Personal Identity and Ethics
What justifies our holding a person morally responsible for some past action? Why am I justified in having a special prudential concern for some future persons and not others? Why do many of us think that maximizing the good within a single life is perfectly acceptable, but maximizing the good across lives is wrong? In these and other normative questions, it looks like any answer we come up with will have to make an essential reference to personal identity. So, for instance, it seems we are justified in holding X responsible for some past action only if X is identical to the person who performed that action. Further, it seems I am justified in my special concern for some future person only if he will be me. Finally, many of us think that while maximization within a life affects only one person, a metaphysical unity, maximization across lives affects many different, metaphysically distinct, persons, and so the latter is wrong insofar as it ignores this fundamental separateness of persons.
These are among the many issues relevant to an investigation into the relation between personal identity and ethics. “Ethics” here is broadly construed to be about the way(s) in which we ought to live our lives, and so it includes both self-regarding and other-regarding practical concerns. Among the self-regarding concerns for which personal identity is relevant are those about the nature and grounds of survival and immortality, rational anticipation, and self-concern. Among the other-regarding concerns for which personal identity is relevant are those about the nature and grounds of moral responsibility, compensation, interpersonal moral relations, advance directives, abortion and embryonic research, population ethics, and therapeutic treatments for dissociative identity disorders. The typical approach to exploring the relation between identity and ethics, then, is to start with an investigation into the nature of personal identity and see how conclusions in that metaphysical realm might apply to these sorts of practical concerns. After starting with a brief discussion of notable historical accounts of the relation, we will proceed in this fashion as well. We will thus survey the main theories of personal identity on offer and then see what, if anything, they might imply for several self-regarding and other-regarding ethical concerns. We will then turn to a discussion of some fundamental differences in methodology in the debate.
- 1. Historical Highlights of the Relation
- 2. Contemporary Accounts of Personal Identity
- 3. Prudential and Moral Units
- 4. Identity and Normative Ethics
- 5. Identity and Moral Responsibility
- 6. Identity and Applied Ethics
- 7. Methodological Alternatives
- 8. Conclusion
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- Related Entries
For the most part, the philosophical history of the relation between identity and ethics up until the 17th Century is about the relation between identity and self-regarding practical concerns. Plato is a prime example. He held in the Phaedo that I (and all persons) will survive the death and destruction of my body insofar as what I essentially am is a simple, immaterial soul, something whose own essence is being alive. This yields the direct implication that, insofar as I will survive the death of my body, I am justified in anticipating post-mortem experiences. Lucretius, on the other hand, while also focused solely on the relation between identity and prudential concerns, denied the Platonic view that I would be justified in post-mortem anticipation, simply because "if any feeling remains in mind or spirit after it has been torn from body, that is nothing to us, who are brought into being by the wedlock of body and spirit, conjoined and coalesced" (Lucretius 1951, 121). In other words, I am essentially a union of body and soul, and so even if my soul lives on, and even if it is capable of having experiences, I am not justified in anticipating them given that my body — an essential component of me — will have disintegrated. Once again, though, identity is thought to be what grounds prudential concern: the difference between Lucretius and Plato is only over what identity consists in (although for a contrasting interpretation of Lucretius, see Martin and Barresi 2003, 10).
It was not until John Locke that there was an explicit attempt to connect personal identity with broader ethical concerns. Locke famously called “person” a forensic term, “appropriating actions and their merit; and so belongs only to intelligent agents capable of a law, and happiness, and misery” (Locke 1694, 50-51). This means, then, that an account of the identity of persons across time will have forensic — normative — implications. And so it does.
Locke's account of personal identity appealed to what seems a crucial condition of moral agency, namely, self-reflective consciousness. On his view, then, a person — a moral agent — Y at t2 is identical to a person X at t1 just in case Y's consciousness “can be extended backwards” to X (Ibid., 39), and this is typically taken to mean that Y remembers X's thoughts and experiences. This is what we might call a relational account of identity, for it maintains that identity is preserved between two person-stages in virtue of some relation(s) between them, where such relations might be psychological or physical. Locke thus rejected what we might call a substance-based view of identity, which maintains that identity is preserved between two person-stages in virtue of their sharing one and the same substance.
Now once we have Locke's relational account of identity in hand, we can see what implications it will have for various normative issues. Start with prudential rationality. On Locke's view, I am appropriately concerned, both for the past stage of myself to whom my consciousness extends, but also to some future person — me — to whom my consciousness will extend. This is the mechanism by which I would be justified, for example, in anticipating the afterlife, for “at the resurrection” there will be someone to whom my present consciousness extends, and this person will be me even though he might have a very different body than I have now (Ibid., 44). It is unimportant to me, on this view, what substance (body or soul) I find my consciousness — myself — attached to. If, for example, my little finger were cut off and my consciousness traveled with it, “that would be the same self which was concerned for the whole body yesterday, as making part of itself, whose actions then it cannot but admit as its own now” (Ibid., 46).
It is this sort of remark — about my ownership of certain actions — that yields a connection between identity and moral responsibility, for one is justifiably held accountable only for those actions performed by a self to whom one's present consciousness extends, that is, it is only for those actions I remember performing that I can justifiably be held morally responsible. As Locke puts it, if I am punished for the actions of a self whose thoughts and experiences I do not remember, “what difference is there between that punishment, and being created miserable?” (Ibid., 51) Thus, on the Day of Judgment, “The sentence shall be justified by the consciousness all persons shall have, that they themselves, in what bodies soever they appear, or what substances soever that consciousness adheres to, are the same that committed those actions, and deserve that punishment for them” (Ibid.).
The key for Locke, regarding both prudence and moral responsibility, is that what grounds the various patterns of concern is the identity relation, a relation uniquely unifying temporally distinct person-stages via consciousness. And it was because Locke prized apart personal identity from biological identity, and any other sort of substance-based identity, that later philosophers like Joseph Butler and Thomas Reid objected to it. So, for example, Butler accuses Locke of a “wonderful mistake,” which is that he failed to recognize that the relation of consciousness presupposes identity, and thus cannot constitute it (Butler 1736, 100). In other words, I can remember only my own experiences, but it is not my memory of an experience that makes it mine; rather, I remember it only because it's already mine. So while memory can reveal my identity with some past experiencer, it does not make that experiencer me. What I am remembering, then, insists Butler, are the experiences of a substance, namely, the same substance that constitutes me now.
Similarly, Reid affirms Butler's objection and then adds a few of his own. One is that Locke's criterion implies the contradictory position that someone could both be and not be identical to some past stage, an objection illustrated by the Brave Officer Case. Suppose that as he is stealing the enemy's standard, a forty-year-old brave officer remembers stealing apples from a neighbor's orchard when he was ten, and then suppose further that when he is eighty years old, a retired general, he remembers stealing the enemy's standard as a brave officer but no longer remembers stealing the neighbor's apples. On Locke's account the general would have to be both identical to the apple-stealer (because of the transitivity of the identity relation: he's identical to the brave officer, who himself is identical to the apple-stealer) and not identical to the apple-stealer (given that he has no direct memory of the boy's experiences) (Reid 1785, 114-115).
Another objection is based precisely on the link between identity and ethics: how can identity — sameness — be based on a relation (consciousness) that changes from moment to moment? A person would never remain the same from one moment to the next, “and as the right and justice of reward and punishment are founded on personal identity, no man could be responsible for his actions” (Ibid., 117). But such an implication must be absurd. And Butler concurs, expanding the point to include considerations of self-concern:
[If Locke's view is correct,] it must follow, that it is a fallacy upon ourselves, to charge our present selves with any thing we did, or to imagine our present selves interested in any thing which befell us yesterday, or that our present self will be interested in what will befall us to-morrow; since our present self is not, in reality, the same with the self of yesterday, but another like self or person coming in its room, and mistaken for it; to which another self will succeed tomorrow (Butler 1736, 102).
Both Reid and Butler, then, wind up rejecting Locke's relational view in favor of a substance-based view of identity.
What Butler and Reid retain in common with Locke, though, is the belief that identity grounds certain of our patterns of concern, both prudential and moral. As Reid puts it, “Identity . . . is the foundation of all rights and obligations, and of accountableness, and the notion of it is fixed and precise” (Reid 1785, 112). What they disagree over is just what identity consists in. Notice, though, the methodological assumption here: a theory of identity's plausibility depends significantly on how well it accounts for our practical concerns. So if Locke's view were right, say Reid and Butler, it would require a host of radical changes to our practices of responsibility attribution and prudential deliberation. But, continues the argument, because making such changes would be crazy — we are strongly committed to the correctness of our current ways of doing things — Locke's view cannot be right. And although Locke disagrees that the implications of his view are crazy, he does agree to the basic methodology. So while he admits that he has made some suppositions “that will look strange to some readers” (Locke 1694, 51), he is also at pains to show that our practices are actually already in conformity with the implications of his view, e.g., human law emphasizes the necessity of continuous consciousness, “not punishing the mad man for the sober man's actions, nor the sober man for what the mad man did” (Ibid., 47). And this is a methodological assumption that has been retained by most theorists on identity and ethics since.
Both Butler and Reid believe Locke's view implies that no one exists beyond the present moment, i.e., that Locke's view is just the following: X at t1 is identical to Y at t2 just in case Y's consciousness is one and the same as X's consciousness. But because consciousness changes from moment to moment, X's consciousness could never be identical to Y's. Unfortunately, this is a gross misunderstanding of the theory (perhaps based on both authors' ground-level assumptions that personal identity just had to be substance-based). Instead, X and Y are, on Locke's actual view, identical just in case X and Y are related via consciousness, i.e., just in case Y remembers the thoughts and experiences of X. But if that is the view, then identity could be just as strict, fixed, and precise as both Butler and Reid seem to want, for Y could be identical to X only in case that relation obtains, no matter how strongly or weakly.
Nevertheless, even if this objection to Locke is thwarted, the others remain in force. For one thing, memory does seem to presuppose personal identity, and so cannot constitute a criterion of it. For another, identity is a transitive relation, while memory isn't, so the latter can't be a criterion of the former. Finally, there is the obvious worry that identity seems to persist through the loss of memory: it's hard to believe that I would cease to exist were I to undergo amnesia. It's for all these reasons that contemporary theorists working in the Lockean tradition have had to make significant changes to the theory to make it a viable contender for the relation between identity and ethics.
There are three very general views of personal identity that have been taken to have some relevance to ethics by contemporary theorists: psychology-based theories, biology-based theories, and narrative identity theories. We turn now to a brief discussion of these three, as well as a fourth position, that it's not the identity relation, but rather a different relation altogether, that matters for ethics. After that, we will discuss the relevance of both souls and a four-dimensionalist ontology to the issues at hand.
By far the most popular view of personal identity, until quite recently, has been a significantly amended version of Locke's relational memory criterion. To make such a view plausible, though, the three objections just detailed need to be met. Start, then, with Butler's complaint that memory presupposes identity, that I can only remember my own experiences, so memory just reveals to me my identity relation to some past experiencer and cannot constitute that relation. Following Sydney Shoemaker (1970) and Derek Parfit (1984), one can introduce a more inclusive memory relation, called quasi-memory, or q-memory, defined such that it does not presuppose identity. So I have a q-memory of some past experience just in case that experience occurred to someone and my memory of the experience was caused in the right sort of way by the experience I now remember. Regular memory, then, would just be a subset of q-memory (applying to ordinary instances when I was the person to whom the remembered experience occurred), and q-memory could be the relevant relation incorporated into the theory of identity in a way that avoids Butler's objection.
