Causation in the Law

First published Thu Nov 8, 2001; substantive revision Wed Nov 17, 2010

The basic questions dealt with in this entry are: (i) whether and to what extent causation in legal contexts differs from causation outside the law, for example in science or everyday life, and (ii) what are the appropriate criteria in law for deciding whether one action or event has caused another, (generally harmful) event. The importance of these questions is that responsibility in law very often depends on showing that a specific action or event or state of affairs has caused specific harm or loss to another. Are the criteria adopted in deciding these causal issues both objective and properly attuned to the function of fixing responsibility?

The entry covers the nature and functions of causation, the relation between causation and legal responsibility, and the criteria for the existence of causal connection in law. The last topic is treated in two parts: what are causally relevant conditions (‘causes-in-fact‘) and what are the grounds for limiting responsibility (the ‘proximate cause’ requirement).


1. Nature and Functions of Causation

Law is concerned with the application of causal ideas, embodied in the language of statutes and decisions, to particular situations. This involves, first, a conception of what a cause is outside the law. To this a variety of answers empirical (Hume) and metaphysical (Kant ) have been given and each has its contemporary supporters.

Secondly, a theory is required of how causal notions should function in different contexts. In the context of application the notion of cause is a multi-purpose tool. One function, perhaps fundamental, is forward-looking: that of specifying what will happen and by what stages if certain conditions are present together. This use of cause serves to provide recipes and make predictions. It also yields the idea of a causal process. Another function is backward-looking and explanatory: that of showing which earlier conditions best account for some later event or state of affairs. A third function is attributive: that of fixing the extent of responsibility of agents for the outcomes that follow on their agency or intervention in the world.

For the first of these purposes the emphasis falls on a cause as consisting of the whole complex of conditions required if a certain outcome is to follow (J.S. Mill). Even when applied to a specific situation this involves considering what generally happens when certain conditions are present. In the second, explanatory, context the focus is on selecting from the whole complex the particular condition or conditions that best explain a given outcome. The aim can be either to explain a class of events or a particular event. In the third, attributive, context the aim is again selective, but from a different point of view. It is to attribute responsibility to an agent for those outcomes that his, her or its agency serves to explain and that can therefore plausibly be treated as part of the agency's impact on the world. Here the purpose is to settle the extent of responsibility that attaches to a particular human action or other event or state of affairs. This responsibility is then attributed to an agent or, metaphorically, to the other event or state of affairs in question (e.g. outbreak of war, high unemployment).

In law the second and third of these functions of the notion of cause are prominent, often in combination. Many legal inquiries are concerned to explain how some event or state of affairs came about, especially an untoward event such as death or a state of affairs such as insolvency. But in law the third function is particularly salient and controversial. Whether someone is liable to punishment or to pay compensation or is entitled to claim compensation often depends on showing whether the person potentially liable or entitled has caused harm of a sort that the law seeks to avoid. For example, all systems of law hold that a person can be guilty of homicide only if he or she has caused another's death. All systems treat it as a more serious offence to cause death than to attempt to do so. It is a civil wrong to cause injury to another by negligence in driving a vehicle, but the claim is barred or reduced if the negligent conduct of the person injured is also a cause of the injury. An insurer is required to pay for losses caused by an event of the type defined in the insurance policy, such as fire or flooding, but not if the cause of the loss is something else.

The attribution of responsibility on causal grounds is not confined to law. Historians and moralists, for example, assess the responsibility of agents for the outcomes, political, social, economic or military of what they did or failed to do. Unlike lawyers, they are concerned with responsibility for good as well as bad outcomes. Some writers (e.g. Moore) propose a general theory of causation in relation to responsibility. But whereas historians may aim to assess the outcome of an agent's conduct over a period or even a lifetime, law focuses on the harmful outcomes of particular actions. These uses of causation by historians, moralists and lawyers raise the question, adumbrated by Collingwood, of whether the attribution of responsibility requires a different conception of cause from that employed for prediction or explanation. In the legal theory of causation this problem is of central importance.

