In contemporary political thought, the term ‘civil rights’ is indissolubly linked to the struggle for equality of American blacks during the 1950s and 60s. The aim of that struggle was to secure the status of equal citizenship in a liberal democratic state. Civil rights are the basic legal rights a person must possess in order to have such a status. They are the rights that constitute free and equal citizenship and include personal, political, and economic rights. No contemporary thinker of significance holds that such rights can be legitimately denied to a person on the basis of race, color, sex, religion, national origin, or disability. Antidiscrimination principles are thus a common ground in contemporary political discussion. However, there is much disagreement in the scholarly literature over the basis and scope of these principles and the ways in which they ought to be implemented in law and policy. In addition, debate exists over the legitimacy of including sexual orientation among the other categories traditionally protected by civil rights law, and there is an emerging literature examining issues of how best to understand discrimination based on disability.
- 1. Rights
- 2. Free and Equal Citizenship
- 3. Discrimination
- 4. Sexual Orientation
- 5. Disability
- 6. Legal Cases and Statutes
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- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Until the middle of the 20th century, civil rights were usually distinguished from ‘political rights’. The former included the rights to own property, make and enforce contracts, receive due process of law, and worship one's religion. Civil rights also covered freedom of speech and the press (Amar 1998: 216–17). But they did not include the right to hold public office, vote, or to testify in court. The latter were political rights, reserved to adult males. Accordingly, the woman's emancipation movement of the 19th century, which aimed at full sex equality under the law, pressed for equal “civil and political equality” (Taylor 1851/1984: 397 emphasis added)
The civil-political distinction was conceptually and morally unstable insofar as it was used to sort citizens into different categories. It was part of an ideology that classified women as citizens entitled to certain rights but not to the full panoply to which men were entitled. As that ideology broke down, the civil-political distinction began to unravel. The idea that a certain segment of the adult citizenry could legitimately possess one bundle of rights, while another segment would have to make do with an inferior bundle, became increasingly implausible. In the end, the civil-political distinction could not survive the cogency of the principle that all citizens of a liberal democracy were entitled, in Rawls's words, to “a fully adequate scheme of equal basic liberties” (2001: 42).
It may be possible to retain the distinction strictly as one for sorting rights, rather than sorting citizens (Marshall, 1965; Waldron 1993). But it is difficult to give a convincing account of the principles by which this sorting is done. It seems neater and cleaner simply to think of civil rights as the general category of basic rights needed for free and equal citizenship. Yet, it remains a matter of contention which claims are properly conceived as belonging to the category of civil rights (Wellman, 1999). Analysts have distinguished among “three generations” of civil rights claims and have argued over which claims ought to be treated as true matters of civil rights.
The claims for which the American civil rights movement initially fought belong to the first generation of civil rights claims. Those claims included the pre-20th century set of civil rights — such as the rights to receive due process and to make and enforce contracts — but covered political rights as well. However, many thinkers and activists argued that these first-generation claims were too narrow to define the scope of free and equal citizenship. They contended that such citizenship could be realized only by honoring an additional set of claims, including rights to food, shelter, medical care, and employment. This second generation of economic “welfare rights,” the argument went, helped to ensure that the political, economic, and legal rights belonging to the first generation could be made effective in protecting the vital interests of citizens and were not simply paper guarantees.
Yet, some scholars have argued that these second-generation rights should not be subsumed under the category of civil rights. Thus, Cranston writes, “The traditional ‘political and civil rights’ can…be readily secured by legislation. Since the rights are for the most part rights against government interference…the legislation needed had to do no more than restrain the executive's own arm. This is no longer the case when we turn to the ‘right to work’, the ‘right to social security’ and so forth” (1967: 50–51).
However, Cranston fails to recognize that such first-generation rights as due process and the right to vote also require substantial government action and the investment of considerable public resources. Holmes and Sunstein (1999) have made the case that all of the first-generation civil rights require government to do more than simply “restrain the executive's own arm.” It seems problematic to think that a significant distinction can be drawn between first and second-generation rights on the ground that the former, but not the latter, simply require that government refrain from interfering with the actions of persons. Moreover, even if some viable distinction could be drawn along those lines, it would not follow that second-generation rights should be excluded from the category of civil rights. The reason is that the relevant standard for inclusion as a civil right is whether a claim is part of the package of rights constitutive of free and equal citizenship. There is no reason to think that only those claims that can be “readily secured by legislation” belong to that package. And the increasingly dominant view is that welfare rights are essential to adequately satisfying the conditions of free and equal citizenship (Marshall 1965; Waldron 1993; Sunstein 2001).
In the United States, however, the law does not treat issues of economic well-being per se as civil rights matters. Only insofar as economic inequality or deprivation is linked to race, gender or some other traditional category of antidiscrimination law is it considered to be a question of civil rights. In legal terms, poverty is not a “suspect classification.” On the other hand, welfare rights are protected as a matter of constitutional principle in other democracies. For example, section 75 of the Danish Constitution provides that “any person unable to support himself or his dependents shall, where no other person is responsible for his or their maintenance, be entitled to receive public assistance.” And the International Covenant on Economic, Social, and Cultural Rights (see Other Internet Resources) provides that the state parties to the agreement “recognize the right of everyone to an adequate standard of living for himself and his family, including adequate food, clothing and housing, and to the continuous improvement of living conditions.”
A third generation of claims has received considerable attention in recent years, what may be broadly termed “rights of cultural membership.” These include language rights for members of cultural minorities and the rights of indigenous peoples to preserve their cultural institutions and practices and to exercise some measure of political autonomy. There is some overlap with the first-generation rights, such as that of religious liberty, but rights of cultural membership are broader and more controversial.
Article 27 of the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights (see Other Internet Resources) declares that third-generation rights ought to be protected:
In those States in which ethnic, religious or linguistic minorities exist, persons belonging to such minorities shall not be denied the right, in community with the other members of their group, to enjoy their own culture, to profess and practice their own religion, or to use their own language.
