), …).

But this condition translates immediately into the language of games; the Skolem functions f0 etc. are a winning strategy for ∃, telling her how to choose in the light of earlier choices by ∀. (It came to light sometime later that C. S. Peirce had already suggested explaining the difference between ‘every’ and ‘some’ in terms of who chooses the object; for example in his second Cambridge Conference lecture of 1898.)

Soon after Henkin's work, Jaakko Hintikka added that the same idea applies with conjunctions and disjunctions. We can regard a conjunction ‘φ and ψ’ as a universally quantified statement expressing ‘Every one of the sentences φ, ψ holds’, so it should be for the player ∀ to choose one of the sentences. As Hintikka put it, to play the game Gmissing text, please informψ), ∀ chooses whether the game should proceed as G(φ) or as G(ψ). Likewise disjunctions become existentially quantified statements about sets of sentences, and they mark moves where the player ∃ chooses how the game should proceed. To bring quantifiers into the same style, he proposed that the game G(∀ x φ(x)) proceeds thus: player ∀ chooses an object and provides a name a for it, and the game proceeds as G(φ(a)). (And likewise with existential quantifiers, except that ∃ chooses.) Hintikka also made an ingenious suggestion for introducing negation. Each game G has a dual game which is the same as G except that the players ∀ and ∃ are transposed in both the rules for playing and the rules for winning. The game G(¬φ) is the dual of G(φ).

One can prove that for any first-order sentence φ, interpreted in a fixed structure A, player ∃ has a winning strategy for Hintikka's game G(φ) if and only if φ is true in A in the sense of Tarski. Two features of this proof are interesting. First, if φ is any first-order sentence then the game G(φ) has finite length, and so the Gale-Stewart theorem tells us that it is determined. We infer that ∃ has a winning strategy in exactly one of G(φ) and its dual; so she has a winning strategy in G(¬φ) if and only if she doesn't have one in G(φ). This takes care of negation. And second, if ∃ has a winning strategy for each game G(φ(a)), then after choosing one such strategy fa for each a, she can string them together into a single winning strategy for G(∀x φ(x)) (namely, ‘Wait and see what element a ∀ chooses, then play fa’). This takes care of the clause for universal quantifiers; but the argument uses the axiom of choice, and in fact it is not hard to see that the equivalence of Hintikka's and Tarski's definitions of truth is equivalent to the axiom of choice (given the other axioms of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory).

It's puzzling that we have here two theories of when a sentence is true, and the theories are not equivalent if the axiom of choice fails. In fact the reason is not very deep. The axiom of choice is needed not because the Hintikka definition uses games, but because it assumes that strategies are deterministic, i.e. that they are single-valued functions giving the user no choice of options. A more natural way of translating the Tarski definition into game terms is to use nondeterministic strategies. (However, Hintikka insists that the correct explication of ‘true’ is the one using deterministic strategies, and so it is Tarski's definition that works only accidentally.)

Computer implementations of these games of Hintikka proved to be a very effective way of teaching the meanings of first-order sentences. One such package was designed by Jon Barwise and John Etchemendy at Stanford, called ‘Tarski's World’. Independently another team at the University of Omsk constructed a Russian version for use at schools for gifted children.

In the published version of his John Locke lectures at Oxford, Hintikka in 1973 raised the Dawkins question (see above) for these games. His answer was that one should look to Wittgenstein's language games, and the language games for understanding quantifiers are those which revolve around seeking and finding. In the corresponding logical games one should think of ∃ as Myself and ∀ as a hostile Nature who can never be relied on to present the object I want; so to be sure of finding it, I need a winning strategy. This story was never very convincing; the motivation of Nature is irrelevant, and nothing in the logical game corresponds to seeking. In retrospect it is a little disappointing that nobody took the trouble to look for a better story. It may be more helpful to think of a winning strategy for ∃ in G(φ) as a kind of proof (in a suitable infinitary system) that φ is true.

Later Jaakko Hintikka extended the ideas of this section in two directions, namely to natural language semantics and to games of imperfect information. The name Game-Theoretic Semantics, GTS for short, has come to be used to cover both of these extensions.

The games described in this section adapt almost trivially to many-sorted logic: for example the quantifier ∀x, where x is a variable of sort σ, is an instruction for player ∀ to choose an element of sort σ. This immediately gives us the corresponding games for second-order logic, if we think of the elements of a structure as one sort, the sets of elements as a second sort, the binary relations as a third and so on. It follows that we have, quite routinely, game rules for most generalised quantifiers too; we can find them by first translating the generalised quantifiers into second-order logic.