The second objection was Reid's, about transitivity of identity in the Brave Officer case. What gets Locke in trouble is that memories fade, so someone may no longer be capable of having direct memories of what is clearly his earlier life. But one may certainly have direct memories of some past stage that itself had direct memories of an earlier stage, and so on, until every stage in the life is linked by a chain of overlapping direct memories. What one can then insert into the criterion of identity across time is a continuity of direct (q-)memories, so that the retired general is the same person as the apple-stealer insofar as he directly remembers the experiences of the brave officer, who himself directly remembers the experiences of the apple-stealer. Of course, one direct memory of some past experience won't be sufficient to establish identity, it seems. Suppose I volunteered to have your memory trace of walking in Antarctica implanted in me (and I myself had never been there), and I woke up having that q-memory of walking in the bitter cold and deep snow. Surely this would not make me you, even though there is a direct memory connection between us, so theorists taking this route will talk about the need for strong memory connections, where this just consists in a significant number of such connections (Parfit 1984, 205-206, 219-223).
The third objection was that someone could persist through a loss of memory, a claim Locke's view denies. What can be done to render the Lockean view more plausible, then, is to incorporate more psychological features than just memory into the identity-preserving relation. So not only are there present-past relations of memory that are relevant to my identity, but there may also be present-future relations such as intentions fulfilled in action, or relations that persist across time such as beliefs, goals, and desires, or resemblance relations such as similarity of character.
Putting all these replies together, then, we have The Psychological Criterion of Personal Identity: X at t1 is the same person as Y at t2 if and only if X is uniquely psychologically continuous with Y, where psychological continuity consists in overlapping chains of strong psychological connectedness, itself consisting in significant numbers of direct psychological connections like memories, intentions, beliefs/goals/desires, and similarity of character (Parfit 1984, 207). We will see the meaning and importance of the “uniqueness” clause later.
This criterion of identity (and its variations) has been taken to fit particularly well with our practical concerns, both self-regarding and other-regarding. For instance, what seems to matter for self-concern and rational anticipation is that my psychological life continue. Anticipation and self-concern are psychological states or attitudes, as are their objects (my future experiences), so a theory that makes those states mine in virtue of their intrinsic relations to one another seems initially quite plausible. In addition, concerns having to do with moral responsibility are also about the relations between various psychological states — including intentions to perform actions, memories of past doings, desires and beliefs explaining actions, and so forth — and so if personal identity is a necessary condition for moral responsibility, the Psychological Criterion provides a plausible and satisfying account of that condition: I cannot be responsible for the actions of some person if I'm not the inheritor of that person's psychology.
What motivates alternative approaches to identity, then? One important problem stems from worries about our essence. For instance, I am many things, including an adult, a professor, a driver, a voter, and so forth. None of these is my essence, however, for I either did or could exist without being them. If we could identify my essence, however (and generally the essence of individuals like me), we would be able to identify the conditions for my persistence across time as well. Now often advocates of the Psychological Criterion seem to imply that personhood is my essence, that I couldn't exist without being a person, and given that personhood is a psychological matter, psychological continuity is what preserves my identity. But as Eric Olson and others have pointed out, this seems quite wrong (Olson 1997a, 1997b, DeGrazia 1999a, 1999b, Carter 1982, Snowdon 1990, Wiggins 1980). After all, just as I was once a teenager, and before that an adolescent and a child, wasn't I also an infant, and ultimately a fetus? Furthermore, suppose I were in a horrible accident and went into a permanent vegetative state (PVS). Wouldn't I then be in a PVS? If so, then if personhood necessarily involves having a certain sort of developed psychology (e.g., a psychology capable, at the least, of self-reflection), it can't be my essence; instead, being a person would be like being a child, or a teenager, something one becomes and may also outlive.
If personhood isn't my essence, then, what is? What seems the most plausible answer is that I am a biological organism, a human animal. And if this is my essence, it will also provide the conditions of my persistence across time. From this move, then, we get the Biological Criterion of Personal Identity: if X is a person at t1, and Y exists at any other time, then X=Y if and only if Y's biological organism is continuous with X's biological organism (Olson 1997b, DeGrazia 2005). Note that Y may or may not be a person, which allows that X might be one and the same as a fetus or someone in a PVS. This view is also sometimes called animalism (e.g., Noonan 1998, Olson 2003).
Consider, then, this criterion of personal (or what DeGrazia 2005 calls human) identity. While it obviously does well with the essence question, it does less well when we consider its relation to ethics. Again, it seems that when I anticipate my future experiences, what makes this rational is the fact that that future person will be the inheritor of my psychology. That he's also the inheritor of my biological organism seems irrelevant. Indeed, our reactions to certain thought experiments strongly suggest that we think rational anticipation, self-concern, moral responsibility, and the like can be justified even in the absence of biological continuity. We can see this most dramatically in considering the transplant intuition (Olson 1997b, 43-51, DeGrazia 2005, 51-54). Suppose my cerebrum were transplanted into a different living body and the resulting person turned out be exactly like me psychologically. Suppose also that my cerebrum-less organism were kept alive. What would have happened to me? Most people share the intuition that the recipient of my cerebrum would be me, simply because he would have my psychology and survival of my psychology seems to be what matters in my survival. The advocate of the Biological Criterion, however, has to maintain that I remain the cerebrum-less donor, essentially in a PVS, while the other person — the person who seems to remember my experiences, and seems to be carrying out my intentions, and seems just like me psychologically in every respect — is just a deluded imposter. But this is hard to believe. Suppose further that I had committed some crime and then donated my cerebrum in this way. The person who woke up would seem to remember my crime and anticipate enjoying getting away with it for a while, but if identity is what's necessary for responsibility, he could not be responsible for my actions, on the Biological Criterion, and so he wouldn't deserve blame or punishment for the crime. Again, this seems hard to believe. What accounts for the practical concerns we have seems to be grounded in psychological relations, and the Biological Criterion thus targets a relation for identity that is just irrelevant for those concerns (a key exception will be discussed later, however).
There are a couple of replies here. DeGrazia, for one, admits that the transplant intuition is a thorn in the side of the Biological Criterion (DeGrazia 2005, 54). But when it comes to that criterion's seemingly poor fit with our practical concerns generally, he suggests that, “in the world as we know it,” there's much less of a problem than we might think (DeGrazia 2005, 60-61). After all, in nearly all everyday cases, a necessary condition for the psychological continuity grounding our practical concerns is biological continuity. So if the grounding for our practical concerns requires psychological continuity, but psychological continuity (ordinarily) presupposes biological continuity, then the grounding for our practical concerns (ordinarily) requires biological continuity as well.
This reply, however, seems to overlook the original motivation here, which was to find a somewhat closer relation between identity and our practical concerns than this. So while biological continuity may track the patterns of ethical concerns, it doesn't provide any real explanation for them. It may be rational for me to anticipate only the experiences of my biological continuers, for instance, but it won't be in virtue of my biological continuity with them that it's rational to do so; rather, it seems rational only in virtue of the psychological relations they are expected to bear to me. And so one might be tempted to reject the Biological Criterion of identity because of this poor explanatory fit with our practical concerns.
Nevertheless, there is another reply available for the advocate of the Biological Criterion, namely, to deny that personal identity has this purported fit with our practical concerns at all. Instead, while biological continuity would preserve our identity across time, psychological continuity would be the relation grounding our practical concerns. This move could still preserve the thought that identity has an impact for ethics, just not the one we thought. As Olson, puts it, if it's right that “the relations of practical concerns that typically go along with our identity through time are closely connected with psychological continuity …, then the Biological Approach does have an interesting ethical consequence, namely that those practical relations are not necessarily connected with numerical identity” (Olson 1997b, 70). Obviously, this would be very surprising for theorists like Butler, Reid, and even Locke to hear, but if we had overwhelming metaphysical reasons to adopt the Biological Criterion, it could well be true.
Thus far we have been assuming that the criterion of personal identity relevant to our practical concerns will answer to what Schechtman 1996 calls a reidentification question: what are the conditions under which a person at one point in time is properly reidentified at another point in time? Answering this question calls for a criterion of numerical identity across time, a criterion of what makes something one and the same thing as itself at different times. But according to Schechtman, what is actually more appropriate to finding the relation between identity and ethics is an attempt to answer the characterization question: what are the conditions under which various psychological characteristics, experiences, and actions are properly attributable to some person?
One reason to turn to this question may stem from recognizing the difficulties various theories of numerical identity run into, both metaphysically and in terms of fitting with our practical concerns (Schechtman 1996, 26-70). But another may be the natural fit between the characterization question and our practical concerns. So in searching for an account of the rationality of anticipation, we seem to be asking, “What makes those expected experiences mine?” Or in searching for an account of the special concern we have only for ourselves, we seem to be asking, “What makes those future states I'm specially concerned about mine?” And the same seems true of responsibility and compensation: “What makes those actions for which I'm responsible, or those burdens for which I'm to be compensated, mine?” And in each case, what makes some feature mine may actually be making reference to a non-numerical type of identity, a type of identity we are thinking of when addressing the familiar question of an identity crisis: “Who am I really?” This is the question of identity as proper attributability, as providing an account of one's true self and the various attributes genuinely belonging to it. (For early and influential discussion of proper attributability and identification, see various essays in Frankfurt 1988).
So what is the right account of this sort of identity? According to theorists attracted to this general approach, it is the Narrative Criterion of Personal Identity: what makes an action, experience, or psychological characteristic properly attributable to some person (and thus a proper part of his or her true identity) is its correct incorporation into the self-told story of his or her life (MacIntyre 1984, 1989, Taylor 1989, Schechtman 1996, DeGrazia 2005). Narrative identity is thus really about a kind of psychological unity, but not just an artless or random unity. Imagine, for instance, a subject of experiences to whom various experiences merely happened over time. The events would be unified in a purely passive respect, simply as the experiences contained within the life of that subject of experiences. But for that subject to be a person, a genuine moral agent, those experiences must be actively unified, must be gathered together into the life of one narrative ego by virtue of a story the subject tells that weaves them together, giving them a kind of coherence and intelligibility they wouldn't otherwise have had. This is how the various experiences and events come to have any real meaning at all — rather than being merely isolated events — by being part of a larger story that relates them to one another within the context of one life (Schechtman 1996, 96-99).
This view purports to account for our practical concerns in a far more adequate way than the previous accounts of numerical identity. So it make sense for me to rationally anticipate some future experiences only if they will be mine, where what makes them mine is that they will fit coherently and accurately into my own ongoing self-told story. What explains my special sort of concern for myself is that I'm in fact an extended narrative ego — not some time-slice concerned about the well-being of some future time-slice — and I'm constantly extending that narrative into the future, so my concern is global, a concern for the whole self I'm creating via this story, the whole self whose various parts are mine. And as for responsibility, the Narrative Criterion implies that what makes some past action mine (for which I'm eligible for praise or blame) is that it flowed from my central values, beliefs, and experiences, that there's a coherent story I may tell uniting it to the other elements of my life. And a similar story may be told to account for compensation (Ibid., 136-162).