Similarly, the Canadian Charter of Rights and Freedoms protects the language rights of minorities and section 27 provides that “This Charter shall be interpreted in a manner consistent with the preservation and enhancement of the multicultural heritage of Canadians.” In the United States, there is no analogous protection of language rights or multiculturalism, although constitutional doctrine does recognize native Indian tribes as “domestic dependent nations” with some attributes of political self-rule, such as sovereign immunity (Oklahoma Tax Commission v. Citizen Band Potawatomi Indian Tribe).
There is substantial philosophical controversy over the legitimacy and scope of rights of cultural membership. Kymlicka has argued that the liberal commitment to protect the equal rights of individuals requires society to protect such rights, suitably defined (1989; 1994; 1995). He distinguishes among three sorts of rights that have been claimed as part of this third generation by various groups whose culture differs from the dominant culture of a country: (1) rights of self-government, involving a claim to a degree of political autonomy to be exercised through the minority culture's own of institutions, (2) polyethnic rights, involving special claims by members of the minority culture to assist in their integration into the larger society, and (3) representational rights, involving a special claim of the minority culture to have its members serve in legislatures and other political bodies (1995: 27–33). Kymlicka argues that these three sorts of group rights can, in principle, be justified for those populations that he designates as “national minorities,” such as native Americans in the United States and the Québécois and Aboriginals in Canada. A national minority is “an intergenerational community, more or less institutionally complete, occupying a given territory or homeland, [and] sharing a distinct language and history”(18). Kymlicka contends that “granting special representational rights, land claims, or language rights to a [national] minority … can be seen as putting … [it] on a more equal footing [with the majority], by reducing the extent to which the smaller group is vulnerable to the larger” (36–37). Such special rights do not involve granting to the national minority the authority to take away the civil rights of its members. Rather, the rights are “external protections,” providing the group with powers and immunities with which it can protect its culture against the potentially harmful decisions of the broader society (35).
In contrast to national minorities, immigrants who have left their original cultures are entitled only to a much more limited set of group rights, according to Kymlicka. These “polyethnic rights” are claims to have certain adjustments or accommodations made in the prevailing laws and regulations so as give individuals access to mainstream institutions and practices. Thus Kymlicka thinks that Orthodox Jews in the U.S. Armed Forces should have the legal right to wear a yarmulke while on duty and Canadian Sikhs have a legitimate claim to be exempt from motorcycle helmet laws (31).
Waldron (1995) criticizes Kymlicka for exaggerating the importance for the individual of membership in her particular culture and for underestimating the mutability and interpenetration of cultures. Individual freedom requires some cultural context of choice, but it does not require the preservation of the particular context in which the individual finds herself. Liberal individuals must be free to evaluate their culture and to distance themselves from it.
Kukathas criticizes Kymlicka for implying that the liberal commitment to the protection of individual rights is insufficient to treat the interests of minorities with equal consideration. Kukathas contends that “we need to reassert the importance of individual liberty or individual rights and question the idea that cultural minorities have collective rights” (1995: 230). But the system of uniform legal rules that he endorses would keep the state from intervening even when a minority culture inflicts significant harm on its more vulnerable members, e.g., when cultural norms strongly discourage females from seeking the same educational and career opportunities as males.
Barry (2001) asserts that “there are certain rights against oppression, exploitation, and injury, to which every single human being is entitled to lay claim, and…appeals to cultural diversity and pluralism under no circumstances trump the value of basic liberal rights” (132–33). The legal system should protect those rights by impartially imposing the same rules on all persons, regardless of their cultural or religious membership. Barry allows for a few exceptions, such as the accommodation of a Sikh boy whose turban violated school dress regulations, but thinks that the conditions under which such exceptions will be justified “are rarely satisfied” (2001: 62). Barry's position reflects and elaborates Gitlin's earlier condemnation of views advocating distinctive rights for cultural and ethnic minorities. Gitlin condemned such views on the ground that they represent a “swerve from civil rights, emphasizing a universal condition and universalizable rights, to cultural separatism, emphasizing difference and distinct needs” (1995: 153).
At the other end of the spectrum, Taylor (1994) argues for a form of communitarianism that attaches intrinsic importance to the survival of cultures. In his view, differential treatment under the law for certain practices is sometimes justifiable on the ground that such treatment is important for keeping a culture alive. Taylor goes as far as to claim that cultural survival can sometimes trump basic individual rights, such as freedom of speech. Accordingly, he defends legal restrictions on the use of English in Quebec, invoking the survival of Quebec's French culture.
However, it is unclear why intrinsic value should attach to cultural survival as such. Following John Dewey (1939), Kymlicka (1995) rightly emphasizes that liberty would have little or no value to the individual apart from the life-options and meaningful choices provided by culture. But both thinkers also reasonably contend that human interests are ultimately the interests of individual human beings. In light of that contention, it would seem that a culture that could not gain the uncoerced and undeceived adherence of enough individuals to survive would have no moral claim to its continuation. Legal restrictions on basic liberties that are designed to perpetuate a given culture have the cart before the horse: persons should have their basic liberties protected first, as those protections serve the most important human interests. Only when those interests are protected can we then say that a culture should survive, not because the culture is intrinsically valuable, but rather because it has the uncoerced adherence of a sufficient number of persons.
The treatment of blacks under slavery and Jim Crow presents a history of injustice and cultural annihilation that is similar in some respects to the treatment of Native Americans. However, civil rights principles played a very different role in the struggle of Native Americans against the injustices perpetrated against them by whites.
Civil rights principles demand inclusion of the individuals from a disadvantaged group in the major institutions of society on an equal basis with the individuals who are already treated as full citizens. The principles do not require that the disadvantaged group be given a right to govern its own affairs. A right of political self-determination, in contrast, demands that a group have the freedom to order its affairs at it sees fit, and, to that extent, political self-determination has a separatist aspect, even if something less than complete sovereignty is involved.