4. Modal Semantics

Structures of the following kind give rise to interesting games. The structure A consists of a set S of elements (which we shall call states, adding that they are often called worlds), a binary relation R on S (we shall read R as arrow), and a family P1,…, Pn of subsets of S. The two players ∀ and ∃ play a game G on A, starting at a state s which is given them, by reading a suitable logical formula φ as a set of instructions for playing and for winning.

Thus if φ is Pi, then player ∃ wins at once if s is in Pi, and otherwise player ∀ wins at once. The formulas ψmissing text, please informθ, ψmissing text, please informθ and ¬ψ behave as in Hintikka's games above; for example ψmissing text, please informθ instructs player ∀ to choose whether the game shall continue as for ψ or for θ. If the formula φ is □ψ, then player ∀ chooses an arrow from s to a state t (i.e. a state t such that the pair (s, t) is in the relation R), and the game then proceeds from the state t according to the instructions ψ. The rule for ◊ψ is the same except that player ∃ makes the choice. Finally we say that the formula φ is true at s in A if player ∃ has a winning strategy for this game based on φ and starting at s.

These games stand to modal logic in very much the same way as Hintikka's games stand to first-order logic. In particular they are one way of giving a semantics for modal logic, and they agree with the usual Kripke-type semantics. Of course there are many types and generalisations of modal logic (including closely related logics such as temporal, epistemic and dynamic logics), and so the corresponding games come in many different forms. One example of interest is the computer-theoretic logic of Matthew Hennessy and Robin Milner, used for describing the behaviour of systems; here the arrows come in more than one colour, and moving along an arrow of a particular colour represents performing a particular ‘action’ to change the state. In the related ‘logic of games’, proposed by Rohit Parikh, games that move us between the states are the subject matter rather than a way of giving a truth definition.

5. Back-and-Forth Games

In 1930 Alfred Tarski formulated the notion of two structures A and B being elementarily equivalent, i.e. that exactly the same first-order sentences are true in A as are true in B. At a conference in Princeton in 1946 he described this notion and expressed the hope that it would be possible to develop a theory of it that would be ‘as deep as the notions of isomorphism, etc. now in use’ (Hourya Sinaceur ed., "Address at the Princeton University Bicentennial Conference on Problems of Mathematics (December 17-19, 1946), by Alfred Tarski", Bulletin of Symbolic Logic 6 (2000): 1-44).

One natural part of such a theory would be a purely structural necessary and sufficient condition for two structures to be elementarily equivalent. Roland Fraïssé, a French-Algerian, was the first to find a usable necessary and sufficient condition. It was rediscovered a few years later by the Kazak logician A. D. Taimanov, and it was reformulated in terms of games by the Polish logician Andrzej Ehrenfeucht. The games are now known as Ehrenfeucht-Fraïssé games, or sometimes as back-and-forth games. They have turned out to be one of the most versatile ideas in twentieth-century logic. They adapt fruitfully to a wide range of logics and structures.

In a back-and-forth game there are two structures A and B, and two players who are commonly called Spoiler and Duplicator. (The name is due to Joel Spencer in the early 1990s. More recently Neil Immerman suggested Samson and Delilah, using the same initials; this places Spoiler as the male player ∀ and Duplicator as the female ∃.) Each step in the game consists of a move of Spoiler, followed by a move of Duplicator. Spoiler chooses an element of one of the two structures, and Duplicator must then choose an element of the other structure. So after n steps, two sequences have been chosen, one from A and one from B:

(a0,…,an-1;b 0,…,bn-1).

This position is a win for Spoiler if and only if some atomic formula (of one of the forms ‘R(v0,…,vk-1)’ or ‘F(v0,…,vk-1) = vk’ or ‘v0=v1’, or one of these with different variables) is satisfied by (a0,…,an-1) in A but not by (b0,…,bn-1) in B, or vice versa. The condition for Duplicator to win is different in different forms of the game. In the simplest form, EF(A,B), a play is a win for Duplicator if and only if no initial part of it is a win for Spoiler (i.e. she wins if she hasn't lost by any finite stage). For each natural number m there is a game EFm(A,B); in this game Duplicator wins after m steps provided she has not yet lost. All these games are determined, by the Gale-Stewart Theorem. The two structures A and B are said to be back-and-forth equivalent if Duplicator has a winning strategy for EF(A,B), and m-equivalent if she has a winning strategy for EFm(A,B).