There are, nevertheless, problems with the account. For one thing, it is not entirely clear why a self-told narrative is necessary to unite the various experiences and events of one's life into a coherent whole. I may have robust psychological unity without having told myself any kind of story. But even if we allow for hypothetical narratives to do this work, or for third-person narratives to count, it remains unclear just what role a narrative would be playing here at all. For surely we must allow that some narratives get it wrong — it can't just be that whatever I say, or someone else says, about the way the events of my life fit together is what goes — and if we allow for that, then it seems we must admit that it isn't the narrative itself that makes the various events and experiences united with one another; rather, they must be united with one another independently, and the (correct) narrative just serves as a kind of post hoc overlay, an articulation of the pre-existing unity. And we will see yet another worry about the ambiguity of narrative identity in our later discussion of the communitarian objection to the methodology employed here.
But perhaps the most serious worry comes from the fact that, as it stands, narrative identity depends on numerical identity (DeGrazia 2005, 114). What matters to us with respect to all of our practical concerns is that we ourselves continue to exist: it's a necessary presupposition of my rational anticipation, self-concern, possibilities for compensation, and so on that I myself persist, but this is an issue of numerical identity. Another way to put this is that one can't be a person, on the narrative view, unless one gathers up the various experiences one has as a subject of experiences into a coherent narrative, but then the identity of that subject of experiences must be preserved across time for its experiences to be so gathered up. If narrative identity presupposes numerical identity, though, it will run headlong into the famous case of fission, a case that also causes significant trouble for the previously discussed theories of numerical identity, the Psychological Criterion and the Biological Criterion.
Derek Parfit was among the first contemporary theorists to explore the relation between identity and ethics explicitly, first in his seminal early 1970s articles, “Personal Identity” and especially “Later Selves and Moral Principles,” and then with his restatement and development of the view in Part III of his 1984 book Reasons and Persons (from which the present exposition is taken). Parfit's is, in many respects, a Lockean account of personal identity, although there are significant departures. He is a “reductionist,” according to which the facts about persons and personal identity consist in more particular facts about brains, bodies, and series of interrelated mental and physical events (Parfit 1984, 210-211). The denial of reductionism is called “nonreductionism,” according to which the facts about persons and personal identity consist in some further fact, beyond the facts about physical and psychological continuity, typically a fact about Cartesian egos or souls.
While Parfit's arguments against nonreductionism and in favor of reductionism are striking and important, for our purposes what matters is how he articulates and develops reductionism and how he argues for the surprising conclusion that the identity relation is in fact not what matters in survival. To begin, he suggests at times that the most plausible reductionist criterion of personal identity is the Psychological Criterion. As we saw earlier, this criterion maintains that in order for X to be identical to Y, they must be uniquely psychologically continuous. Psychological continuity is potentially a branching, one-many relation, i.e., it could conceivably hold between me-now and more than one person in the future. But identity is an equivalence relation — it is reflexive, symmetrical, and transitive — so it holds only one-one. Thus only by including a “no branching” clause can this criterion of identity avoid a crippling contradiction.
By way of explanation, consider the case Parfit uses in support of his claim that identity is not what matters: fission (Ibid., 254-255). Suppose both of my brain hemispheres are functional duplicates of the other, and that each of my other two triplet brothers has suffered irreversible brain damage. A brilliant neurosurgeon can transplant one of my brain hemispheres into each brother, and so each survivor (we will stipulate) will be fully psychologically continuous with me upon waking up. What has happened to me? If we lack the “no branching” clause, we are forced to say that, because both brothers are psychologically continuous with me, they are both me. But then (given the transitivity of identity) both survivors would also have to be identical to each other, which seems obviously false (although see Belzer 2005 for doubts about this assertion). So to avoid violating this transitivity requirement, we simply have to stipulate in our criterion of personal identity that, if the relations in which identity consists may hold one-many, they must obtain uniquely for identity itself to obtain.
But then what has happened to me in fission? It seems I cannot survive as both, so the identity relation does not obtain between me and the survivors. In addition, there simply is no non-arbitrary reason why it should obtain between me and just one of the survivors, so the only remaining option is that I do not survive fission (see Parfit 2001, 42; see also Brink 1997b, 140-141). But is this like an ordinary case in which I don't survive, i.e., like death? Clearly not: both survivors will seem to remember my thoughts and experiences, they will fulfill intentions I had in action, they will have the same beliefs/desires/goals as me, and their characters will be exactly like mine. Indeed, it will be just as if I had survived. Everything that matters in ordinary survival (or nearly everything), therefore, is preserved in fission, despite the fact that the identity relation is not. What this must mean, then, is that the identity relation just is not what matters (or is not what matters very much) in survival; instead, what matters has to consist in psychological continuity and/or connectedness (what Parfit calls “Relation R”). As long as that relation holds between me-now and some other person-stage — regardless of whether or not it holds one-one — what happens to me is just as good as ordinary survival. Call this the Identity Doesn't Matter (IDM) view.
While there are plausible alternative reactions to fission that maintain the importance of the identity relation (see, e.g., Lewis 1976, Sider 2001a) — and such views will be explored later — for now it is important to see what Parfit's version would mean, if anything, for our practical concerns. What, after all, do we do if identity is not what matters in survival? Given that we have for the most part been assuming that identity is the relation grounding our patterns of concern, we are now faced with two options: either we take those patterns of concern to be unjustified or we find new grounds for them. In Reasons and Persons, Parfit is officially agnostic on the proper approach (he claims that arguments for both stances are defensible, yet also can be defensibly denied; see Parfit 1984, 311-312). Nevertheless, it surely seems most plausible to retain the patterns of concern formerly grounded on identity and simply find a new justification for them. And it seems obvious that Relation R could provide such a justification. After all, if we formerly thought identity justified these patterns insofar as it was what we thought mattered for survival, but it turns out that identity — Relation R plus uniqueness — is not what matters only because uniqueness is not what matters, then it seems overwhelmingly natural and plausible to cite the remaining aspect of identity (Relation R) as what grounds our patterns of concern in virtue of being what truly matters in survival (see, e.g., Jeske 1993, D. Shoemaker 2002a). How, in other words, could uniqueness have provided all the relevant justifications? Indeed, Parfit himself seems drawn to such a conclusion in the discussion of rationality and morality that follows.
So let us assume that Relation R grounds our patterns of concern. Consider, then, prudential rationality. While it is ordinarily thought to be imprudent to discount the interests of one's Much Later Self (MLS) just because that self will not come into existence for a long time, Parfit suggests that reductionism provides a different, more plausible reason to do so. Since one of the relations in R (connectedness) obtains by degrees, it is very likely it will obtain to a much reduced degree between me-now and my MLS than it will between me-now and my tomorrow's self. But if R grounds my patterns of concern, and a reduced degree of connectedness is one part of R, then a reduced degree of connectedness justifies a reduced degree of concern. Thus, I may be justified in caring much less about my MLS than about my tomorrow's self. This conclusion, then, justifies discounting my MLS's (expected) interests in favor of my present interests.
Of course, given that we still think great imprudence is wrong, how might we criticize it if we made these revisions to our practices? One way to do so would be to recognize that, since my MLS would really be more like a different person than me, he should be treated as such, i.e., how I treat him should now fall under the rubric of morality, and insofar as it is wrong to harm others without their consent, it would be wrong for me to harm him as well. Great imprudence like this, in other words, would be immoral (Parfit 1984, 318-320).
Parfit's theory has often been called “revisionary,” in part because of moves like this one (see, e.g., Rovane 1998, 11; Martin 1998, 15). The thought is that both his theory of identity and its implications for our prudential and moral practices and concerns require us to change our views both of ourselves and of what matters. But this judgment may be mistaken. After all, Parfit seems to be trying to show that (a) what in fact matters to us in survival (revealed by the fission case) is Relation R, not identity, and (b) what these antecedent commitments about survival imply about prudence and morality is that the wrongness we currently attach to great imprudence should merely be called a wrongness of morality. But in neither case is there any call for revision of anything substantive in our views of ourselves or in our normative practices. Indeed, people simply are less concerned with their MLSs than with their tomorrow selves, and it is not difficult to see why: if they cannot imagine being the self in question, it is extremely difficult either to imagine what that self's interests are or to take those interests into account equally with their more closely related stages in practical deliberation. But what generally enables that act of projective imagination is the expectation of a significant degree of psychological connectedness, so the less there is expected to be of that relation, the less our concern for those distant stages is likely to be. This suggests, then, that Parfit's view is less revisionary than revelatory: he may be taken to be providing a clear-headed description of our practices and commitments, and in so doing revealing to us just what those practices and commitments actually involve and entail for other aspects of our lives (although see the discussion of the various articles by Mark Johnston later on for considerations to the contrary).
We have just examined the four most popular contemporary theories of personal identity (or what matters in personal identity), and we have also explored how those views might relate to ethics. But we have thus far ignored what may be the most popular theory of identity outside philosophy (and a view that a minority of philosophers accepts as well). This is nonreductionism, according to which persons exist separately and independently from their brains and bodies, and so their lives are unified from birth to death in virtue of that separately existing entity, what we will call a Cartesian ego (but is most popularly thought of as a soul). And although there is logical space available for a nonreductionism according to which identity isn't what matters for survival and our practical concerns, the universal view is instead the opposite. Notice, then, that this view implies both a deep unity within individual lives and a deep disunity between lives. After all, if what unifies my life is a particular persisting ego-substance, and that substance is wholly present at every stage of my life, then every temporal slice of my life is just as much a part of me as every other, so if prudential concern is grounded in identity, for example, I ought to be equally concerned for every part of my life. Further, given that my particular ego-substance is distinct from every other person's particular ego-substance, my special prudential concern justifiably ends at the boundaries of my epidermis (or at the “boundaries” of my ego).
Now one important problem for this view is that it is very difficult to see why my patterns of concern should track this particular ego, and not instead the psychological features constituting Relation R. What is it about this substance that warrants my special self-concern, for example? If it is in virtue of its function as the carrier of the various psychological connections, then we might well wonder why we shouldn't just care directly for those connections, rather than merely for the “package” they come in. But if we make that move, then we have already switched to reductionism, it seems, and because those direct psychological connections may hold one-many, identity cannot be what matters.
On the other hand, the nonreductionist might insist that I am justified in having special concern for my future ego simply insofar as it is the only thing that will be me, regardless of whether or not Relation R is preserved by or within it. On this account, then (what Parfit 1984, 228 calls the “Featureless Cartesian View”), who I am — my essential identity — is independent of any particular psychological properties. But if identity is entirely prized apart from psychology in this way, and if the ego to be tracked is an immaterial substance (as it is, of course, on the Cartesian version), we are left with two related puzzles. First, if the particular ego I now have (or am) can be perceived or identified neither directly, via some empirical means, nor indirectly, via a particular set of psychological properties it might be thought to evince, then we actually have no reason to believe that there is just one such ego unifying the various stages of our lives. Instead, our bodies might get a new, qualitatively identical ego every year on our birthdays, or perhaps every day, or perhaps there is a river of them flowing through us from moment to moment. If this were to happen, then I would cease to exist, replaced by a qualitatively identical person who then inherits my psychological properties. But no one would even notice! This would be rather odd, to say the least, and this is because of the connection we think should obtain between our metaphysical criterion of personal identity and our epistemological criterion of personal identity. In other words, we tend to think there is a close connection between the nature of personal identity and what enables us to determine when identity obtains. So if what makes X and Y identical is sameness of body, it will also be our reidentification of that body which enables us to determine that X is Y. Similarly, if what makes X and Y identical is some kind of psychological continuity, then determining that X and Y are identical will be a matter of determining whether psychological continuity obtains between them. Now in both the body and the psychology cases, we have the capacity to do the tracking in question. If the Featureless Cartesian View is correct, though, we do not. We cannot track immaterial egos floating free from any particular psychological properties, so on this view we would never be justified in claiming to have reidentified anyone, nor would we be justified in claiming special concern for some future stage of our bodies: in both cases, we could have no reason whatsoever for thinking that the persons in question were who we thought they were (Perry 1978, 6-18; Parfit 1984, 228).