The pursuit of civil rights by American blacks overshadowed the pursuit of political self-determination. The fact that American blacks lacked any territory of their own on which they could rule themselves favored the civil rights strategy, although arguments were made that there was sufficient geographical concentration of blacks in certain parts of the South (the so-called “Black Belt”) for the African-Americans there to form their own self-governing nation. Thus, shortly after World War II, Harry Haywood advocated black political self-determination on the ground that the only way to solve “the issue of Negro equality” was through their “full development as a nation” (1948: 143). But there was stronger support among American blacks for a strategy that demanded their inclusion as free and equal citizens in the body politic of the United States. The civil war amendments, and the civil rights laws that accompanied them, promised such inclusion, and, in their struggle to defeat Jim Crow, blacks repeatedly called upon white Americans live up to the promise. Equal civil and political rights for blacks as individuals, and integration into the mainstream institutions of society, rather than separate nationhood, was the goal of most American blacks, as shown by the widespread support among blacks for their civil rights movement.
For America's blacks during the 1950's and 60's, the alternative to the civil rights movement was not the intolerable perpetuation of Jim Crow, but rather a form of black nationalism, the main goal of which was obtaining increased resources from the broader society for black institutions and communities. Black self-government along the lines suggested by Haywood did not seem politically possible to most blacks during the civil rights era, but resources for strengthening black businesses and schools and improving black housing was a quite reasonable demand to make on whites. And so many black nationalists argued that, unless and until black communities and their institutions were strengthened, the promise of racial justice through integration and equal civil rights for individuals would prove hollow (Ture and Hamilton).
Valls has recently developed a “liberal black nationalism” (2010: 479) by adapting Kymlicka's account of group rights and arguing that, because American blacks are kind of national minority victimized by historical injustice at the hands of the white population, “justice demands the support of black institutions and communities by the broader society” (474). After this support is forthcoming, Valls contends, individual blacks will be in position to make a free and fair choice as whether, and to what degree, to participate in black institutions and to live in black communities or to become integrated into racially-mixed areas of society. But Elizabeth Anderson has argued, against black nationalism, that segregation is a “fundamental cause of social inequality and undemocratic practices,” (2010: 2) and “[c]omprehensive racial integration is a necessary condition for a racially just future” (189). Anderson's argument entails that Vall's form of black nationalism is self-defeating: segregation itself works to prevent the white support for black communities and institutions for which such nationalism calls. However, her argument is consistent with Tommie Shelby's “pragmatic nationalism,” which holds that “black solidarity is merely a contingent strategy for creating greater freedom and social equality for blacks, a pragmatic but principled approach to achieving racial justice” (2005: 10). Shelby's form of black nationalism endorses the liberal principles of free and equal citizenship for all individuals, as does Valls's version, but, unlike the latter, Shelby's account does not reject the integrationist strategy advocated by Anderson. At the same time, it is difficult to see how black equality can be achieved without a much greater investment of social resources in black neighborhoods and institutions, and, perhaps, Anderson and Shelby can agree with Valls on the need for such investment
In contrast to the civil rights movement of American blacks, Native Americans sought to mitigate the injustices perpetrated against them mainly by pursuing political self-determination, in the form of tribal self-rule. Even after the brutal tribal removals of the early 19th century and the efforts at the end of that century to destroy tribal control of lands through individual allotments, tribes still retained some territorial basis on which a measure of self-rule was possible. And during the black civil rights movement of the 1950's and 60's, there was tension between Native Americans and blacks due to their different attitudes toward self-determination and civil rights. Some Native Americans looked askance at the desire of blacks for inclusion and integration into white society, and they thought that the desire was hopelessly naïve (Deloria, 1988: 169–70). Such Native Americans were more in tune with radical black nationalists who favored Haywood's call for blacks to govern themselves politically in those jurisdictions where they were concentrated.
In 1968, Congress enacted an Indian Civil Rights Act (ICRA). The act extended the reach of certain individual constitutional rights against government to intratribal affairs. Tribal governments would for the first time be bound by constitutional principles concerning free speech, due process, cruel and unusual punishment, and equal protection, among others. Freedom of religion was omitted from the law as a result of the protests of the Pueblo, whose political arrangements were theocratic, but the law was a major incursion on tribal self-determination, nonetheless (Norgren and Shattuck, 1993: 169).
A married pueblo woman brought suit in federal court, claiming that the tribe's marriage ordinances constituted sex discrimination against her and other women of the tribe, thus violating the ICRA. (Santa Clara Pueblo v. Martinez) The ordinances excluded from tribal membership the children of a Pueblo woman who married outside of the tribe, while the children of men who married outsiders were counted as members. Martinez had initially sought relief in tribal forums, to no avail, before turning to the federal courts. The Supreme Court held that federal courts did not have jurisdiction to hear the case: the substantive provisions of the ICRA did apply to the Pueblo, but the inherent sovereign powers of the tribe meant that the tribal government had exclusive jurisdiction in the case. The ruling has been both questioned and defended by feminist legal scholars (MacKinnon, 1987; Valencia-Weber 2004).
In contrast to the United States, the Canadian Indian Act provides that men and women are to be treated equally when it comes to the band membership of their children (Johnston, 1995: 190). This law and the Santa Clara case raise the general issue of whether and when it is justifiable for a liberal state to impose liberal principles on illiberal (or not fully liberal) political communities that had been involuntary incorporated into the larger state. Addressing this issue, Kymlicka (1995) argues that “there is relatively little scope for legitimate coercive interference” because efforts to impose liberal principles tend to be counterproductive, provoking the charge that they amount to “paternalistic colonialism.” Moreover, “liberal institutions can only really work if liberal beliefs have been internalized.” Kymlicka concludes, then, that liberals on the outside of an illiberal culture should support the efforts of those insiders who seek reform but should generally stop short of coercively imposing liberal principles (1995: 167). At the same time, Kymlicka acknowledges that there are cases in which a liberal state is clearly permitted to impose its laws, citing with approval the decision in a case that involved the application of Canadian law to a tribe that had kidnapped a member and forced him to undergo an initiation ceremony (44).