2. Causation and Legal Responsibility

When rules of law attributing responsibility for harm caused are formulated in statutes, regulations and judicial decisions, the word ‘cause’ is often used. The notion that causal connection between agency and harm must be established is however often implied even when the word is not used. This is true, for example, of the use of verbs such as ‘damage’, which imply a causal relation between an agency and the harm done. In legal contexts the possible range of agency is not confined to human conduct, but may extend to damage done by the agency of juristic persons, animals, inanimate objects such as motor vehicles and inanimate forces such as fire. In all these instances the use of the notion of cause is central to the legal inquiry, since to establish responsibility it must be shown that the harm was done or brought about by the agency that the law treats as a potential basis for the existence or extent of liability.

The relationship between causing harm and legal responsibility is however complex. The complexities concern the incidence of responsibility, the grounds of responsibility, the items between which causal connection must be demonstrated, and the variety of relationships that can in some sense be regarded as causal. So far as the incidence of responsibility is concerned, while in law the relevant causes may be human or animal behaviour or natural events or processes, legal responsibility attaches in modern law only to natural persons (human beings) and juristic persons such as states, corporations and other institutions to which personality is ascribed in law.

As regards the grounds of responsibility it is important to grasp that for a person to cause harm or loss to another (the term ‘harm’ will be used for short) is in law neither a necessary nor a sufficient condition of being legally responsible for the harm. It is not a necessary condition for two reasons. First, in legal contexts people are often made responsible for harm caused by other persons (e.g. the vicarious liability of employers for employees), animals (e.g. the bite of a dangerous dog), inanimate objects (e.g. the collapse of buildings, the impact of vehicles) or processes (e.g. fire, subsidence). In these instances the ground of responsibility is, from the point of view of the person held responsible, not that he, she or it has caused harm but that they bear the risk that some other person, animal, thing or process may cause harm. The risk may be voluntarily assumed, as in insurance contracts, or may be imposed by law, as in the case of employers' liability for wrongs committed by employees in the course of their employment. Much law is indeed concerned with the distribution of social risks. The responsibility of the person who bears the risk may be additional or alternative to the responsibility of the person (if any) who wrongfully caused the harm in question. Thus, if an employer is responsible for harm caused by his or her employee to another person the employee may or may not also be legally responsible for that harm. In law the main grounds of responsibility for harm are therefore (i) an agent's personal responsibility for causing harm and (ii) a person's responsibility arising from the fact that he, she or it bears the risk of having to answer in legal proceedings for the harm in question.

A second reason why causing harm is not a necessary condition of legal responsibility is that there are many contexts in which a person is civilly or criminally responsible irrespective of whether any harm has been caused by their conduct or that of an agency for which they are responsible. Thus, in Anglo-American law those who trespass on another's land or who break a contract may be civilly liable and those who unlawfully possess firearms criminally liable though no tangible harm is thereby caused to anyone. Both inside and outside the law many actions are regarded as wrongful whether or not they cause tangible harm. Moreover the imposition of penalties in civil law and of punishments in criminal law need not bear any relation to the harm (if any) caused by the conduct for which the penalty or punishment is imposed.

To cause harm to another is also not a sufficient condition of legal responsibility, even in the eyes of those, such as the early Epstein, who would in general favour making agents strictly liable for the harm they cause. For a person to be legally responsible for causing harm to another requires, apart from a number of conditions relating to jurisdiction, procedure and proof, that the conduct should be of the sort that the law designates as unlawful (e.g. negligent driving) or as a potential source of liability (e.g. keeping a dangerous animal). It also requires that the purpose of the law should encompass harm of the sort for which a remedy is sought. Thus, in some contexts only physical, not economic or psychological harm grounds a legal remedy. Moreover considerations of morality must not rule out liability, as they well might if, for example, a burglar were to claim compensation for an injury suffered while breaking a window in order to enter the victim's house.