Now the defender of the view might maintain that, given the correctness of the metaphysical criterion, we should simply abandon our desire for epistemic access to identity. And it is indeed the case that this version of nonreductionism could be true: there is simply no way to show that I am not, after all, an essentially immaterial substance unattached to any particular psychological properties. But if this true, and there becomes no way to make justified judgments of identity, then the second problem is that the theory is just irrelevant for all practical purposes. We in fact make judgments of identity and reidentification based on physical and psychological properties — we lack the capacity to do anything else — so even if the Featureless Cartesian View were true, it would be useless in addressing any of our practical concerns. If, then, we want to articulate a useful relation between personal identity and ethics, we may have to abandon nonreductionism (D. Shoemaker 2002b, 148).
Let us turn briefly now to a very general position, a possible version of reductionism according to which identity nevertheless still matters. This view is typically defended by advocates of four-dimensionalism, according to which objects have both spatial and temporal parts (see, e.g., Lewis 1971, 1976; Noonan 1989; Sider 2001a). This view allows one to say that, in the fission case, both post-fission people existed all along, completely coinciding spatially pre-fission (so that each shared that temporal stretch of his life with the other). In other words, they might be like two distinct roads that coincide for a while before separating off in different directions. Thus, if both post-fission person-stages are stages of the same person as the pre-fission stages (but there are indeed two distinct persons all along), then one can maintain the thesis that the identity relation is what matters, for now identity is also preserved through fission (whereas in Parfit's version while what matters is preserved through fission, identity is not).
Of course, this does not mean identity is really what matters. Perhaps instead the identity relation merely always accompanies, but is not constitutive of, what matters. Indeed, this point may be pressed on the four-dimensionalist. Why, after all, would it be identity that matters in my relation to some future person-stage? Suppose we regularly lived to be 1000 years old. On the four-dimensionalist account, I now would be unified with — I would be part of the same spacetime worm as — my 900-year-old self. But it is extraordinarily difficult, if not psychologically impossible, for me to project myself into his shoes, for I expect him to be radically different, psychologically, from me. There would be between us, then, virtually nothing of what actually matters in ordinary survival, despite the obtaining of identity. Of course, one might maintain instead that it is some strong degree of psychological connectedness that provides the unity relation between various temporal stages, but then it seems explicit that the relation preserving what matters is just connectedness, not identity per se. Now there is much more to say about this view, of course (see, e.g., Belzer 2005), and we will return to it later.
We have examined several theories of personal identity in this section, only some of which seem relevant to our practical concerns. Both the Biological Criterion and nonreductionism have difficulty meeting some of the key conditions for an ethically motivated theory of personal identity, namely, that it afford us epistemic access to the identity in question, and that it provide genuine explanatory grounds for our practical concerns. The theories that do the best at meeting these conditions are all psychological in nature: the Psychological Criterion, the Narrative Criterion, and the IDM view (although the last isn't a theory of personal identity, per se). We might well wonder, though, why a theory of identity, which is metaphysical in nature, ought to meet these practical conditions in the first place. Perhaps a biological or nonreductionist theory is just true, despite being irrelevant to our practical concerns. If so, then perhaps our search for a theory of the relation between identity and ethics is misguided. Alternatively, there may be different types of identity, some of which are relevant to our practical concerns, some of which aren't. So the Biological Criterion might be the correct metaphysical account of human identity, while narrative identity captures the sort of identity that matters for our practical concerns. (This is the view of DeGrazia 2005). Or perhaps the Biological Criterion is the right criterion of human identity, whereas the IDM view is what applies to our practical concerns. (This seems to be the view of Olson 1997b). Or perhaps regardless of what's true of our essence or human identity, the Psychological Criterion is true regarding the identity of us as persons or moral agents. Or perhaps reductionism in general is true as a third-person account of identity, but it has nothing whatsoever to do with our practical identities (see, e.g., Korsgaard 1989). These are the sorts of issues we will discuss in more detail later.
Strictly speaking, a metaphysical criterion of identity has no direct implications whatsoever for normative matters, simply because what is the case implies nothing about what ought to be the case. What people who seek a relation between identity and ethics typically do, then, is appeal to considerations of identity to fill in some key blank regarding what the ethically significant metaphysical units are. In other words, certain conclusions about identity are taken to inform us as to just what unifies the targets of prudential and moral theorizing. Consider prudence, for example. In deliberating about what is in my best interest, what is needed is some conception of the scope of the “my” in question, i.e., what unit my deliberations are to cover. Similarly, with respect to moral responsibility, we need to know whether or not the agent subject to praise or blame for some action is part of the same unit as the agent who performed that action.
But notice that a specification of possible metaphysical unities alone will not be sufficient, for what we need in addition is a specification of which such unities are significant for ethics. To see why this is an issue, consider just reductionism. Reductionism is actually quite a general metaphysical view, holding at its most basic that the facts about identity simply consist in more particular facts about brains, bodies, and so forth. But even if one accepts reductionism, and so abandons appeal to some further nonreductionist fact to explain personal identity, and even if one also believes that identity is not what matters in survival, one still has much work to do before being able to apply the theory to ethics. This is because there are actually at least four possible metaphysical units — unified by four of the more particular relations possibly involved in personal identity — that could be targeted for normative theorizing. First, we might target living human beings, animal organisms picked out by the Biological Criterion and unified over time via biological continuity. These entities would endure from (roughly) early-stage fetuses until organismic death. Second, we might target persons, entities picked out by the Psychological Criterion and unified over time by psychological continuity (overlapping chains of strong psychological connectedness). These entities would endure likely from late infancy (or the time at which the various psychological connections could be established) to brain death or dementia. Third, we might target selves, entities unified by strong psychological connectedness. Such units would have significant duration, but they would not be likely to endure for as long as persons — insofar as memories typically fade, beliefs and desires are lost or revised over time, and so forth — and they certainly wouldn't endure as long as the life of the human being of which they were a part. Fourth, we might target atoms, or momentary experiencers, “units” defined and delimited by the duration of an experience. It could be, after all, that if the deep fact of identity is missing, there just are no other relations of significance that could warrantedly be put in its stead, so all that remains would be merely the basic atomic moments of people's lives. (For discussion of the last three possible units, see D. Shoemaker 1999b, 401; for a similar distinction, see Brink 1997b, 110-115, where he labels these last three possible units “persons,” “person-segments,” and “person-slices.”)
So it is not enough that we articulate the various possible metaphysical units. We further must figure out a way to identify which one we ought to target for ethics (or whether just one will do the trick for all relevant forms of ethical theorizing). So in its purely metaphysical guise, reductionism must settle merely for presenting these four alternatives, remaining officially neutral on which one the ethicists should adopt. This two-step process— identifying the possible metaphysical units, then narrowing down the list to the ethically significant metaphysical units — is often overlooked by those wishing to adopt metaphysical conclusions in their normative theorizing, but both steps are important (a notable exception to those who overlook this point is Brink; see his 1990, 1997a, and 1997b).
Once we make the switch from talk of identity to talk of unity relations as being ethically significant, however, things can also get quite complicated. For there seems no reason in principle why two of the contending intrapersonal unity relations — psychological continuity and connectedness — could not also hold interpersonally. That is, not only could psychological continuity, say, hold one-many, between me-now and more than one person in the future, but it could also hold between me-now and other spatially distinct, simultaneously-existing persons (Brink 1997a, 141-143, 1997b, 125-128). And the same could be true as well of psychological connectedness (D. Shoemaker 2000, 355-362). At least some of the psychological relations making up connectedness and continuity can obviously obtain interpersonally, e.g., sameness of beliefs/desires/goals, and resemblance of character. But it also seems perfectly possible that memories and intentions may be shared between persons, produced by some common cause (Ibid.). Recognizing these connections widens the boundaries of what counts as a targeted unit (and in so doing it may also blur the boundaries between prudence and morality), but the ensuing messiness may not be worth it. After all, if the proper ethical unit is a self, say, unified by psychological connectedness, which obtains by degrees, that means that my unity with many others — and with future stages of myself — will be only partial, obtaining to various people in varying degrees. But if these are the units targeted by ethics, how do we mark their boundaries such that the moral concepts and principles coherently apply (McMahan 2002, 62)? In addition, who exactly would the practical agents in question be, where people are more or less unified with each other (Brink 1997b, 113-114)? And there may also be worries about how to apply moral concepts admitting of no scalar dimensions — like promises — to moral units — like selves — that do (Williams 1976, 202-204). These questions (and more) pose genuine challenges for accounts allowing for such interpersonal unities. Nevertheless, as we will see, there are certainly features of commonsense morality that the interpersonal relations view can explain that other views may not.
We have already seen some ways in which considerations of personal identity might be relevant to self-regarding practical concerns like anticipation and self-concern. We turn now to examine specific ways in which personal identity may have implications for the other-regarding practical concerns discussed in various arenas of moral philosophy. One of the most widely discussed arenas in the literature thus far has been ethical theory. Most of those working in the field to this point have been appealing to considerations of identity to boost the plausibility of consequentialism, and, more specifically, utilitarianism. There are various ways in which such an attempt proceeds.
First, one might identify a serious objection to utilitarianism, say, and then show how considerations of personal identity (or at least of what matters in identity) dissolve the objection. This is the approach Parfit takes in Reasons and Persons. The objection he is concerned to refute is Rawls' famous “separateness of persons” charge, the contention that utilitarianism fails to take seriously the distinction between persons, because it controversially jettisons interpersonal distributive principles in exactly the way we uncontroversially jettison them intrapersonally (Rawls 1971, 22-27). That is, in extending the principle of rational choice to society-wide decision-making (via use of the imagined impartial spectator), utilitarianism treats the interests of all members of society as if they were the interests of one person, and so conflates different persons into one. What Parfit suggests is that, if the objection depends on a hard-and-fast metaphysical distinction between persons (i.e., on the non-identity of different persons), and if this distinction depends on the further fact of identity — a nonexistent fact if reductionism is true — then the distinction is nothing to take seriously in the first place. Utilitarians, in other words, may be reductionists, justifiably ignoring the “distinctness” between persons — and the distributive principles such a distinction might support — because the non-identity of persons is just a less deep fact (Parfit 1984, 329-345; see also Broome 1991 for a reductionist-based argument in support of utilitarianism's account of goodness).
There are several subtle arguments in support of this general conclusion (for a summary, see D. Shoemaker 2002a, 60-63, 66-68), but note for now that their success actually depends on the specific version of reductionism being advanced. After all, there are several possible morally significant metaphysical units compatible with reductionism, and it turns out that the larger the unit, the less successful the argument will be. As the authors on this topic do, we will focus just on the three possible psychological units: persons, selves, and atoms. If one believes that the only relevant units are atoms (momentary experiencers) — given that in the absence of the further fact of identity one believes there just are no other unifying relations of any significance — then it is easy to see the complete analogy between individual lives and sets of lives: neither are unified by any significant metaphysical relations, so we could think of them both as just big collections of experiences, in which case there would seem to be no reason to apply distributive principles within either (or, alternatively, no reason not to apply such principles to both — how much weight they ought to bear in that case would remain open, however). But notice that if one adopts either of the other two psychology-based versions of reductionism, according to which either selves or persons are the basic moral units, the argument may not be as successful. If, for instance, it is psychological continuity that matters instead of the further fact of identity — and matters just as much as identity was thought to — then persons are the morally significant metaphysical units, but then there remains a metaphysical distinction between persons, for psychological continuity, in the absence of interpersonal connectedness, fails to unify sets of lives in the way it does individual lives (see Jeske 1993, Brink 1997a). And the same goes for strong psychological connectedness, which would unify selves in a way rendering them metaphysically distinct from sets of lives (D. Shoemaker 2002a).