Applying Kymlicka's general line of thinking might prove contentious in many cases. Consider Santa Clara. His arguments could be used to support the decision in that case: the exercise of jurisdiction might be deemed “paternalistic colonialism.” But one might argue, instead, that jurisdiction is needed to vindicate the basic liberal right of gender equality. However, it does seem that, if a wrong akin to kidnapping or worse is required before federal courts can legitimately step in, then the Santa Clara case falls short of meeting such a requirement. The argument might then shift to whether the requirement imposes an excessively high hurdle for the exercise of federal jurisdiction. Accordingly, Kymlicka's approach might not settle the disagreement over Santa Clara, but it does provide a very reasonable normative framework in terms of which liberal thought can address the difficult issues presented by the case and, more generally, by the problem of extending liberal principles to Native American tribes.
The term ‘Jewish emancipation’ refers to those political processes, occurring from the last decades of the 18th century to the second half of the 19th century, through which the Jews of Western and Central Europe (roughly: Britain, France, Belgium, Holland, Germany, Italy, Switzerland, and Austria-Hungary) attained equal rights under the law. Its first major event was the declaration of equal citizenship for Jews by the French National Assembly (1791). However, Jewish emancipation was not a single process but a collection of them, proceeding in different ways and at different rates in the different parts of the continent. It also involved considerable backsliding at various points.
From the 16th until end of the 18th century, Jews across Europe had been segregated by law into specified rural areas, towns, and city ghettos. They were prohibited from owning land or farming and from joining guilds, which monopolized craft production at the time. Severe restrictions were placed on their travel and special taxes imposed on them. More generally, Jews were regarded by the broader Christian society as an alien people, who had no right to be in Europe at all and could be legitimately expelled by any country that did not desire to tolerate their presence. And Jews were expelled at various times from many European jursidictions, including, England, Spain, Portugal, France, Holland and more than a few German and Italian states and cities. At the end of the 18th century, the German philosopher, Fichte, expressed a common view when he suggested that Jews were a “state within a state” and, addressing the Christians of Europe, asked rhetorically, “If you give [Jews] civic rights in your states, will not your other citizens be completely trod under foot?” (Fichte 1793/1995: 309)
In the areas they inhabited, Jews were permitted to organize themselves into self-governing communities, called kehillot, which had governing councils with the authority to impose and collect taxes and to punish Jews who had violated community norms and religious rules. The councils also had the power of excommunication, which involved prohibiting all members of the community from any interaction with the excommunicated individual (Katz 1961: chaps. IX-XI). And, although their communal autonomy had already begun to weaken in the 17th and 18th centuries (Ettinger 1976: 750), Jewish communities in Europe at the outset of emancipation fit the main features of groups that Kymlicka characterizes as “national minorities” with the right of self-government (1995: 18; see section 1.2 above).
During the period of emancipation, some Jews wanted to have strengthened “external protections” (see section 1.2 above) for their communal autonomy, but the main force of emancipation pushed in a different direction. Jewish emancipation was tied closely to the Enlightenment and the French Revolution, with their commitment to the equality and freedom of human individuals, and the dominant ethical concern of emancipation was not protection for communal autonomy but rather the attainment of equal rights. Still, Arendt argues that Jewish emancipation arose, not only from the political ideal of equality, but also from the European state's need for financial credit, which only Jews were prepared to meet at the time (1951/1976: 11–12). Accordingly, she claims that Jewish emancipation had an “ever-present equivocal meaning” (12): on the one hand, it could be construed as movement for equal rights, but, on the other, it could be seen as the bestowal of privileges on Jews by the ruling powers for services rendered.
This double meaning is reflected in the different understandings that Bruno Bauer and Karl Marx had of Jewish emancipation. Bauer, a German theologian and one of the left-wing “Young Hegelians,” complained that “[t]he emancipation problem has until now been treated in a basically wrong manner by considering it one-sidedly as a Jewish problem … Not only Jews but, we [Christians], also want to be emancipated.” (1843/1958: 63) Bauer regarded emancipation as an effort by Jews to gain special privileges that would allow them to continue living apart from Christian society, following their own comprehensive religious law. In Bauer's eyes, the Jews' idea that they were God's chosen people made a mockery of the suggestion that they could ever regard themselves as equal citizens, to be treated just the same as Christians. On the other hand, from Bauer's perspective, although Christianity was “the perfection of Judaism” (83) insofar as it did not treat any particular nation as the chosen people and offered salvation to all nations, Christians, too, were exclusionary in their own way, by regarding themselves as meriting a privileged political and legal status in contrast with non-Christians. For Bauer, then, the only route to genuinely free and equal citizenship under the law was for Jews to give up Judaism and not become Christians, and for Christian to simply give up Christianity.
In contrast, Marx, notwithstanding his hostility toward Jews and their alleged worship of money, criticized Bauer for thinking that free and equal citizenship depended upon citizens relinquishing their faiths. Marx, who was a fellow young Hegelian at the time, understood Jewish emancipation as part of a more general process in which “the state emancipates itself from religion” by no longer requiring its members to declare which faith they embrace and, instead, establishing a strict separation of church and state, such as was found in the United States (1843/1994: 5–8). Making religion legally and politically irrelevant, not making it disappear, was the aim and accomplishment of a democratic republic. The result, in Marx's eyes, was not that such a republic achieved the highest form of human freedom for its citizens,–for that achievement, religion would have to disappear, but a democratic republic could provide for its citizens the highest form of freedom possible within the context of a society dominated by money and the pursuit of profit.
Jewish emancipation was a success in certain respects, but, ultimately, a catastrophic failure. During the second half of the 19th century, Jews achieved equal rights under the law throughout Western and Central Europe and became integrated into the mainstream institutions of society. Their economic situation had improved dramatically over the course of the century, and they filled professional occupations, such as law and university teaching, which had previously been closed to them (Richarz 1975; Ettinger 1976). However, antisemitism remained a strong and growing social force, and political parties with explicitly antisemitic platforms first began to form and gain support in the latter part of the century (Arendt 1950/1976: 35–50). In response to the continued antisemitism, Theodore Herzl proposed Zionism as the solution, a movement to form an independent Jewish state in Palestine to which European Jewry could and should emigrate. The movement attracted some Jews and was strongly opposed by others. (Medez-Flohr and Reinharz 1995: chap. 10) But the ultimate failure of Jewish emancipation would occur prior to establishment of a Jewish state and would arrive with the rise of the Nazi Party to power. In little more than a decade, Jews went from being equal citizens of the European countries they inhabited to being a stateless people deprived of all legal rights and targeted for physical and cultural annihilation. No other civil rights movement has ever suffered such a devastating reversal, and only the military defeat of Nazi Germany prevented the total destruction of European Jewry.