There is also a complication concerning the items between which causal connection must in law be shown to exist. The inquiries with which law is concerned relate to particular events. Did one action, event, process or state of affairs (event for short) cause another? The link that must be established in legal proceedings between events is of a special type. A person's conduct or a natural event or process can always be described in a number of different ways, but only certain descriptions of an alleged cause are crucial in legal proceedings. For example, if a claim for damages is brought against a motorist for causing injury to the claimant by driving negligently, only that description of his or her manner of driving that amounts to negligence is capable of constituting a relevant cause. Hence ‘On 5 March at 5 p.m. Smith drove at sixty miles an hour in a built-up area’ may be relevant while ‘;Smith drove a Mercedes’ may not be, though both correctly describe Smith's act of driving a car on the occasion in question. In a legal context, therefore, the link to be established must be framed in terms of a link between particular aspects of events. The claimant in a civil action will typically argue, for example, that the fact that Smith drove at sixty miles an hour in a built-up area on such-and-such an occasion caused the collision that in turn caused the victim to suffer a broken leg. Though it is controversial whether causal connection is to be conceived as a relation between events or facts (Davidson), in law both are relevant. The events in issue must be identified from the point of view of the time, place and persons involved, but the aspect of the events between which a causal link must be shown has to be specified in such a way as to show that it falls within the relevant legal categories, such as (in the example given above) negligence and physical injury.

The relationship between causing harm and legal responsibility is also complex because of the great variety of relationships between agency and harm that can be regarded as in some sense causal, or analogous to a causal relationship. An omission to prevent harm when the person concerned has a legal duty to prevent it can ground legal responsibility but would ordinarily be described as ‘not preventing’ rather than causing the harm. Again, legal responsibility is often imposed, in the context of interpersonal relationships, on those who influence others by advising, encouraging, helping, permitting, coercing, deceiving, misinforming or providing opportunities to others that motivate or enable them to act in a way that is harmful to themselves or to others. Whether complicity in the agency of another can be regarded as causal or analogous has been denied (Moore) but defended (Gardner). In some cases (coercion, deceit) the persons held responsible would naturally be said to have caused the persons influenced to act as they did, while in others they would not, though the weaker interpersonal relationship is in some respects analogous to more plainly causal relationships. Failing to help or provide opportunities to others by advising, warning, informing or rescuing them or supplying them with agreed goods and services are other grounds of responsibility for negative agency that, again, are at least analogous to causal relationships. The existence of this wide spectrum of causal or near-causal grounds of responsibility recognised in law and morality raises the question whether any uniform theory of causation is capable of accounting for all of them.

3. Criteria for the Existence of Causal Connection in Law

The theories concerning the criteria for the existence of causal connection in law fall into two classes. Some focus on the type of condition that the alleged cause must constitute in relation to the alleged consequence. Others are concerned with a specific feature that the cause must possess in relation to the consequence in order that causal connection may be made out. The first class of theory concerns the identification of the causally relevant conditions of an outcome, or, in the language of causal minimalists, ‘cause-in-fact’. Must the cause be a necessary condition, a sufficient condition or a necessary member of a set of conditions that are together sufficient for the outcome? In law these terms, much discussed in the philosophical literature, are interpreted as meaning ‘necessary or sufficient in the particular circumstances in issue’. The inquiry will be, for example, into what was necessary or sufficient to cause a particular person's death on a given occasion, not what are in general the necessary and sufficient conditions of death.

The second type of theory concerns the criteria for determining the limits of legal responsibility for causing harm. Even supposing that the alleged cause constitutes the right sort of condition of the outcome (e.g. a necessary condition), responsibility cannot extend indefinitely. The failure of a doctor to prescribe an effective contraceptive cannot be held to be responsible for the death of the victim of a murder committed by the child conceived as a result of the doctor's negligence. Some consequences are ‘too remote’. But what are the appropriate criteria of limitation?

In many legal contexts and in the view of many theorists a single criterion is called for. It should be remembered, however, that the search for a single criterion may be no more than a response to legal doctrine. This sometimes requires all the limiting factors to be brought under a single umbrella, such as ‘proximate cause’ or ‘adequate cause’ even though, underlying these phrases, there are a number of distinct reasons for imposing limits on the extent of responsibility. A number of expressions are used to describe the allegedly single limiting factor, in particular ‘proximate (adequate, direct, effective, operative, legal, responsible)’ cause in contrast with ‘remote, indirect or legally inoperative’ causes.