It looks, then, as if the only way to bolster support for utilitarianism (with a version of this argument, anyway) is to adopt the extreme view, that the morally significant metaphysical units are momentarily-existing person-atoms. But this is implausible, for it is very difficult even to make sense of a momentary agent. Agents, after all, have interests and projects they seek to advance that necessarily project them into the future. In order to be what one is at any moment, then, one must identify with one's future. “When the person is viewed as an agent, no clear content can be given to the idea of a merely present self” (Korsgaard 1989, 114; see also Williams 1976, 204-207, and Brink 1997b, 112-113). But if one moves away from atoms as the basic moral units for these sorts of practical reasons, the separation between selves/persons and sets of lives becomes more distinct.
Unless, that is, one allows that the relations that matter in identity can hold interpersonally, in which case a number of interesting possibilities arise. For instance, Brink argues that the possibility of interpersonal continuity supports a kind of consequentialism via rational egoism. If one is a rational egoist, one will aim to promote one's own good. What counts as one's own, though — what counts as contained within the prudentially significant metaphysical unit — given reductionism, is defined by psychological continuity (Brink argues against the coherence or practical feasibility of both atoms and selves as the basic units). But if continuity also holds interpersonally, then the rational egoist must, if truly rational, promote the good of all those with whom he is continuous, which, given the thought that each of us bears only six degrees of separation from every other person, generates an important kind of impartial, universalist consequentialism: “the egoist can recognize derivative but non-instrumental reason to be concerned about others” (Brink 1997b, 127). Of course, if the utter impartiality of a universalist consequentialism is implausible for the way it overlooks the importance to us of the special concern we have for friends and loved ones, perhaps one can introduce the idea of degrees of continuity, in which case the concern the egoist must have for others “is proportional to the amount of psychological continuity that exists between the agent and others” (Ibid., 128; see also McMahan 2002, 59-66).
Of course, while connectedness clearly comes in degrees, it is less clear that continuity does. For one thing, if continuity consists in strong connectedness, and what makes for such strength is the obtaining of an amount of direct psychological connections above some specified threshhold (as it does for Parfit 1984, 206), then continuity is not a matter of degree: either strong connectedness obtains at each link in the chain or it does not (Belzer 2005). But even if we allow that some links in the chain may be weaker than others, if what matters is the existence of the chain, it is difficult to see why its strength in certain patches is relevant. In other words, even if we allow that continuity comes in degrees, it is not entirely clear why our patterns of concern ought to track the amount and not simply the fact of continuity. Indeed, if what matters is supposed to be the degree of continuity, it might seem to make more sense simply to focus on the more obviously scalar relation in which continuity consists, viz., connectedness, as delivering the units of significance in the form of selves.
While focus on selves could perhaps yield a very complicated form of consequentialism (involving the introduction into deliberation of the good of all affected parties — including future selves — weighted according to the degrees of connectedness obtaining between them and the deliberator), another, perhaps more promising, approach would be to appeal to reductionist selves to buttress a different ethical theory altogether, namely contractualism. One longstanding objection to the theory is that it has no way of motivating the amoralist to adhere to the demands of morality. But we can assume that the amoralist is at least prudentially rational. If so, then one very plausible way to model ordinary prudential deliberation is as consisting of a desire that one's actions be justifiable to all affected future stages of oneself (see, e.g., McClennen 1990, 217). But if the relation that matters in identity is connectedness, it should ground such prudential concern in a way that restricts required justification only to those stages with whom one expects to be connected. But then if connectedness holds interpersonally, the rational amoralist must also extend that desire for justifiability to all those with whom he is psychologically connected, and this will take him a long ways towards having the moral motivation at the heart of contractualism (for this sort of argument, see D. Shoemaker 2000; for the basic view of contractualism presupposed here, see Scanlon 1982 and 1998).
The views documented thus far all appeal to psychology-based versions of the morally significant metaphysical units. What, though, of biology-based versions? One thought motivating nonconsequentialism over consequentialism has to do with compensation: nonconsequentialists think it would be unfair to compensate one basic moral unit for a burden undergone by another such unit, something which consequentialism allegedly permits (Jeske 1993). Here the non-identity of different basic moral units is significant. But what are the moral units relevant to issues of compensation? These are most often thought to be psychological units, typically reductionist persons. But why not think these basic units are instead human beings, individual animal organisms unified by biological continuity? One reason to do so stems from consideration of cases in which a child has been made worse off by some burden undergone when she was a fetus, e.g., her mother drank (giving her fetal alcohol syndrome) or her mother's physician was negligent. Here she is owed compensation, we might think, for what happened to her before birth. (And analogous cases might be constructed with respect to humans who become non-persons, perhaps by going into a permanent vegetative state.) Such cases might then suggest that, if compensation presupposes personal identity, or what matters in identity, then the criterion of identity (or the reductionist account of the basic moral units) relevant to compensation is biological, in which case ethical theorists targeting only psychological units are incomplete (D. Shoemaker 2007, 338).
As we can see, then, one may deploy reductionism about personal identity in very different ways to achieve very different results for ethical theory, depending on the basic units one emphasizes. Of course, there may simply be no single relation appropriate for grounding all our patterns of concern, i.e., some patterns of concern may be grounded in biological continuity, some may be grounded in psychological continuity or connectedness, and some may target simple momentary experiences. If this is the case, then it may be difficult to see what general, uniform conclusions, if any, can be drawn for ethical theory.
As noted earlier, Locke thought the personal identity relation was, in effect, an accountability relation: what makes Y at t2 the same person as X at t1 is just what makes Y accountable — morally responsible — for X's actions. And insofar as Locke thought personal identity consisted in something like direct connections of memory, he thus thought that Y is accountable for X's actions if and only if Y directly remembers those actions (presumably from the “inside”) (Locke 1694, 45, 51).
Now on its face, this general account of moral responsibility won't do. After all, Y's identity with X will not always be sufficient for rendering Y accountable for X's actions, regardless of the theory of identity deployed. If X were a child, or were insane, or were brainwashed or hypnotized, say, then Y wouldn't be accountable for X's actions given that X wasn't a moral agent at the time of action, someone eligible for responsibility in the first place. What Locke must have meant instead is that personal identity is sufficient at most to render one eligible for moral responsibility.
Is identity a necessary condition for responsibility, though? There is nearly universal agreement that it is. The way this idea is most often expressed is that one can be responsible only for one's own actions. Sometimes this is put more expansively: I can be responsible for my own actions, and I cannot be responsible for anyone else's actions (Sider 2001, 4, 143, 203-204; Schechtman 1996, 14; Olson 1997, 59). And these ways of putting the matter are just supposed to be a gloss on what is taken to be the platitude that moral responsibility presupposes personal identity (Butler 1736, 99-105; Reid 1785, 107-118; DeGrazia 2005, 88-89; Glannon 1998; Parfit 1984, 323-326; Parfit 1986, 837-843).
Now one might think that there are obvious counterexamples to this claim: parents are sometimes held responsible for the actions of their children, and accomplices are held responsible for the crimes committed by others. An easy reply, however, is that in each case the person being held responsible is actually responsible only for what he or she did. For example, the parent is being held responsible, not for what his child did, but for his (in)action in letting the child do what she did, say, or for his poor parenting. Or the accomplice is being held responsible, not for what the criminal did, but for what the accomplice did in aiding the criminal. So in both cases there is some properly specified action for which it seems only the person identical to the actor may be held responsible.
Now ordinarily what grounds legal responsibility is something like a physical criterion of identity: as long as X and Y have the same DNA, then they are the same person, and so Y can justly be held responsible for the crimes of X. But it seems clear that these physical strands are merely contingent, albeit reliable, indicators of the identity-condition that actually matters, viz., some form of psychological relation. What we are looking for, after all, is really the same moral agent — a certain sort of robust psychological being — and given that, for us humans as presently constructed, sameness of moral agency goes hand in hand with sameness of DNA, identification of DNA patterns reliably tracks the responsible agent in question. But it is easy to see that, if DNA patterns changed over time, or if it were possible to alter them in a way that nevertheless preserved the relevant psychological relation, they would be about as useful indicators of responsibility as the color or length of one's hair.
What, though, is the appropriate psychology-based account of personal identity to target as the necessary condition for moral responsibility? What we are looking for is an answer to the following question: what makes a past action my own for purposes of responsibility? The answer given by most theorists on this topic is that an action is my own just in case I am identical to the person who performed it. The next question to pursue, then, is what account of personal identity provides the right criterion of what makes an action one's own? Locke's memory criterion once again won't work, for surely some actions can be one's own even if one no longer remembers performing them, due to drunkenness, repression, trauma, or the like (Schechtman 2005, 12; see also Bradford and Smith 1979). In addition, memory isn't sufficient for ownership of actions. Were someone else's memory trace of doing something immoral copied into my brain (so that I “remembered” that person's action), it would be silly to think that it was mine, that I was somehow thereby identical to the performer of that action (Schechtman 2005, 12).
The natural move, then, is to apply the Psychological Criterion to the criterion of ownership relevant to responsibility (see, e.g., Glannon 1998, 231, 237-243). This criterion requires a wider variety and a greater number of psychological connections than does the memory criterion, and so it is unaffected by the worries about Locke's account. According to this view, then, some past action is my own (relevant to responsibility) just in case the person who performed the action is uniquely psychologically continuous with me (where this consists in overlapping chains of strong psychological connectedness). Nevertheless, this view also has some problems. For one thing, it's unclear that psychological continuity alone is sufficient for ownership. Consider a Patty Hearst-type case. She was kidnapped and brainwashed, and as a result came to “support” the cause of her captors and helped them rob a bank. Eventually, once deprogrammed, she denounced her captors and their cause. Assuming this is what actually happened, it is difficult to attribute the bank robbery to her anymore: it didn't at all flow from the values of her “real self,” we want to say, and so doesn't belong to her for purposes of moral assessment. Alternatively, it seems possible that psychological continuity isn't necessary for ownership either. Suppose someone were to undergo a brain trauma causing psychological discontinuity. Depending on how the case were filled in, it may be that certain actions performed prior to the discontinuity would still be judged hers in the relevant sense. As long as they flowed from a central aspect of the agent's character that remained in place, we might say, they are properly attributable to her regardless of the other psychological discontinuities that have taken place.
It is in part because of this sort of consideration that Schechtman suggests abandoning the search for identity in the reidentification sense in favor of identity in the characterization sense. What we're looking for, after all, is an account of what makes some past action my own. But looking for an answer to this question via something like the Psychological Criterion is too indirect: it has us attributing the action to some past person first and then trying to determine whether or not the person to be assessed as responsible is one and the same as that past agent. But if the action cannot be attributed to the allegedly responsible person directly, the relation between the two person-slices just isn't strong enough to warrant responses like punishment and blame (Schechtman 1996, 90-91; 2005, 13).