Civil rights are those rights that constitute free and equal citizenship in a liberal democracy. Such citizenship has two main dimensions, both tied to the idea of autonomy. Accordingly, civil rights are essentially connected to securing the autonomy of the citizen.
To be a free and equal citizen is, in part, to have those legal guarantees that are essential to fully adequate participation in public discussion and decisionmaking. A citizen has a right to an equal voice and an equal vote. In addition, she has the rights needed to protect her “moral independence,” that is, her ability to decide for herself what gives meaning and value to her life and to take responsibility for living in conformity with her values (Dworkin, 1995: 25). Accordingly, equal citizenship has two main dimensions: “public autonomy,” i.e., the individual's freedom to participate in the formation of public opinion and society's collective decisions; and “private autonomy,” i.e., the individual's freedom to decide what way of life is most worth pursuing (Habermas: 1996). The importance of these two dimensions of citizenship stem from what Rawls calls the “two moral powers” of personhood: the capacity for a sense of justice and the capacity for a conception of the good (1995: 164; 2001: 18). A person stands as an equal citizen when society and its political system give equal and due weight to the interest each citizen has in the development and exercise of those capacities.
The idea of equal citizenship can be traced back to Aristotle's political philosophy and his claim that true citizens take turns ruling and being ruled (Politics: 1252a16). In modern society, the idea has been transformed, in part by the development of representative government and its system of elections (Manin: 1997). For modern liberal thought, by contrast, citizenship is no longer a matter of having a direct and equal share in governance, but rather consists in a legal status that confers a certain package of rights that guarantee to an individual a voice, a vote, and a zone of private autonomy. The other crucial differences between modern liberalism and earlier political theories concern the range of human beings who are regarded as having the capacity for citizenship and the scope of private autonomy to which each citizen is entitled as a matter of basic right. Modern liberal theory is more expansive on both counts than its ancient and medieval forerunners.
It is true that racist and sexist assumptions plagued liberal theory well into the twentieth-century. However, two crucial liberal ideas have made possible an internal critique of racism, sexism, and other illegitimate forms of hierarchy. The first is that society is constructed by humans, a product of human will, and not some preordained natural or God-given order. The second is that social arrangements need to be justified before the court of reason to each individual who lives under them and who is capable of reasoning. The conjunction of these ideas made possible an egalitarianism that was not available to ancient and medieval political thought, although this liberal egalitarianism emerged slowly out of the racist and sexist presuppositions that infused much liberal thinking until recent decades.
Many contemporary theorists have argued that taking liberal egalitarianism to its logical conclusion requires the liberal state to pursue a program of deliberately reconstructing informal social norms and cultural meanings. They contend that social stigma and denigration still operate powerfully to deny equal citizenship to groups such as blacks, women, and gays. Accordingly, Kernohan has argued that “the egalitarian liberal state should play an activist role in cultural reform” (1998: xi), and Koppelman has taken a similar position: “the antidiscrimination project seeks to reconstruct social reality to eliminate or marginalize the shared meanings, practices and institutions that unjustifiably single out certain groups of citizens for stigma and disadvantage” (1996: 8). This position is deeply at odds with at least some of the ideas that lie behind the advocacy of third-generation civil rights. Those rights ground claims of cultural survival, whether or not a culture's meanings, practices and institutions stigmatize and disadvantage the members of some ascriptively-defined group. The egalitarian proponents of cultural reconstruction can be understood as advocating a different kind of “third-generation” for the civil rights movement: one in which the state, having attacked legal, political and economic barriers to equal citizenship, now takes on cultural obstacles.
A cultural-reconstruction phase of the civil rights movement would run contrary to Kukathas's argument that it is too dangerous to license the state to intervene against cultures that engage in social tyranny (2001). It also raises questions about whether state-supported cultural reconstruction would violate basic liberties, such as freedom of private association. The efforts of New Jersey to apply antidiscrimination law to the Boy Scouts, a group which discriminates against gays, illustrates the potential problems. The Supreme Court invalidated those efforts on grounds of free association (Boys Scouts v. Dale). Nonetheless, it may be necessary to reconceive the scope and limits of some basic liberties if the principle of free and equal citizenship is followed through to its logical conclusions.
In liberal democracies, civil rights claims are typically conceptualized in terms of the idea of discrimination (Brest, 1976). Persons who make such claims assert that they are the victims of discrimination. In order to gain an understanding of current discussion and debate regarding civil rights, it is important to disentangle the various descriptive and normative senses of ‘discrimination’.
In one of its central descriptive senses, ‘discrimination’ means the differential treatment of persons, however justifiable or unjustifiable the treatment may be. In a distinct but still primarily descriptive sense, it means the disadvantageous (or, less commonly, the advantageous) treatment of some persons relative to others. This sense is not purely descriptive in that an evaluative judgment is involved in determining what counts as a disadvantage. But the sense is descriptive insofar as no evaluative judgment is made regarding the justifiability of the disadvantageous treatment.
In addition to its descriptive senses, there are two normative senses of ‘discrimination’. In the first, it means any differential treatment of the individual that is morally objectionable. In the second sense, ‘discrimination’ means the wrongful denial or abridgement of the civil rights of some persons in a context where others enjoy their full set of rights. The two normative senses are distinct because there can be morally objectionable forms of differential treatment that do not involve the wrongful denial or abridgement of civil rights. If I treat one waiter rudely and another nicely, because one is a New York Yankees fan and the other is a Boston Red Sox fan, then I have acted in a morally objectionable way but have not violated anyone's civil rights.