Some theorists (for example Leon Green and others since the 1920s up to Wright and Stapleton today) hold that only the issue of causally relevant condition or cause-in-fact is genuinely causal. It alone raises questions to which an objective, scientifically valid, answer can be given (Becht and Miller). Even this has been questioned by Malone, who has pointed to the incorporation of normative considerations in the rules for proving cause-in-fact in civil law. These normative considerations are, however, more concerned with the rules of proof in law than with what has to be proved. The second type of theory concerns questions of responsibility that would in the view of these causal minimalists be better addressed directly rather than by asking whether on the facts a causal relation existed between agency and harm. One way of doing this is to ask what would be the fairest way of distributing the relevant social risks. Another (Posner) would be to place responsibility, especially in civil law, on the person best placed to avoid the loss most cheaply. In practice legislators and judges have seldom abandoned the traditional causal terminology in discussing the second issue, but the proposal to do so has been repeatedly revived.

3.1 Causally relevant conditions: ‘Cause-in-fact’

What sort of condition must be attributed to an agency for its action or intervention (action for short) to count as causal? Opinion is divided between those to whom the action must in the circumstances be necessary to the outcome (a but-for condition), those to whom it must in the circumstances form a necessary part of a complex of conditions sufficient for the outcome (a NESS condition), and those who would describe the required connection in a more quantitative or scalar mode by requiring that the action be a ‘substantial factor in’ or ‘contribute to’ the outcome.

The but-for theory, endorsed by many legal and philosophical theorists including Mackie, has the heuristic advantage that a simple and often reliable way of ruling out the existence of causal connection between agency and harm is to ask whether the harm would in the circumstances have occurred in the absence of the agency. If the harm would have occurred in any event the agency is probably not its cause or one of its causes. If it would not have occurred in the absence of the agency the agency will be a causally relevant condition or, if one endorses causal minimalism, a cause-in-fact of the harm.

There are however cases in which the but-for test is difficult to reconcile with our intuitive judgements of responsibility. These concern two types of case in particular, those of over-determination and of joint determination. If two huntsmen independently but simultaneously shoot and kill a third person, or two contractors independently fail to deliver essential building supplies on time, it is intuitively clear that each should be held responsible for the death or building delay. Yet the but-for test seems to yield the conclusion that neither has caused the harm. Again, in interpersonal relationships it is often the case that advice etc. can be regarded as contributing to a person's decision without its being shown that the person would not have acted as they did apart from the advice. Many reasons bear on the decisions we make. Sometimes it is not possible to be sure that in the absence of one of them the decision would have been different. We know only that to the person reaching the decision the reasons taken into account were jointly sufficient to induce him, her or it to decide as he or she did.

In reply it is argued (Mackie) that in these cases all the agencies that are singly or jointly sufficient for the outcome together constitute its cause. But in law this does not solve the problem because, unless the agents are acting in concert, the responsibility of each agency has to be independently established. This can be done either by an appeal to intuitive notions of responsibility or by recourse to an alternative ground of responsibility based on risk. On the alternative view an agency that provides an independently or jointly sufficient condition of harm bears the risk that that harm will eventuate even if it would in the circumstances have come about in any event.

Some of those who reject the but-for criterion (e.g. Hart and Honoré, Wright) have recourse to a theory based on J.S.Mill's notion of a jointly sufficient set of conditions. The theory also draws on Mackie's idea, in the context of causal generalisations, of an INUS condition (insufficient but non-redundant part of an unnecessary but sufficient condition). They advocate the view that in a specific situation a causally relevant condition is a necessary element of a set of conditions jointly sufficient for the harmful outcome. For this Wright's term NESS condition (necessary element of a sufficient set) is currently used, a NESS condition being a specific instance of an INUS condition. NESS supporters therefore appeal to the idea that particular causal links are instances of generalisations about the way in which events are connected. They argue that in order to test whether an outcome would have occurred in the absence of the agency in question it is necessary to make a counterfactual calculation, which can only be done on the basis of such generalisations.

Those who reject the NESS theory either assert that singular causal judgments do not depend on generalisations or point to the fact that reliable generalisations of the sort presupposed by it are in practice virtually confined to inorganic physical processes. Organic processes, such as those involved in the development of disease, and, still more, in decision-making by human beings, do not conform to settled patterns. The NESS theory therefore has at most a narrow range of application.