Nevertheless, all of these theories fall prey once more to the fission case (this includes narrative identity if it presupposes numerical identity, as discussed above). Suppose X were to rob a bank and then undergo fission, dividing into Y and Z, both of whom were psychologically continuous with X. Both Y and Z would seem to remember X's theft, they would still be buzzing over the thrill of the getaway chase, they would each have inherited an intention to spend the money on wine, women, and song, they would each persist in X's beliefs about the justification for the crime, and so forth. We would likely think the crime to be properly attributable to both of them, and so hold them both (at least partially) responsible for it. Yet neither could be numerically identical to X, and if identity is a necessary condition of responsibility, neither could be morally responsible for his crime. But this seems the wrong answer.
There are two plausible replies, both familiar by now. On the one hand, we can go four-dimensionalist (as does Sider), and hold that Y and Z are indeed two people who were, essentially, present all along, overlapping in all their spatial parts during the temporal stage of the life when they were both known as “X.” This allows us to preserve the platitude that one person cannot be responsible for the actions of another — in other words, it is indeed numerical identity that is necessary for responsibility — while also preserving the thought that it is the robust psychological relation that obtains between the various parties that grounds our belief that X has not gotten away with his crime just by undergoing fission.
Nevertheless, this option has some uncomfortable implications. For one thing, we think “I” uniquely refers, but “I” in X's mouth would, in this case, actually be referring to two people, Y and Z. Or perhaps that is not quite right; perhaps instead “I” in X's mouth refers to only one person, either Y or Z. But in that case, no one, not even “the” speaker, could possibly know to which one it referred. And there are other worries. For instance, whether or not the pre-fission X consists in two overlapping persons depends entirely on what happens in the future, i.e., on whether or not X goes through with the fission. So if X is driving from the bank to the fission doctor and then gets cold feet, there will be no fission and thus no Y or Z. But then whether or not Y or Z exist at the time of X's cold feet depends on whether or not X even gets cold feet, which seems, at the very least, quite odd. Whether or not “I” now consist in one or two people should not, we want to say, depend on what happens to “me” in the future.
Now these are just standard puzzles for four-dimensionalism about persons (see Olson 1997b, van Inwagen 2002, and the entry on personal identity). But there are also puzzles for four-dimensionalism specific to its treatment of the responsibility case. For instance, if responsibility depends on identity, and identity is a transitive relation, then if Y is responsible for the actions of X (insofar as Y is unified with X as part of the same person-worm), and Z is responsible for the actions of X (insofar as Z is unified with X as part of the same person-worm), then wouldn't Y also be responsible for the actions of Z (and vice versa)? Of course, unity relations are not identity relations, but it is unclear just why they do not have to be transitive in the way the identity relation is supposed to be (in Sider 2001a, 203, he simply insists that they do not have to be, without saying why). Furthermore, the four-dimensionalist solution is meant to preserve the commonsense platitude, but it does so in virtue of a solution that seems about as far from commonsense as it can be. Indeed, the platitude is about the responsibility of persons, but four-dimensionalism offers only a solution regarding the responsibility of person-stages (Ibid.; see also Parfit 1976).
A second reply is reductionist, and it simply denies the platitude. In other words, identity is not necessary for moral responsibility. Instead (the reductionist could say), what matters is psychological continuity (or connectedness), regardless of whether it obtains uniquely. This allows the reductionist to handle the fission case in the following way: while neither Y nor Z is identical with X, both are fully psychologically continuous with him, and insofar as ownership of actions consists in psychological continuity with the original agent, and because ownership is the necessary condition for responsibility, both Y and Z may be morally responsible for X's crimes.
Of course, we already saw some worries attached to a psychological continuity account of ownership that were unrelated to its being an account of numerical identity (e.g., Patty Hearst and the psychological discontinuity case). Perhaps, though, we could draw from the insights regarding the characterization sense of identity in responding to these particular problems, and then construct an account of ownership relevant to responsibility that is utterly divorced from considerations of numerical identity (and insofar as narrative identity depends on numerical identity, it would not be an eligible contender here). Indeed, this might be one way to construe what those working on responsibility and identification are doing (e.g., Frankfurt 1988, 1999; Taylor 1983; Watson 1975; Smith 2000). Once the account of ownership were complete, one could then call the view an identity account as well (perhaps being some sort of practical identity), but this would just be a terminological overlay, and it would be clear at that point that the essential component of responsibility was not really identity but rather ownership.
Perhaps the most exciting and variegated explorations of the relation between identity and ethics are taking place these days in the arena of applied ethics, specifically in medical ethics and bioethics. These typically involve attempts to chart the relation between some clear-cut person and either an earlier or later entity “at the margins of life.” We will here discuss the two main arenas of such research before briefly noting the sorts of debates about identity and applied ethics taking place in other arenas.
There are several ways in which personal identity is taken to be relevant to the debates over these topics. Consider first embryos and the contemporary dispute over the morality of stem cell research. The most commonly cited argument against such research is that, in its most promising form, it will involve destruction of two- to five-day-old embryos (in order to harvest their inner cell mass, which is what is used for the development of stem cells). But because human beings come into existence at the “moment” of conception, embryos are human beings, and insofar as it is prima facie immoral to kill human beings, it is prima facie immoral to kill embryos (see, e.g., Peters 2001, 129).
References to identity in this debate come from objectors to this argument, who apply the argument from fission to a real life version of it, namely, twinning. Any time generally before the two-week point in fetal development an embryo might split, such that the now two embryos develop into fully formed infant twins. The question for the advocate of the above argument to consider is, in such a case, what happens to the original human being, the embryo we will call Adam? There are only three possibilities: (a) either Adam survives as both twins, (b) Adam survives only as one or the other of the twins, or (c) Adam does not survive. Option (a) cannot be right, given that the twins will live distinct, individual lives, and so will clearly be two human beings, not one. Option (b) cannot be right, for what non-arbitrary reason could there be for one of the twins to be Adam and not the other? They will both be qualitatively identical to Adam, after all. The only remaining option, then, is (c), in which Adam does not survive. But this has two bad implications for the above advocate. First, if it is a tragedy when a human being dies, then twinning involves a tragedy, and Adam's death, it seems, ought to be mourned. This seems absurd (McMahan 1995 and 2002, 26; D. Shoemaker 2005; although see Oderberg 1997 for an embrace of this implication). Second, if the metaphysical analysis is right, then Adam's death brings about the existence of two new human beings (call them Barney and Claire). But this means that (1) it is not the case that all human beings come into existence at conception (some come into existence at twinning), and (2) death can somehow occur with no earthly remains, which is at best odd and at worst false (Kuhse and Singer 2002, 190; for these sorts of points applied to theological arguments about ensouled embryos, see D. Shoemaker 2005).
There are several possible replies, though. First, it is not clear that the options in twinning are exhausted by the three possibilities articulated above. A fourth possible option, it seems, is that of the four-dimensionalist, who can maintain that the embryo is a human being from the moment of conception by saying that the pre-twinning temporal parts of both Barney and Claire simply overlapped, i.e., what we called Adam was really a shared stage in the lives of both Barney and Claire. McMahan, for one, simply dismisses this possibility as absurd (McMahan 2002, 26), but it is not clear why, especially given that it is a straightforward application of a powerful metaphysical theory that has quite a bit of independent support (despite having its own set of problems, discussed earlier). Second, the implications involved may not be as bad as indicated. For one thing, “death by twinning,” while still a kind of death, may not be of a kind warranting the same sort of mourning typically expected to accompany regular “bodily” death. Furthermore, this kind of ceasing to exist, if it is a different kind of event than that of regular death, perhaps should not be expected to have the same kind of conditions — like the leaving of earthly remains — as regular death either. Consider how we think of the similar “deaths” of splitting amoebas (Ibid., 27).
Turn now to just one way in which personal identity enters into the broader debate over abortion. Perhaps the most famous anti-abortion argument in the philosophical literature comes from Don Marquis, who argues that, because it is prima facie wrong to kill any entity with a future like ours, and because a fetus has a future like ours, it is prima facie wrong to kill a fetus (Marquis 1989). Peter McInerney and others, however, have denied that fetuses have futures like ours by appealing to considerations of identity. To have a future like ours, for instance, presupposes that one is identical to some person who will experience said future. But a fetus is not a person, it seems, and so it cannot be identical to any future person. Indeed, none of the relations deemed relevant to the identity of persons are present between a fetus and anything else, simply because a fetus lacks a psychology with memories, beliefs, desires, intentions, and a general character capable of establishing any sort of plausible connection to a future experiencer, so that any experiences that experiencer undergoes cannot be the fetus's future experiences (McInerney 1990, Brill 2003). (The same point might be true as well for infants, but instead of taking that to be a reductio of the objection, one might also quite plausibly take it simply to be a point in favor of rejecting Marquis's criterion of the wrongness of killing: given that infants also lack a future like ours, Marquis's account is substantially incomplete, for it fails to explain why killing infants is wrong, when it obviously is.)
This objection assumes a purely psychological criterion of identity, however, one in which, further, “person” is what's' known as a substance sortal, a term designating a kind to which an individual always and essentially belongs throughout its existence. But as we saw earlier, “person” might be merely a phase sortal, designating a kind to which the individual belongs — if it does at all — for only part of its existence. This could mean, then, that I, now a person, could still be identical qua individual, to some organism — a fetus, say — that was not a person. Thus if some past fetus is identical to me — if we are one and the same animal, or organism — then he did indeed have a future like ours (Marquis 1998).
Clearly, though, if it is identity alone that renders a future experiencer's experiences mine, then the view runs into difficulty when, once more, we consider the possibility of fission. If I undergo fission, then, given the standard arguments, I will not survive (setting four-dimensionalist considerations aside). Nevertheless, surely we want to say that I still have a valuable future — indeed, it is overwhelmingly plausible to say I will have two valuable futures. This only makes sense, though, if we prize apart the having of a valuable future from the obtaining of the (numerical) identity relation. If we do so, though, we are insisting that the relations that matter in the having of a valuable future are definitely psychological, in which case, even if I am identical with some past fetus (qua organism or animal), that is irrelevant: what matters in the having of a valuable future does not obtain between us, so while a fetus has a future, it really does not have a future like ours.
A third kind of stance taken regarding identity and abortion is that there just is no relation of significance between them. Earl Conee argues in this way, insisting that the four main attempts to bolster some view about abortion with metaphysical conclusions fail, and thus that the metaphysics simply makes no moral difference, a conclusion “indicative of a general epistemic irrelevance of metaphysics to the moral issue” (Conee 1999, 619). But just because the various arguments fail (and Conee seems right about that), it does not yet follow that metaphysics generally makes no moral difference to questions about fetuses and embryos; indeed, we have just discussed two cases in which it clearly does. As Timothy Chappell puts it, Conee “does nothing to show that the right metaphysical doctrines — combined of course with the right moral doctrines — could not give us genuine reason to turn one way rather than the other in debates about abortion, or other similar debates about the extent of the moral community” (Chappell 2000, 279). And so it is to one of those “similar debates,” this time regarding the other end of life, that we now turn.
The philosophical puzzle regarding advance directives is fundamentally a puzzle about personal identity. Suppose that a woman is in the earliest stages of Alzheimer's disease, and she recognizes that there will come a point where she is in a demented state and will thus be incompetent to make autonomous or informed decisions about her treatment. Because she values her creativity and autonomy, she does not want that future demented self to be kept alive — its life will not be worth living — so she signs an advance directive stipulating that no life-saving measures are to be used on that future demented self (FDS). However, by the time her FDS gets pneumonia, she is quite content in her state and, when asked, says she wants to live (e.g., McMahan 2002, 497).