Discrimination that does deny civil rights is a double wrong against its victims. The denial of civil rights is by itself a wrong, whether or not others have such rights. When others do have such rights, the denial of civil rights to persons who are entitled to them involves the additional wrong of unjustified differential treatment. On the other hand, if everyone is denied his civil rights, then the idea of discrimination would be misapplied to the situation. A despot who oppresses everyone equally is not guilty of discrimination in any of its senses. In contrast, discrimination is a kind of wrong that is found in systems that are liberal democratic but imperfectly so: it is the characteristic injustice of liberal democracy.
The first civil rights law, enacted in 1866, embodied the idea of discrimination as wrongful denial of civil rights to some while others enjoyed their full set of rights. It declared that “all persons” in the United States were to have “the same right…to make and enforce contracts…and to the full and equal benefit of all laws…as is enjoyed by white citizens” 42 U.S.C.A. 1981. The premise was that whites enjoyed a fully adequate scheme of civil rights and that everyone else who was entitled to citizenship was to be legally guaranteed that same set of rights.
It is a notable feature of civil rights law that its prohibitions do not protect only citizens. Any person within a given jurisdiction, citizen or not, can claim the protection of the law, at least within certain limits. Thus, noncitizens are protected by fair housing and equal employment statutes, among other antidiscrimination laws. Noncitizens can also claim the legal protections of due process if charged with a crime. Even illegal aliens have limited due process rights if they are within the legal jurisdiction of the country. On the other hand, noncitizens cannot claim under U.S. law that the denial of political rights amounts to wrongful discrimination. Noncitizens can vote in local and regional elections in certain countries (Benhabib, 2006: 46), but the denial of equal political rights would seem to be central to the very status of noncitizen.
The application of much of civil rights law to noncitizens indicates that many of the rights in question are deeper than simply the rights that constitute citizenship. They are genuine human rights to which every person is entitled, whether she is in a location where she has a right to citizenship or not. And civil rights issues are, for that reason, regarded as broader in scope than issues regarding the treatment of citizens.
Antidiscrimination laws typically pick out certain categories such as race and sex for legal protection, define certain spheres such as employment and public accommodations in which discrimination based on the protected categories is prohibited, and establish special government agencies, such as the Equal Employment Opportunity Commission, to assist in the laws' enforcement. There are many questions that can be raised concerning the justifiability of such laws. Some of the central philosophical questions derive from the fact that the laws restrict freedom of association, including the liberty of employers to decide whom they will hire. Some have argued that the liberal commitment to free association requires the rejection of antidiscrimination laws, including those that ban employment discrimination such as the Civil Rights Act of 1964 (Epstein, 1992). Most liberals thinkers reject this view, but any liberal defense of antidiscrimination laws must cite considerations sufficiently strong to override the infringements on freedom of association that the laws involve.
There are two different approaches within liberal thought to the justification of antidiscrimination laws. Both approaches hold that, in certain important areas of life, such as employment opportunities and access to public accommodations, individuals have a moral right to be be legally protected against any disadvantage being imposed upon them on account of their race, sex, or membership in some other socially salient group. However, on one approach, the only genuine form of discrimination involves the action of an agent who aims at disadvantaging an individual on account of the individual's race, sex, etc. Such an action is often called “direct discrimination” (or, in American law, “disparate-treatment” discrimination). In contrast, the second approach holds that there is another form of discrimination from which individuals have a right to be protected against and which does not necessarily involve an agent who aims at disadvantaging them because of their race or sex or other social-group membership. Often called “indirect discrimination” (or, in American law, “disparate-impact” discrimination), this form is said to consist in actions, policies, or systems of rules that have the effect of disproportionately disadvantaging the members of a particular socially-salient group. Thinkers who take this second approach contend that antidiscrimination law should prohibit, not only direct discrimination, but the indirect form as well, while those who take the first approach deny that “indirect” discrimination really counts as discrimination at all. In its interpretation of the U.S. Constitution, the Supreme Court appears to have adopted the first approach (Balkin 2001), but many legal scholars endorse some version of the second in understanding the constitutional guarantee of equality (Karst 1989). (For a more complete examination of the distinction between direct and indirect discrimination and of the question of what makes discrimination a wrong against individuals, see the entry on discrimination.)
Many debates over civil rights issues turn on assumptions about the scope and effects of existing discrimination (i.e., objectionable disadvantageous treatment) against particular groups. For example, some thinkers hold that systemic discrimination based on race and gender is largely a thing of the past in contemporary liberal democracies (at least in economically advanced ones) and that the current situation allows persons to participate in society as free and equal citizens, regardless of race or gender (Thernstom and Thernstrom, 1997; Sommers, 1994). Many others reject that view, arguing that white skin privilege and patriarchy persist and operate to substantially and unjustifiably diminish the life-prospects of nonwhites and women (Bobo, 1997; Smith 1993). These differences drive debates over affirmative action, race-conscious electoral districting, and pornography, among other issues.
Questions about the scope and effects of discrimination are largely but not entirely empirical in character. Such questions concern the degree to which participation in society as a free and equal citizen is hampered by one's race or sex. And addressing that concern presupposes some normative criteria for determining what is needed to possess the status of such a citizen.
Moreover, there are subtle aspects of discrimination that are not captured by thinking strictly in terms of categories such as race, sex, religion, sexual orientation, and so on. Piper analyzes “higher-order” forms of discrimination in which certain traits, such as speaking style, come to be arbitrarily disvalued on account of their association with a disvalued race or sex (2001). Determining the presence and effects of such forms of discrimination in society at large would be a very complicated conceptual and empirical task. Additional complications stem from the fact that different categories of discrimination might intersect in ways that produce distinctive forms of unjust disadvantage. Thus, some thinkers have asserted that the intersection of race and sex creates a form of discrimination against black women which has not been adequately recognized or addressed by judges or liberal legal theorists. (Crenshaw, 1998) And other thinkers have begun to argue that our understanding of discrimination must be expanded beyond the white-black paradigm to include the distinctive ways in which Asian-Americans and other minority groups are subjected to discriminatory attitudes and treatment (Wu, 2002).
Among the most careful empirical studies of discrimination have been those conducted by Ayers (2001). He found evidence of “pervasive discrimination” in several types of markets, including retail car sales, bail-bonding, and kidney-transplantation. Yet, his assessment is that “we still do not know the current ambit of race and gender discrimination in America” (425).