Some of those who are impressed by what they see as the deficiencies of both the but-for and NESS theories prefer a more quantitative or scalar approach, according to which an agency can be involved in (Stapleton) or contribute to (Moore) an outcome to a greater or less extent. They argue that an agency must be a substantial factor in the harmful outcome in order to be legally a cause of it. This approach has a particular attraction when a number of processes (e.g. several fires or pollutants) merge to bring about harm. It enables distinctions to be made according to the extent of contribution of a particular process to the outcome. It also fits the rule that in most legal contexts an agency, in order to be responsible for the whole of the harm that ensues, need only be shown to be one of the causes of harm, not the sole cause. The criticism that can be made of this approach is that it presupposes an independent understanding of causes as necessary and/or sufficient conditions in relation to their consequences.

Difficult legal problems arise in certain cases of overdetermination, often termed those of ‘overtaking causes’ or ‘causal preemption’. Suppose that a lethal dose of poison is given but the victim is fatally wounded before the poison takes effect. The pre-empting, not the pre-empted condition is taken to be the cause of the death. Which condition is taken to preempt the other is sometimes controversial but it is clear than in reaching a decision attention must be paid to the stages and processes by which the alleged causes lead to the harmful outcome.

To summarise, the idea that responsibility should depend on the agent's having changed the course of events points in the direction of the but-for theory. The function of cause in relation to recipes and prediction points towards the NESS theory. The phenomenon of multiple causes, which have often to be weighed against one another, points to a quantitative theory. But whichever is favoured has to be applied in the light the law's commitment to vindicating rights and securing a fair distribution of risks.

3.2 ‘Proximate cause’

The theories about the specific qualities that an agency must possess in relation to the outcome in order to be its cause in law are in Anglo-American law often grouped under this rubric, though many other terms (e.g. adequate, direct, efficient, operative, legal, responsible) are also found in the literature. These limiting theories are invoked because if every causally relevant condition (cause-in-fact) is treated as grounding responsibility for the outcomes to which it is causally relevant the extent of legal responsibility will extend almost indefinitely. (This alarming scenario would however be subject to independent legal requirements as regards proof, type of damage and lapse of claims through the passage of time). The theories in question therefore embody reasons for limiting the extent of legal responsibility. The reasons adduced for limiting responsibility are however differently viewed by different theorists. Causal minimalists treat all these theories as non-causal, in the sense that they embody grounds of legal policy other than the policy of holding the agent responsible for the harm caused by their action or intervention. Others treat some of the suggested limiting factors as causal and others as non-causal. It is indeed not open to dispute that at least two non-causal factors limit the extent of legal responsibility. One is the scope and purpose of the rule of law in question. No rule is intended to give a remedy for every conceivable type of harm or loss. Another concerns the aspiration of the law to achieve results that are morally unobjectionable. This rules out certain claims that would be inequitable on the part of the claimant or unfair towards the agent. It needs to be stressed that the grounds for limiting responsibility will not necessarily be the same in every branch of the law. In particular, the greater the weight attached to considerations of risk distribution the more likely it is that different limits will be appropriate in, for example, criminal, civil and public law.

3.3 Allegedly causal grounds of limitation

Certain theorists reject causal minimalism, which involves a restricted notion of cause that is current in no extra-legal context. They propose grounds of limitation that reflect the causal judgements that would be made outside the law. They claim that these grounds have a basis in ordinary usage (Hart & Honoré) or in the metaphysics of causation (Moore). The chief grounds proposed are that responsibility is limited (i) when a later intervention of a certain type is a condition of the harmful outcome (ii) when the agency has not substantially increased the probability of the harmful outcome that in fact supervenes and (iii) when the causal link involves a series of steps and ultimately peters out, so that the outcome is too remotely connected with the alleged cause. They argue that in these cases the agency, though a causally relevant condition, did not cause the outcome.