There is obviously a conflict here, but of what sort? If FDS is identical to the early-stage Alzheimer's self (EAS), then the conflict is between temporally distinct interests of the same person. But if that is the case, then we typically discount past interests in favor of present ones. If, when I was a ravenously carnivorous 20-year-old, I swore to myself that I would never pass up an opportunity to eat a juicy steak, yet I now find myself a vegetarian who gets queasy at the sight of medium-rare flesh on the table, it is obviously my present interests that will — and ought, we think — win the day.
On the other hand, if FDS is not identical to EAS — if, instead, she is a different person, or is at least a different self — then it may not be so obvious what the conflict is after all, for FDS has made her preferences clear, and if she is importantly distinct from the signer of the advance directive, then there seems little reason why the interests of EAS are relevant at all to FDS's life. But then again, FDS is not competent, and EAS, if not identical to her, is at least akin to her closest relative, one might think, in which case her earlier wishes perhaps ought to hold sway after all (see Luttrell and Sommerville 1996). (But EAS and FDS will be very psychologically different, we are supposing, so why think they are closely related at all? Indeed, wouldn't FDS be more closely “related” to her fellow end-stage Alzheimer's patients? So why think EAS has any more right to make life-or-death decisions about her than any of these others?)
And here is yet another way of looking at the matter. Suppose we agree with Parfit and others that identity just is not what matters for, among other things, defining and delimiting the scope of egoistic concern; suppose instead it is Relation R. FDS, because of her loss of memory and the like, will bear a very limited degree of that relation to EAS. EAS will thus be strongly R-related with most of the previous stages of her life (the chains of connectedness, let us stipulate, are very strong), but very weakly R-related with FDS, even though, it seems clear, FDS remains a stage of her life. But the part of her life most deeply prudentially unified — the far larger, more dominant part of her life — is the part of which EAS was still a strongly R-related part. Thus it might be that the wishes of EAS to preserve a coherently meaningful and valuable life ought to control here, given that the longer FDS lives, the worse she might retrospectively render EAS's life. That is, what is good for the deepest, longest prudential unity will be closest to what is best for the life as a whole, so FDS's good ought to be sacrificed for the sake of the good of the whole, as articulated by EAS in her advanced directive (see McMahan 2002, 502 for an argument like this).
Of course, once we abandon identity as what matters — especially if we do so in favor of a relation(s) that does not guarantee life-long unity (e.g., connectedness) — then it is not so clear anymore why what is best for the life-as-a-whole “unit” should matter at all. But if considerations of life-long welfare are set aside, then it is hard to see how EAS's advance directive could still have any moral authority over FDS's expressed interests. EAS's “life” would be over, for all intents and purposes, so it seems that no matter what happens to FDS, it cannot retroactively affect the value of EAS's already-completed “life.” This is the kind of move urged by some theorists regardless of considerations of identity. What we should abandon, they suggest, is the intuition that EAS's preferences are authoritative over FDS's at all (Dresser 1986, Jaworska 1999). Many demented patients are still capable of a kind of autonomy — involving the capacity to value — and so their wishes ought to be respected, goes this line, over the decisions of their earlier selves (Jaworska 1999, 109). Of course, this kind of view won't apply to end-stage dementia patients, but they may be patients incapable of expressing (or having?) genuine preferences in the first place.
As should be evident from just this very brief discussion, the issues here are quite complex, but they are definitely issues for which considerations of personal identity are often taken to be directly relevant.
There are at least four other areas of applied ethics that seem to bear a relation to personal identity, and we will lay out the issues of each very briefly. First, there is a problem of justifying therapeutic treatment for patients with Dissociative Identity Disorder (DID, formerly known as Multiple Personality Disorder). The worry here comes from the attractive thought that each of the distinct personalities of someone with DID is in fact a different person (Wilkes 1988; Dennett 1976). If so, then a therapy that aims at eliminating one or more of the alter personalities in favor of one of them would be, prima facie, immoral. (Morton Prince, one of the first psychologists to work with a DID patient, wrote that his aim was indeed to kill off what he thought of as the “non-real” personalities of his patient, Christine Beauchamp. See Prince 1905.) But this verdict is quite counterintuitive: surely the therapist is helping the patient with DID when his work produces only one healthy personality, not doing anything immoral. The issue, then, is about the moral ramifications of cutting off personal identity in an unusual sort of way. In addition, there are intriguing issues regarding identity and both legal and moral responsibility in patients with DID. What if one alter commits a crime, say? Is the patient with DID responsible or is only the offending alter responsible? If the latter, how is a fair punishment to be effected? (For further discussion of these issues, see Wilkes 1981, 1988; Hacking 1991, 1995; Lizza 1993; Braude 1995, 1996; Radden 1996; Sinnott-Armstrong and Behnke 2000; Kennett and Matthews 2002; DeGrazia 2005; and D. Shoemaker forthcoming).
A second problem has to do with genetic interference. Suppose someone carried the gene for Huntington's disease (HD) and wanted a child. There would be a 50/50 chance her child would inherit the HD gene. If there were genetic intervention available to eliminate the possibility of her child carrying the gene, should she undergo it? It seems obvious she should, at least until we draw on some metaphysical considerations about identity. Suppose the genetic intervention involved waiting until after fertilization and then altering the genome of the fetus. What would be the identity of the post-intervention child? Further, if its identity would be different from the child that would have been brought into existence, would the genetic interference be immoral in virtue of preventing that other child's existence? Relevant to the debate here is Saul Kripke's thesis about origins, that one person could not have been someone else (Kripke 1980), and this is a thesis with which advocates of the Biological Criterion of personal identity would likely agree: what makes me the particular individual I am is my biological structure and its origins, and any other combination of my parents' sperm and egg would have produced a different individual. The question here, though, is whether or not some other changes, after the combination of sperm and egg, would be sufficient to produce a different individual. And if so, does this bear on the morality of doing so? (For further discussion of these issues, see Elliot 1993, Persson 1995, Belshaw 2000, Glannon 2001, DeGrazia 2005: 244-268 and D. Shoemaker forthcoming.)
A third problem is in certain respects closely related. It is the non-identity problem, first discussed in detail in Parfit 1984, 351-379. Suppose a fourteen-year-old girl decides to have a child. Given her youth, the girl gives her child a bad start in life. If she had waited several years to have a child, that child would have been better off than the one she had. Our intuition, then, is that what the girl has done is wrong. But why? The obvious answer would seem to be that the girl's decision was bad for her child. But this cannot be right, for that child would not even have existed were it not for her decision. It is also clear that she doesn't harm the child that would have existed had she waited, given that something that does not exist cannot be harmed. It thus turns out to be very difficult to articulate just what was wrong with the girl's decision, but as Parfit notes, we do not abandon our belief in the wrongness of what the girl did. Instead, “we cannot defend this belief in the natural way … suggested” (Parfit 1984, 359). But finding an alternative defense does not look very promising. And applying the non-identity problem on a grander scale yields a serious puzzle in population ethics. Suppose governments around the world continue to ignore the threat of global warming, so that the lives of people living between 2200 and 2500 are barely worth living. Contrast this case with the scenario in which the governments cooperate to enact regulatory measures that slow down the warming trend and render it a non-threat, but in so doing make the lives of people living between 2010 and 2200 of a lower quality than they would otherwise have been. Clearly, it seems the second scenario is better, that we ought to bring this scenario about. But on what basis? Far-reaching governmental policies often play a critical role in determining the ways and timing in which people get together, so the identities of the members of the populations in each scenario would likely be quite different. If we also assume that we do not harm anyone by bringing him or her into existence, then who is harmed in the former scenario? Who is made worse off? Given that those people would not have existed had we done something about global warming, they have not been harmed by our inaction. So what moral reason can be given in defense of our pursuit of the second scenario? (Parfit 1984, 371-377) These are very difficult issues indeed. (For further discussion, see DeGrazia 2005, 268-279; and D. Shoemaker forthcoming.)
Finally, many have argued that considerations of personal identity can shed light on the nature of death, which itself plays a key role in moral argumentation (Green and Wikler 1980; Zaner 1988; Puccetti 1988; McMahan 2002; DeGrazia 2005). One popular line of thought, based on the Psychological Criterion, has been that when an individual is at the point when she is no longer able to sustain any psychological continuity, her identity has ceased, and so she should be considered dead. This idea has led many philosophers to advocate for a criterion of death known as the “higher brain standard,” according to which death occurs at the point of irreversible loss of the capacity for consciousness (e.g., Green and Wikler 1980). This psychological criterion of death implies that those in a permanent vegetative state are dead, despite their continuing brainstem activities. This philosophically popular view has never, however, been adopted anywhere. Those favoring the Biological Criterion advocate a view much more in line with actual medical practice. If we are essentially human organisms, according to these advocates, then our death occurs at the point when that organism dies. There is still wrangling over when precisely that occurs, however. Some favor a “death of the whole brain standard,” whereas others, dissenters as DeGrazia labels them, adhere to a “circulatory-respiratory standard,” according to which “human death is the permanent cessation of circulatory-respiratory function” (DeGrazia 2005, 149). It is less clear, however, what role personal identity actually plays in this debate. After all, the cessation of my identity may have nothing to do with anything like organismic (or brain) death. On any view of personal identity other than four-dimensionalism, recall, I cease to exist if I undergo fission. There will be no one in existence who is me, but this fact is irrelevant to our thinking about death. It may be the case, then, that seeking the factors involved in cutting off someone's personal, or human, identity will yield no insights into the nature of death itself.
Recall that both Reid and Butler objected to Locke's account of personal identity, in part, because they thought it had absurdly revisionary implications for our practices of moral responsibility. So rather than give up those practices, they said, we would be better off giving up Locke's theory. On this view, our normative commitments provide a check on our view of personal identity. Nevertheless, the consideration about moral responsibility is only one of many objections both critics run against Locke. They also launch purely metaphysical objections as well, the thought being that Locke's view fails both on its own terms and in light of its absurd normative implications. So actually, while our normative commitments provide an important consideration that the theory of personal identity should account for, it remains open that such commitments could be overridden or revised, depending perhaps on the independent plausibility of the theory in question.
For some authors, however, the role of our normative commitments in this debate is much stronger: they may actually authoritatively constrain, shape, or even be immune or irrelevant to one's theory of personal identity. This is a general methodological dispute about the proper direction of argumentation in the arena of personal identity and ethics. The assumption of many working in this arena has been evident in the discussion thus far: we work out or identify the correct theory of personal identity and then apply it where needed to the world of ethics. What we will briefly explore in this section, though, are four importantly different approaches (these are not exhaustive of the alternatives, however).
First, there is the Kantian view, advanced by Christine Korsgaard, that conceiving ourselves as practical agents simply requires us to view our lives as unified, despite the weakness or strength of various psychological connections that may or may not obtain between our various temporal stages. My conception of myself as a unified agent is not based on any metaphysical theory; it is instead based (a) on the basic need I have to eliminate conflict among my various motivational desires in order to act (producing my unified agency at any given time, i.e., synchronic unity), (b) on my deliberative standpoint, within which I view myself — a single deliberator/decider — as being over and above my various desires, weighing them and deciding between them, and (c) on my need to pursue any ends or carry out a rational plan of life (presupposing my unified agency across time, i.e., diachronic unity). In any case, I must conceive myself as a unified agent both at a time and across time because I have only one body with which to act. This unity, therefore, has no need of any metaphysical support; instead, it is simply a practical requirement of being an agent, a doer of deeds and a thinker of thoughts (Korsgaard 1989).