Some civil rights laws in the United States protect persons from discrimination based on sexual orientation, but many people contest the legitimacy of the laws. The state of Colorado went so far as to ratify an amendment to its constitution that would prohibit any jurisdiction within the state from enacting a civil rights law that would protect homosexuals. The amendment was eventually invalidated by the U.S. Supreme Court on the ground that it was the product of simple prejudice and served no legitimate state purpose, thus violating the Equal Protection Clause (Romer v. Evans).
Much of the discussion of “gay rights” involves the question of whether sexual orientation is genetically determined, socially determined, or the product of individual choice. However, it is not clear why the question is relevant. The discussion appears to assume that genetic determination would vindicate the civil rights claims of gays, because sexual orientation would then be like race or sex insofar as it would be biologically fixed and immutable. But it is a mistake to think that racial or sex discrimination is morally objectionable because of the biological fixity or unchosen nature of race and sex. It is objectionable because it expresses ill-will or indifference, and it is unjust because it treats an individual in a morally arbitrary manner and, under current conditions, reinforces social patterns of disadvantage that seriously diminish the life prospects of many persons. The view that sexual orientation is like race or sex in a morally relevant way should focus on the analogous features of discrimination based on sexual orientation.
Wintermute (1995) and Koppelman (1994 and 1997) assert that discrimination based on sexual orientation is not just analogous to sex discrimination but that it is a form of sex discrimination. If it is legally permissible for Jane to have sex with John, then banning Joe's having sex with John would seem to amount to discrimination (disadvantageous treatment) against Joe on grounds of his sex. If Joe were a woman, his having sex with John would be permitted, so he is being treated differently because of his sex. However, Koppelman contends that this formal argument should be supplemented by more substantive ones referring to the systemic patterns of social disadvantage from which gays and lesbians suffer. In fact, one can argue that the treatment of gays and lesbians is an injustice to them as individuals and amounts to a systemic pattern of unjust disadvantage. The individual injustice arises from the arbitrary nature of denying persons valuable life-opportunities, such as employment and marriage, on the basis of their sexual orientation. The systemic injustice arises from the repeated and widespread acts of individual injustice.
The most controversial civil rights issues regarding sexual orientation concern the principle of equal treatment for same-sex and heterosexual couples. Most scholars endorse such a principle (Wardle 1996) and argue that equal treatment requires that same-sex marriages be legalized (Eskridge 1996). Moreover, it is often argued in the literature that a person's choice of sex partner is central to her life and protected under a right of privacy. In Bowers v. Hardwick, the United States Supreme Court rejected this argument, upholding the criminalization of homosexual sodomy. The decision was condemned by legal and political thinkers and was overturned by the Court in Lawrence v. Texas. The Court invoked the right of privacy in declaring the state's criminal ban on sodomy between same-sex partners. Nonetheless, some scholars who argue for the equal legal treatment of same-sex relations contend that privacy-based arguments are inadequate. They point out that one can hold the view that adults have a right to engage in same-sex intimacies even as one contends that such intimacies are morally abominable and ought not to receive any encouragement from government (Sandel 1996: 107; Koppelman 1997: 1646). Such a view would reject equal legal treatment for those in intimate same-sex relationships.
Finnis takes such a view, arguing that same-sex relations are “manifestly unworthy of the human being and immoral” and should not be encouraged by the state, but finding that criminalizing same-sex relations violates rights of individual privacy (1996: 14). Lee and George also find such relations to be morally defective and unworthy of equal treatment by the state (1997), though George (1993) does not think that any sound a priori principle prohibits criminalization.
Finnis, Lee and George argue for their condemnation of same-sex relations on the ground of natural law theory. However, unlike traditional versions of natural law theory, their version does not rest on any explicit theological or metaphysical claims. Rather, it invokes independent principles of practical reasoning that articulate the basic reasons for action. Such reasons are the fundamental goods that action is capable of realizing and, for Finnis, Lee and George, include “marriage, the conjuntio of man and woman” (Finnis 1996: 4). Homosexual conduct, masturbation, and all extra-marital sex aim strictly at “individual gratification” and can be no part of any “common good.” Such actions “harm the character” of those voluntarily choosing them (Lee and George, 1997: 135). In taking the actions, a person becomes a slave to his passions, allowing his reason to be overridden by his raw desire for sensuous pleasure.
On Finnis's account, when consensual sexual conduct is private, government may not outlaw it, but government “can rightly judge that it has a compelling interest in denying that ‘gay lifestyles’ are a valid and humanly acceptable choice and form of life” (1996: 17). And for Finnis, Lee and George, equal treatment of same-sex and heterosexual relations is out of the question due to the morally defective character of same-sex relations.
Macedo responds to Finnis by arguing that “all of the goods that can be shared by sterile heterosexual couples can also be shared by committed homosexual couples” (1996: 39). Macedo points out that Finnis does not condemn sexual intercourse by sterile heterosexual couples. But Finnis replies that there is a relevant difference between homosexual couples and sterile heterosexual ones: the latter but not the former are united “biologically” when they have intercourse. Lee and George make essentially the same point: only heterosexual couples can “truly become one body, one organism” (1997: 150). But Macedo points out that, biologically, it is not the man and woman who unite but the sperm and the egg (1996: 37). It can be added that the “biological unity” argument seems to run contrary to Finnis's claim that his position “does not seek to infer normative conclusions from non-normative (natural-fact) premises” (1997: 16). More importantly, Macedo and Koppelman make the key point that the human good possible through intimate relations is a function of “mutual commitment and stable engagement” (Macedo, 1996: 40) and that same-sex couples can achieve “the precise kind of human good” that is available to heterosexual ones (Koppelman, 1997: 1649; also see Corvino,2005). Accordingly, equal treatment under the law for same-sex couples, including the recognition of same-sex marriage, would remove unjustifiable obstacles faced by same-sex couples to the achievement of that human good.