The idea that responsibility is excluded when the harm in question was conditioned by a later intervention is conventionally expressed by saying that an intervening or superseding cause broke the causal link between agency and outcome. These ‘breaks’ are not conceived as physical discontinuities in the course of events. The metaphor derives rather from the fact that in an explanatory context a cause may be regarded as an intervention in the normal course of events. The most persuasive explanations of an outcome are those that point to a condition that is abnormal or unexpected in the context or to a deliberate action designed to bring the outcome about. An action of this sort has been described as voluntary in a broad, Aristotelian sense, a use that has attracted criticism. If these criteria are then applied in attributive contexts, an agency will not be regarded as the cause of an outcome when that outcome is explained by a later abnormal action or conjunction of events or a deliberate intervention designed to bring it about. A later event of this sort is contrasted with a state of affairs (e.g .victim's thin skull) existing at the time of the alleged cause. The latter, however extraordinary, does not preclude the attribution of the outcome to which it contributes to the alleged cause. In practice this notion is widely applied in both civil and, as Kadish has shown, criminal law. The use of these criteria of intervention in legal systems is said to be derived from common sense and to be consistent with treating causal issues in law as questions of fact. It is also supported (Honoré) on the ground that to attribute only a limited range of outcomes, whether achievements or failures, to human agents fosters a sense of personal identity that would be lost if the attribution to agents was not limited in this way. If there were not such a limiting factor we should have to share our successes and failures with many other people of whom it could be said that but for their actions what we think of as ‘our’ distinctive successes and failures would not have occurred. For example the success of a student in an examination would be equally the achievement of all those (parent, teacher, doctor, grant-giver, girl/boy friend) who made it possible for the student to succeed. It would not be specially the student's.

The criticism of this notion of later intervention takes two forms. First, the criteria set out are too vague to govern decision in controversial cases. Their application presents not a question of fact, not even of what is socially regarded as a fact (Lucy), but a decision, often controversial, to impose or restrict liability. Suppose that a motorist negligently injures a pedestrian, who is then taken to hospital and wrongly treated for the injury. Instead of asking whether the mistaken treatment was so abnormal as not to be accounted a consequence of the motorist's negligent driving it would, in the critics' eyes, be better to ask whether the risk of medical mistreatment should be borne exclusively by the hospital authorities. Secondly, even if the criteria suggested for selecting certain conditions as causes are in place in explanatory inquiries they are not necessarily so in attributing responsibility. There is no good reason to transfer them from an explanatory to an attributive context. To do so in civil law may result in saddling a person guilty of momentary carelessness with massive losses (Waldron).

Another limiting notion that has some claim to be regarded as causal is that of probability. According to the adequate cause theory, put forward by the physiologist Von Kries in 1886, developed systematically by Träger and advocated in a contemporary form by Calabresi, an agency is a cause only if it significantly increases the objective probability of the outcome that in fact ensues. Objective probability is here contrasted with subjective foreseeability, but this probability must be relative to an assumed epistemic base. It is inevitably a matter of policy which base to choose, and whether to include information not known or not available to the agent when he or she or it acted. Responsibility is excluded in relation to an outcome the probability of which was not substantially increased by the agency in question. This theory, long orthodox in German civil law, but increasingly supplemented by policy-oriented criteria, is intuitively attractive when the agent wrongfully exposes someone to a risk of harm to which they would not otherwise be exposed. For example, the agent wrongfully obstructs a pathway so that the claimant is forced to take a more dangerous route along a canal, and falls into the canal, sustaining injury. The obstructer is then the adequate cause of the injury. But one who wrongfully delays a passenger who is as a result obliged to board a later airplane, which crashes, is not the adequate cause of the passenger's death in the crash. At least on the basis of information available at the time, the probability of being killed in an air crash was not substantially increased by the delay.

There are however instances in which an agency substantially increases the probability of harm but the harm that occurs would intuitively be attributed to a later intervention. Suppose, for example, that in the example given a passer-by deliberately threw the claimant into the canal. It would be natural to attribute any injury suffered by the claimant not to the obstruction of the pathway but to the act of the third person. This objection can be met by having recourse to the risk theory, a version of the probability theory with strong support in Anglo-American writing in both criminal and civil law (Keeton, Seavey, Glanville Williams). According to this theory responsibility for harmful outcomes is restricted to the type of harm the risk of which was increased by the agency's intervention. The harm must be ‘within the risk’. But much then turns on how the agent's conduct and the risk are defined. Is the risk of falling into the canal different from the risk of being pushed into it?