One can prove that if A and B are m-equivalent for every natural number m, then they are elementarily equivalent. On the other hand a winning strategy for Spoiler in EFm(A,B) can be converted into a first-order sentence that is true in exactly one of A and B, and in which the nesting of quantifier scopes has at most m levels. So we have our necessary and sufficient condition for elementary equivalence, and a bit more besides.

If A and B are back-and-forth equivalent, then certainly they are elementarily equivalent; but in fact back-and-forth equivalence turns out to be the same as elementary equivalence in an infinitary logic which is much more expressive than first-order logic. There are many adjustments of the game that give other kinds of equivalence. For example Barwise, Immerman and Bruno Poizat independently described a game in which the two players have exactly p numbered pebbles each; each player has to label his or her choices with a pebble, and the two choices in the same step must be labelled with pebbles carrying the same number. As the game proceeds, the players will run out of pebbles and so they will have to re-use pebbles that were already used. The condition for Spoiler to win at a position (and all subsequent positions) is the same as before, except that only the elements carrying labels at that position count. The existence of a winning strategy for Duplicator in this game means that the two structures agree for sentences which use at most p variables (allowing these variables to occur any number of times).

The theory behind back-and-forth games uses very few assumptions about the logic in question. As a result, these games are one of the few model-theoretic techniques that apply as well to finite structures as they do to infinite ones, and this makes them one of the cornerstones of theoretical computer science. One can use them to measure the expressive strength of formal languages, for example database query languages. A typical result might say, for example, that a certain language can't distinguish between ‘even’ and ‘odd’; we would prove this by finding, for each level n of complexity of formulas of the language, a pair of finite structures for which Duplicator has a winning strategy in the back-and-forth game of level n, but one of the structures has an even number of elements and the other has an odd number. Semanticists of natural languages have found back-and-forth games useful for comparing the expressive powers of quantifiers.

There is also a kind of back-and-forth game that corresponds to our modal semantics above in the same way as Ehrenfeucht-Fraïssé games correspond to Hintikka's game semantics for first-order logic. The players start with a state s in the structure A and a state t in the structure B. Spoiler and Duplicator move alternately, as before. Each time he moves, Spoiler chooses whether to move in A or in B, and then Duplicator must move in the other structure. A move is always made by going forwards along an arrow from the current state. If between them the two players have just moved to a state s’ in A and a state t’ in B, and some predicate Pi holds at just one of s’ and t’, then Duplicator loses at once. Also she loses if there are no available arrows for her to move along; but if Spoiler finds there are no available arrows for him to move along in either structure, then Duplicator wins. If the two players play this game with given starting states s in A and t in B, and both structures have just finitely many states, then one can show that Duplicator has a winning strategy if and only if the same modal sentences are true at s in A as are true at t in B.

There are many generalisations of this result, some of them involving the following notion. Let Z be a binary relation which relates states of A to states of B. Then we call Z a bisimulation between A and B if Duplicator can use Z as a nondeterministic winning strategy in the back-and-forth game between A and B where the first pair of moves of the two players is to choose their starting states. In computer science the notion of a bisimulation is crucial for the understanding of A and B as systems; it expresses that the two systems interact with their environment in the same way as each other, step for step. But a little before the computer scientists introduced the notion, essentially the same concept appeared in Johan van Benthem's PhD thesis on the semantics of modal logic (1976).

6. Games of dialogue, communication and computation

Several medieval texts describe a form of debate called obligationes. There were two disputants, Opponens and Respondens. At the beginning of a session, the disputants would agree on a ‘positum’, typically a false statement. The job of Respondens was to give rational answers to questions from Opponens, assuming the truth of the positum; above all he had to avoid contradicting himself unnecessarily. The job of Opponens was to try to force Respondens into contradictions. So we broadly know the answer to the Dawkins question, but we don't know the game rules! The textbooks do describe several rules that the disputants should follow. But these rules are not stipulated rules of the game; they are guidelines which the textbooks derive from principles of sound reasoning with the aid of examples. (Paul of Venice justifies one rule by the practice of ‘great logicians, philosophers, geometers and theologians’.) In particular it was open to a teacher of obligationes to discover new rules. This open-endedness implies that obligationes are not logical games in our sense. Nevertheless these debates did inspire one important line of modern research in logical games.

Imagine ∃ taking an oral examination in proof theory. The examiner gives her a sentence and invites her to start proving it. If the sentence has the form

φ missing text, please inform ψ

then she is entitled to choose one of the sentences and say ‘OK, I'll prove this one’. (In fact if the examiner is an intuitionist, he may insist that she choose one of the sentences to prove.) On the other hand if the sentence is

φ missing text, please inform ψ

then the examiner, being an examiner, might well choose one of the conjuncts himself and invite her to prove that one. If she knows how to prove the conjunction then she certainly knows how to prove the conjunct.