Second, there is the communitarian view, advanced by philosophers like Alasdair MacIntyre and Charles Taylor, that all proper conceptions of the self are dependent on social matrices. In order to understand the self, we must view it both in its relation to the good and in its relation to other selves, for two reasons. First, we have an indispensable ability both to have certain moral intuitions and to articulate the grounds of those intuitions, and this ability presupposes the existence of what Taylor calls evaluative frameworks, frameworks also presupposed by our concept of personhood. So crucial to understanding who I am is understanding where I stand in moral space: my identity is bound up in, and at least partially constituted by, my strong attachments to a community that provides the evaluative framework within which I am able to articulate what is good and valuable. Thus, to ask about a person abstracted from his self-interpretations is to ask “a fundamentally misguided question” (Taylor 1989, 34).
The second general reason selves can be understood only by reference to community and morality comes from a consideration of human actions. As MacIntyre notes, human actions are intelligible only if viewed in a particular setting. We can understand a piece of human behavior only when we have situated the agent's intentions within the two contexts of their role in the agent's history and their role within the history of their particular setting(s). In doing so, we are writing a narrative history. Intelligible actions are actions for which the agent is accountable, actions which have a place in an ongoing narrative (MacIntyre 1984, 206-208). Thus arises the notion of narrative unity. My life, my entire life, from physical birth to physical death, can be understood only as a narrative, as an ongoing story. Now the unity of a narrative requires unity of character, and unity of character presupposes strict, numerical personal identity. To be the subject of a narrative is to be accountable for past actions that have composed that narrative life. To understand your actions now, therefore, I have to understand them as actions situated in a life story, your life story, as actions interrelated with your prior actions. As a result, “all attempts to elucidate the notion of personal identity independently of and in isolation from the notions of narrative, intelligibility and accountability are bound to fail. As all such attempts have” (Ibid., 218).
Both the Kantian and communitarian objections target the disunifying implications of a metaphysical approach like reductionism, insisting instead that we are indeed unified as either practical agents or selves in moral space for purely normative reasons. Any theory of identity we construct, then, must be constrained by these normative considerations, which are thus obviously prior. Nevertheless, we may have some reason to doubt these claims. Consider first narrative unity. For one thing, it is not clear that intelligible actions are those for which the agent is accountable. Actions of children and the insane can be perfectly intelligible — even intelligible within some kind of narrative structure — without being those for which the agents are accountable.
More troublesome, though, is the status of the narrative unity claim. Is it descriptive or prescriptive? If descriptive, asserting that selves simply conceive themselves as unified over their lives within a narrative structure, then it seems false. As Galen Strawson points out, some people (and he claims to be one) are “Episodics,” those who have “little or no sense that the self that one is was there in the (further) past and will be there in the future,” and thus “are likely to have no particular tendency to see their life in Narrative terms” (Strawson 2004, 430). In addition, this observation bodes ill for the Kantian, insofar as it asserts the possibility of practical agency for those who do not view themselves as diachronically unified, i.e., unified practical agency may indeed not be a practical necessity. On the other hand, if the narrative unity thesis is supposed to be prescriptive, urging that people ought to view themselves as unified over time within a narrative structure, then it poses no threat to disuniting theories of identity like reductionism, for it would have to allow that life-long unity may simply not occur. Indeed, if the account is prescriptive, then it actually makes more sense to consider persons to be disunified, if what they ought to strive for is greater unity. If unity were a given, such striving would be unnecessary. (For somewhat similar considerations, see Williams 2007.)
But even if we grant the need for the kind of unity desired by both the Kantians and the communitarians, this does not yet imply that we must grant the life-long unity on which they both insist. It may be instead that only certain parts of one's life are unified in the way they describe, and these could in fact be stretches defined also by the obtaining of strong psychological connectedness, say (such that one's life would be better conceived as a collection of short stories than as a novel). In other words, it could be that reductionist theories of personal identity dovetail with these normative considerations already, so that rather than constituting a constraint on that theory (and disuniting theories like it), such considerations actually buttress it (D. Shoemaker 1996).
The third methodological alternative insists that, because our commonsense intuitions are at loggerheads over the thought experiments motivating the various metaphysical theories of personal identity (e.g., brain transplants, teletransportation, and the like), the only plausible solution to this underlying conflict is going to be revisionary, requiring us to abandon one of the conflicting sets of intuitions. But on the basis of what? Carol Rovane suggests that we start instead by deploying something on which everyone could agree, namely, a conception of personhood that's allegedly built into the foundations of every ethical position (including anti-theoretical ones). Once we determine the key condition of personhood — the condition Rovane calls “the ability to engage in agency-regarding relations” (Rovane 1998, 5) — we can then go on to construct a metaphysical theory of personal identity on top of this ethical concept. For Rovane, this will yield the rather surprising possibility of both group persons, composed of many human bodies (insofar as the group can meet the conditions of ethical personhood, functioning as an individual agent), and multiple persons, simultaneously existing within only one human body (insofar as each “personality” can meet the condition of ethical personhood, functioning as an individual agent, as well) (Ibid., chapters 4-5).
Others have been sufficiently moved as well by the recognition of conflicting intuitions in the puzzle cases to seek an entirely different approach to the issue of personal identity (see, e.g., Wilkes 1988, Schechtman 1996). But it is not yet clear why such a radical revision in methodology is called for. After all, the fact that our intuitions conflict in the puzzle cases does not necessarily mean that there is some deep-seated, ineliminable incoherence in the concepts we're applying to them. Instead, it may simply mean that there are conditions restricting the deployment of our concepts to anything other than paradigm cases, or it might mean that we are actually unsure what our intuitions are about the puzzle cases (for the former objection, see Gendler 2002a, 231; for the latter, see Degaynesford 2001, 171). (Further, even if we do agree to the need for a distinctly ethical conception of personhood and personal identity, it is not clear why the one Rovane has chosen is supposed to be uniquely suited to our purposes. After all, there will be plenty of other possible conceptions that are at least as plausible as having the agency-regarding ability, including conceptions emphasizing the ability to experience complex emotions, to control certain aspects of their world, or to feel pleasure and pain [see Gendler 2002a, 236]. Why privilege agency-regarding capacities over these?)
A fourth alternative to the methodology assumed thus far is presented in a series of powerful papers by Mark Johnston, in which he defends a view called “minimalism,” according to which the metaphysical facts of personal identity are irrelevant to the justification of our person-related practices and practical concerns, that the facts to which we think we are committed actually play only a minimal role in those practices and concerns (Johnston 1987, 1989, 1992, and 1997; Wolf 1986 and Unger 1990 have argued in a somewhat similar vein as well). Indeed, our practices here have a justification independent of metaphysics — a coherentist justification — so no metaphysical theory of personal identity will imply any real revisions to them at all. Johnston illustrates this point by talking about one of our practical concerns in particular: self-concern. My self-concern is part of a wider pattern of self-referential concern, a special non-derivative concern I have for a certain limited network of people, all who bear certain sorts of special relations to me: I care about my friends, my family, and my self. I care about them for their own sakes and I would need a very good reason not to do so (which is so far not forthcoming) (Johnston 1997, 158-159). Thus, in “the particular case of personal identity, minimalism implies that any metaphysical view of persons which we might have is either epiphenomenal or a redundant basis for our practice of making judgements about personal identity and organizing our practical concerns around this relation” (Johnston 1997, 150).
This is an important point. Unfortunately, it is not clear whether or not it could be extended to apply to all of our practical concerns, resting as it does solely on an analysis of self-concern. Indeed, there may well be other person-related practices and concerns that aren't part of that network of self-referential concerns, including, perhaps, moral responsibility, compensation, third-person reidentification, and general survival. For these other practices and concerns, then, the metaphysics of identity may still be quite relevant (and perhaps revisionary). (D. Shoemaker 2007, 343-347). This is a complex matter, but in any event Johnston's challenge has to be reckoned with by defenders of the standard methodology.
In this section we have examined a variety of challenges to the standard methodological view, all suggesting in one way or another that, if there even is a relation here, it runs from ethics to metaphysics, that is, ethics is methodologically prior to, and informs, constrains, or renders practically moot our metaphysics. What we have seen, though, is that the success of these arguments is far from established, and that despite their urgings we may still have some reason to maintain (however tentatively) the belief that ethics is grounded in personal identity, although the nature of that grounding relation deserves much more attention and the ethical concerns at issue may be absent a uniform relation to identity, an issue to which we now turn in the conclusion.
As should by now be obvious, the relation between personal identity and ethics is complex and by no means established, and this is true for several reasons. First, it is unclear what the correct theory of personal identity is, or even what the right sense of “identity” (numerical or narrative) is that's to be deployed. Second, there is a question about how the relation between identity and ethics should be built up. In other words, should we establish the true theory of identity before applying it to ethics, should we constrain our theory of identity in light of our ethical concerns, or should we try to build up theories of both identity and our ethical concerns in light of one another (via a sort of reflective equilibrium)? Third, it is unclear what the precise type of relation is that we should expect between identity and ethics, i.e., should it be a justificatory relation or an explanatory relation? If the former, how exactly do we bridge the is/ought gap between descriptive metaphysics and normativity? If the latter, what precisely is to be explained, and how would appeals to identity help? Fourth, are we right to think of there being the relation between identity and ethics at all?
This last point deserves much more discussion than it has previously received. It has generally been assumed that if there is a relation between identity and our practical concerns, it is some sort of univocal relation, running from a single (correct) theory of personal identity to all of our person-related practical concerns (whether it's a grounding relation, an explanatory relation, or something else). But why should we think this is the case? Instead, why not think that some practical concerns bear a relation to one criterion or sense of identity, while other practical concerns bear a relation to a different criterion or sense of identity?
Here is just one way in which this might be true. My concern about anticipation of survival seems to depend on a belief about some future person bearing a certain sort of psychological relation to me. What would render such anticipation rational, then, might be the numerical identity relation as construed on the Psychological Criterion. Alternatively, what grounds compensation might be the Biological Criterion of personal identity. The possibility of compensation, after all, may not be restricted to benefits and burdens distributed solely to psychological creatures: as mentioned earlier, I may deserve compensation as an adult for what happened to me as a fetus, and this may be rendered coherent only on a criterion of personal identity according to which I am essentially a biological human organism. Finally, consider moral responsibility. It seems platitudinous that I can be responsible only for my own actions, but this suggests that what's at issue is the ownership relation of moral agents to their actions, the issue of what makes some past action properly attributable to me, a robust sort of person. But this relation may best be handled by something like a narrative conception of personal identity, one that answers to the characterization question, not the reidentification question.
These sketches suggest the possibility, then, of a plurality of relations between identity and ethics (D. Shoemaker 2007). If so, perhaps the way to proceed is to focus on one specific person-related practical concern at a time and work out its relation to identity (if any) before moving on to others. While this approach will not diminish the complexity of the relation(s) between identity and ethics, perhaps it will at least provide the kind of settled views in some limited areas which we have thus far been missing.
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Butler, Joseph: moral philosophy | communitarianism | identity | identity: relative | Kant, Immanuel: moral philosophy | Locke, John | moral responsibility | personal identity | Reid, Thomas | temporal parts
The author is deeply grateful to Nicole Smith for her valuable and thorough research assistance during the preparation of this entry.