As stated earlier, in law responsibility for harm can rest on risk allocation as well as on causation. The risk theory has merits that are independent of its claim to explain what it is for an agency to cause harm. It can be treated as illustrating a wider principle that responsibility for harm is confined to the type of harm envisaged by the purpose of the rule of law violated (Normzweck), a theory espoused in Germany (Von Cämmerer, J.G.Wolf). For example, if a rule requiring machinery to be fenced is designed to prevent harmful contact between the machinery and the bodies of workmen, a workman who suffers psychological harm from the noise made by the unfenced machine cannot ground a claim for compensation on the failure to fence. The fencing requirement was not designed to reduce noise, even though a proper barrier would have reduced the noise to such an extent as to avoid the psychological trauma.

The limitations set by the purposes of legal rules cannot be regarded as causal. They vary from one branch of the law and one legal system to another. It is true that sometimes the purpose of legal prohibition may be the simple one of imposing responsibility for the harm caused by a breach of that prohibition. In that case the limits set by causal and purposive criteria coincide. But even in such a case it is a matter of legal policy which types of harm are to be compensated or to lead to criminal liability. The purposive limits on responsibility have therefore either to be regarded as additional to those (later intervention, heightened probability) proposed by those who reject causal minimalism, or as replacing them. The latter view is consistent with causal minimalism.

Other proposed criteria of limitation are based on moral considerations. Theorists who regard fault as an essential condition of criminal or civil responsibility often argue that a person should not be liable for unintended and unforeseeable harm. There are problems about settling whether only the type of harm or the specific harm must be unforeseeable, and the moment at which foreseeability is to be judged. But foreseeability, though it bears some relation to probability, is clearly a non-causal criterion, and one that can apply only to human conduct, not to other alleged causes. Moreover some supporters of the risk theory argue that different criteria should govern the existence and extent of legal liability. Even if the foreseeability of harm is a condition of liability, sound principles of risk allocation place on the agent who is at fault in failing to foresee and take precautions against harm the risk that an unforeseeable extent of harm will result from his or her fault, provided that this is of the type that the rule of law in question seeks to prevent.

There is no reason to suppose that the law, when it engages in explanatory inquiries, adopts different criteria of causation from those employed outside the law in the physical and social sciences and in everyday life. However, even here, requirements of proof may lead to a divergence, for example, between what would medically be treated as the cause of a disease and what counts in law as its cause. As regards attributive uses of cause, the fact that the law has to attend simultaneously both to the meaning of terms importing causal criteria and to the purpose of legal rules and their moral status makes the theory of causation a terrain of debate which does not at present command general agreement and is likely to remain controversial (e.g. Stapleton, Wright, Moore, Gardner, Honoré).