The case of φ → ψ is a little subtler. She will probably want to start by assuming φ in order to deduce ψ; but there is some risk of confusion because the sentences that she has written down so far are all of them things to be proved, and φ is not a thing to be proved. The examiner can help her by saying ‘I'll assume φ, and let's see if you can get to φ from there’. At this point there is a chance that she sees a way of getting to φ by deducing a contradiction from ψ; so she may turn the tables on the examiner and invite him to show that his assumption is consistent, with a view to proving that it isn't. The symmetry is not perfect: he was asking her to show that a sentence is true everywhere, while she is inviting him to show that a sentence is true somewhere. Nevertheless we can see a sort of duality.

Ideas of this kind lie behind the dialectical games of Paul Lorenzen. He showed that with a certain amount of pushing and shoving, one can write rules for the game which have the property that ∃ has a winning strategy if and only if the sentence that she is presented with at the beginning is a theorem of intuitionistic logic. In a gesture towards medieval debates, he called ∃ the Proponent and the other player the Opponent. Almost as in the medieval obligationes, the Opponent wins by driving the Proponent to a point where the only moves available to her are blatant self-contradictions.

Lorenzen claimed that the rules of his games could be justified on a pre-logical basis, and so they formed a foundation for logic. Unfortunately any ‘justification’ involves a convincing answer to the Dawkins question, and this Lorenzen never provided. For example he spoke of moves as ‘attacks’, even when (like the examiner's choice at φ missing text, please inform ψ above) they look more like help than hostility. To repair Lorenzen's omission, one certainly needs to distinguish between different stances that a person might take in an argument: stating, assuming, conceding, querying, attacking, committing oneself. Whether it is really possible to define all these notions in a pre-logical way is a moot point. But perhaps this is unimportant. A more positive view is that this kind of refinement serves to link Lorenzen's dialogues to informal logic, and especially to the research that aims to systematise the possible structures of sound informal argument.

In any case, Lorenzen's games stand as an important paradigm of what recent proof theorists have called semantics of proofs. A semantics of proofs gives a ‘meaning’ not just to the notion of being provable, but to each separate step in a proof. It answers the question ‘What do we achieve by making this particular move in the proof?’ During the 1990s a number of workers at the logical end of computer science looked for games that would stand to linear logic and some other proof systems in the same way as Lorenzen's games stood to intuitionist logic. Andreas Blass, and then later Samson Abramsky and colleagues, gave games that corresponded to parts of linear logic, but at the time of writing we don't yet have a perfect correspondence between game and logic. This example is particularly interesting because the answer to the Dawkins question should give an intuitive interpretation of the laws of linear logic, a thing that this logic has badly needed. The games of Abramsky et al. tell a story about two interacting systems. But while he began with games in which the players politely take turns, Abramsky's more recent work allows the players to act ‘in a distributed, asynchronous fashion’, taking notice of each other only when they choose to. These games are no longer in the normal format of logical games, and their real-life interpretation raises a host of new questions.

Giorgi Japaridze has proposed a ‘computability logic’ for studying computation. Its syntax is first-order logic with some extra items reminiscent of linear logic. Its semantics is in terms of semantic games with some unusual features. For example it is not always determined which player makes the next move. The notion of strategy functions is no longer adequate for describing the players; instead Japaridze describes ways of reading the second player (player ∃ in our notation) as a kind of computing machine. Further information is on his website.

7. Other Model-theoretic Games

The logical games in this section are mathematicians' tools, but they have some conceptually interesting features.

Forcing games

Forcing games are also known to descriptive set theorists as Banach-Mazur games; see the references by Kechris or Oxtoby below for more details of the mathematical background. Model theorists use them as a way of building infinite structures with controlled properties. To sketch the idea, imagine that a countably infinite team of builders are building a house A. Each builder has his or her own task to carry out: for example to install a bath or to wallpaper the entrance hall. Each builder has infinitely many chances to enter the site and add some finite amount of material to the house; these slots for the builders are interleaved so that the whole process takes place in a sequence of steps counted by the natural numbers.

To show that the house can be built to order, we need to show that each builder separately can carry out his or her appointed task, regardless of what the other builders do. So we imagine each builder as player ∃ in a game where all the other players are lumped together as ∀, and we aim to prove that ∃ has a winning strategy for this game. When we have proved this for each builder separately, we can imagine them going to work, each with their own winning strategy. They all win their respective games and the result is one beautiful house.