Bibliography

  • Becht, A.C., and F.W. Millar, The Test of factual Causation in Negligence and Strict Liability (St. Louis: Committee on Publications, Washington University, 1961.
  • Brudner, A., ‘Owning Outcomes: On Intervening Causes,Thin Skulls and Fault-undifferentiated Crimes, Canadian Journal of Law and Jurisprudence, 11 (1998): 89–114.
  • Calabresi, G., ‘Concerning Cause and the Law of Torts’ University of Chicago Law Review, 43 (1975): 69–108.
  • Cämmerer, E. von, Das Problem des Kausalzusammenhange im Rechte, besonders im Strafrechte, Karlsruhe: Verlag C.F.Muller, 1956.
  • Coase, R.H., ‘The Problem of Social Cost’, Journal of Law and Economics, 3 (1960): 1–44.
  • Collingwood, R.G., An Essay on Metaphysics, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1940.
  • Donald Davidson, ‘Causal Relations’ in Essays on Actions and Events, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980.
  • Epstein, R.A., ‘A Theory of Strict Liability’, Journal of Legal Studies, 2 (1973): 151–204.
  • –––, ‘Causation and Corrective Justice. A reply to two Critics’, Journal of Legal Studies, 8 (1979): 477–504.
  • Gardner, J., ‘Moore on Complicity and Causality’, University of Pennsylvania Law Review PENNumbra, 156(2008): 432–443.
  • Green, L., Rationale of Proximate Cause, Kansas City: Vernon Law Book Company, 1927.
  • –––, ‘The Causal Relation Issue in Negligence Law’ Michigan Law Review, 60 (1962): 543–576.
  • Hart, H.L.A., and Tony Honoré, Causation in the Law, 2nd ed., Oxford: Clarendon, 1985.
  • Honoré, A.M. (Tony), ‘Causation and Remoteness of Damage’, International Encyclopedia of Comparative Law, Vol. XI, Ch. 7, The Hague: M. Nijhoff, 1971.
  • –––, ‘Necessary and Sufficient Conditions in Tort Law’, in Philosophical Foundations of Tort Law, D. G. Owen (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995, pp. 363–385.
  • Kadish, S., ‘Causation and Complicity: A Study in the Interpretation of Doctrine’, California Law Review, 73 (1985): 323–410.
  • –––, ‘A Theory of Complicity’, in Issues in Contemporary Legal Philosophy: The Influence of H.L.A. Hart, Ruth Gavison (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1987, pp. 287–303.
  • Keeton, R.E., Legal Cause in the Law of Torts, Columbus: Ohio State University Press, 1963.
  • Kries, J. von, “Über den Begriff der objektiven Möglichkeit und einiger Anwendungen desselben”, Vierteljahrsschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie, 12 (1888), 179–140, 187–323, 393–428.
  • Landes, W., and R. Posner, ‘Causation in Tort Law; An Economic Approach’, Journal of Legal Studies, 12 (1983): 109–134.
  • Lucy, W., ‘Conduct and Causation’, in Philosophy of Private Law, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2007, ch.6.
  • Mackie, J.L., The Cement of the Universe. A study of Causation, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1974, 1980.
  • Malone, W.S., ‘Ruminations on Cause-in-fact’ Stanford Law Review, 9 (1956–7): 60–99.
  • Moore, M.S., Causation and Responsibility. An Essay in Law, Morals and Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2009.
  • Peczenik, A., Causes and Damages, Lund, Juridiska Föreningen i Lund, 1979.
  • Posner, R.A., ‘A Theory of Negligence’, Journal of Legal Studies, 1 (1972): 29–96.
  • Seavey, W., ‘Mr Justice Cardozo and the Law of Torts’, Harvard Law Review, 52 (1939): 371–407.
  • Stapleton, J., ‘Law, Causation and Common Sense’, Oxford J. Legal Studies, 8 (1988): 111–131
  • –––, ‘Legal cause: Cause-in-Fact and the Scope of Liability for Consequences’, Vanderbilt Law Review, 54 (2001): 941–000.
  • –––, ‘Unpacking Causation’, in Relating to Responsibility, P. Cane & J. Gardner (eds.), Oxford: Hart Publishing, 2001, pp. 145–185.
  • –––, ‘Choosing what we mean by “Causation” in the Law’, Missouri Law Review 73 (2008): 433–480.
  • Träger, L. Der Kausalbegriff im Straf- und Zivilrecht, Marburg: Elwert, (1904).
  • Waldron, J., ‘Moments of Carelessness and Massive Loss’, in Philosophical Foundations of Tort Law, D. G. Owen (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995, pp. 387–408.
  • Williams, G., ‘The Risk Principle’, Law Quarterly Review, 77 (1961): 179–212.
  • Wolf, J.G., Der Normzweck im Deliktsrecht. Eine Diskussionsbeitrag, Göttingen, 1962.
  • Wright, R.W., ‘Causation in Tort law’, California Law Review, 73 (1985): 1737–1828.
  • –––, ‘Causation, Responsibility, Risk, Probability, Naked Statistics, and Proof: Pruning the Bramble Bush by Clarifying the Concepts’, Iowa Law Review, 73 (1988): 1001–1077.
  • –––, ‘Once More into the Bramble Bush: Duty, Causal Contribution and the extent of Legal Responsibility’, Vanderbilt Law Review, 54 (2001): 1071–1132.
  • –––, ‘The NESS account of Natural Causation: a Response to Criticisms’: Perspectives on Causation (Hart Publishing, forthcoming 2010)

Academic Tools

sep man icon How to cite this entry.
sep man icon Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society.
sep man icon Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO).
sep man icon Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

causation: counterfactual theories of | causation: probabilistic | causation: the metaphysics of | moral responsibility | risk

Copyright © 2010 by
Antony Honoré <tony.honore@law.ox.ac.uk>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free