More technically, the elements of the structure A are fixed in advance, say as a0, a1, a2 etc., but the properties of these elements have to be settled by the play. Each player moves by throwing in a set of atomic or negated atomic statements about the elements, subject only to the condition that the set consisting of all the statements thrown in so far must be consistent with a fixed set of axioms written down before the game. (So throwing in a negated atomic sentence ¬φ has the effect of preventing any player from adding φ at a later stage.) At the end of the joint play, the set of atomic sentences thrown in has a canonical model, and this is the structure A; there are ways of ensuring that it is a model of the fixed set of axioms. A possible property P of A is said to be enforceable if a builder who is given the task of making P true of A has a winning strategy. A central point (due essentially to Ehrenfeucht) is that the conjunction of a countably infinite set of enforceable properties is again enforceable.

The name ‘forcing’ comes from an application of related ideas by Paul Cohen to construct models of set theory in the early 1960s. Abraham Robinson adapted it to make a general method for building countable structures, and Martin Ziegler introduced the game setting. More recently Robin Hirsch and Ian Hodkinson have used related games to settle some old questions about relation algebras.

Forcing games are a healthy example to bear in mind when thinking about the Dawkins question. They remind us that in logical games it need not be helpful to think of the players as opposing each other.

Cut-and-choose games

In the traditional cut-and-choose game you take a piece of cake and cut it into two smaller pieces; then I choose one of the pieces and eat it, leaving the other one for you. This procedure is supposed to put pressure on you to cut the cake fairly. Mathematicians, not quite understanding the purpose of the exercise, insist on iterating it. Thus I make you cut the piece I chose into two, then I choose one of those two; then you cut this piece again, and so on indefinitely. Some even more unworldly mathematicians make you cut the cake into countably many pieces instead of two.

These games are important in the theory of definitions. Suppose we have a collection A of objects and a family S of properties; each property cuts A into the set of those objects that have the property and the set of those that don't. Let ∃ cut, starting with the whole set A and using a property in S as a knife; let ∀ choose one of the pieces (which are subsets of A) and give it back to ∃ to cut again, once more using a property in S; and so on. Let ∃ lose as soon as ∀ chooses an empty piece. We say that (A,S) has rank at most m if ∀ has a strategy which ensures that ∃ will lose before her m-th move. The rank of (A,S) gives valuable information about the family of subsets of A definable by properties in S.

Variations of this game, allowing a piece to be cut into infinitely many smaller pieces, are fundamental in the branch of model theory called stability theory. Broadly speaking, a theory is ‘good’ in the sense of stability theory if, whenever we take a model A of the theory and S the set of first-order formulas in one free variable with parameters from A, the structure (A,S) has ‘small’ rank. A different variation is to require that at each step, ∃ divides into two each of the pieces that have survived from earlier steps, and again she loses as soon as one of the cut fragments is empty. (In this version ∀ is redundant.) With this variation, the rank of (A,S) is called its Vapnik-Chervonenkis dimension; this notion is used in computational learning theory.

Games on the tree of two successor functions

Imagine a tree that has been built up in levels. At the bottom level there is a single root node, but a left branch and a right branch come up from it. At the next level up there are two nodes, one on each branch, and from each of these nodes a left branch and a right branch grow up. So on the next level up there are four nodes, and again the tree branches into left and right at each of these nodes. Continued to infinity, this tree is called the tree of two successor functions (namely left successor and right successor). Taking the nodes as elements and introducing two function symbols for left and right successor, we have a structure. A powerful theorem of Michael Rabin states that there is an algorithm which will tell us, for every monadic second-order sentence φ in the language appropriate for this structure, whether or not φ is true in the structure. (’Monadic second-order’ means that the logic is like first-order, except that we can also quantify over sets of elements — but not over binary relations on elements, for example.)

Rabin's theorem has any number of useful consequences. For example Dov Gabbay used it to prove the decidability of some modal logics. But Rabin's proof, using automata, was notoriously difficult to follow. Yuri Gurevich and Leo Harrington, and independently Andrei Muchnik, found much simpler proofs in which the automaton is a player in a game. This result is one of several that connect games with automata.


Logical Games in General

Semantic Games

Modal Semantics


Dialogue, Communication and Computation Games

Other Model-Theoretic Games

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

game theory | generalized quantifiers | logic: classical | logic: infinitary | logic: informal | logic: intuitionistic | logic: modal | model theory | proof theory | set theory