The issue of same-sex marriage remains hotly contested in the courts and political arena. In response to political efforts in some states to legalize same-sex marriage, the U.S. Congress enacted the Defense of Marriage Act (DOMA), a statute restricting the term ‘marriage’ as it appears in national legislation and administrative policy to the union of a man and a woman. And the voters of California approved Proposition 8, an initiative amending the state's constitution to declare that “[o]nly marriage between a man and a woman is valid or recognized in California.” But, as of the time of this writing, a federal Circuit Court of Appeals has struck down the Proposition, writing, “Proposition 8 serves no purpose, and has no effect, other than to lessen the status and human dignity of gays and lesbians in California, and to officially reclassify their relationships and families as inferior to those of opposite-sex couples. The Constitution simply does not allow for ‘laws of this sort.’” (Perry v Brown, quoting Romer v. Evans). Additionally, two federal district courts have invalidated DOMA on constitutional grounds, and five states and the District of Columbia currently issue marriage licenses to same-sex couples. Internationally, same-sex couples also have the right to marry in Canada, Spain, Portugal, Iceland, Sweden, Norway, South Africa, Mexico and Argentina.
During the 1970's and 80's, persons with disabilities increasingly argued that they were second-class citizens. They organized into a civil rights movement that pressed for legislation that would help secure for them the status of equal citizens. Protection against discrimination based on disability was written into the Canadian Charter of Rights and Freedoms and The Charter of Fundamental Rights of the European Union. The disability rights movement in the U.S. culminated with the passage of the Americans With Disabilities Act of 1990 (ADA). The ADA has served as a model for legislation in countries such as Australia, India and Israel
The traditional model for understanding disability is called the “medical model.” It is reflected in many pre-ADA laws and in some philosophical discussions of disability which treat it as an issue of the just distribution of health care (Daniels, 1987). According to the medical model, a disabled person is one who falls below some baseline level that defines normal human functioning. That level is a natural one, on this view, in that it is determined by biological facts about the human species. Thus, the medical model supposes that the question of who counts as disabled can be answered in a way that is value-free and that abstracts from existing social practices and the physical environment those practices have constructed. It also gives the medical profession a privileged position in determining who is disabled, as the study and treatment of normal and subnormal human functioning is the specialty of that profession.
The consensus among current disability theorists is that the medical model should be rejected. Any determination that a certain level of function is normal for the species will presuppose judgments that do not simply describe biological reality but impose on them some system of evaluation. Moreover, the level of functioning a person can achieve does not depend solely on her own individual abilities: it depends as well on the social practices and the physical environment those practices have shaped.
Disability theorists thus posit an important analogy between the categories of ‘race’ and ‘disability’. As they understand it, neither category refers to any real distinctions in nature. Just as there is variation in skin color, there is variation in acuity of vision, physical strength, ability to walk and run and so on (Amundson, 2000). And just as there is no natural line dividing one “race” from another, there is no natural line dividing those who are functionally “abnormal” from those who are not so.
The rejection of the medical model has led to a “social model,” according to which certain physical or biological properties are turned into dysfunctions by social practices and the socially-constructed physical environment (Francis and Silvers, 2000). For example, lack of mobility for those who are unable to walk is not simply a function of their physical characteristics: it is also a function of building practices that employ stairs instead of ramps and by automotive design practices that require the use of one's legs to drive a car. There is nothing necessary about such practices. Accordingly, the social model conceives of disability as socially-imposed dysfunction.
The social model brings attention to how engineering and design practices can work to the disadvantage of persons with certain physical characteristics. And the idea of dysfunction is certainly a value-laden one. But it seems no more accurate to think that dysfunction is entirely imposed by society than it is to think that it is entirely the product of an individual's physical or mental characteristics. Individual characteristics in the context of the socially-constructed environment determine the level of functioning that a person can achieve (Amundson, 1992). And some individual characteristics would impair a person's functioning under all or almost all practicable alternatives to current social practices. Moreover, despite the fact that “normal human functioning” is a value-laden concept, it does not follow that it is entirely subjective or that reasonable efforts to specify the elements of some morally acceptable level of human functioning are misguided (Nussbaum and Sen, 1993). Indeed, some defensible understanding of what counts as better or worse human functioning would seem to be necessary to determine when some social practice has turned a physical (or mental) characteristic into a significant disadvantage for a person.
In addition, the social model's conception of what it is to be a disabled person seems overbroad. The social practice of requiring students to pass courses in order to receive a degree creates a barrier that some persons cannot surmount. It does not seem that such people are, ipso facto, disabled. Such examples of “exclusionary” social practices could be multiplied indefinitely. Some thinkers may not be troubled by the implication that everyone is disabled in every respect in which she is excluded or otherwise disadvantaged by some social practice. But it is difficult to see how the idea of disability would then be of much use.
The disability rights movement began with the idea that discrimination on the basis of disability was not different in any morally important way from discrimination based on race. The aim of the movement was to enshrine in law the same kind of antidiscrimination principle that protected persons based on their race. But some theorists have questioned how well the analogy holds. They point out that applying the antidiscrimination norm to disability requires taking account of physical or mental differences among people. This seems to be treatment based on a person's physical (or mental) features, apparently the exact opposite of the ideal of “colorblindness” behind the traditional antidiscrimination principle.
Even race-based affirmative action does not really seem to be parallel to antidiscrimination policies that take account of disability. Advocates of affirmative action assert that the social ideal is for persons not to be treated on the basis of their race or color at all. Race-conscious policies are seen as instruments that will move society toward that ideal (Wasserstrom, 2001).
In contrast, policies designed to counter discrimination based on disability are not sensibly understood as temporary measures or steps toward a goal in which people are not treated based on their disabilities. The policies permanently enshrine the idea that in designing buildings or buses or constructing some other aspect of our physical-social environment, we must be responsive to the disabilities people have in order for the disabled to have “fair equality of opportunity” (Rawls, 2001: 43–44). The need for a permanent “accommodation” of persons with disabilities seems to mark an important difference in how the antidiscrimination norm should be understood in the context of disability, as opposed to the context of race.
However, it is important to recognize that, at the level of fundamental principle, the reasons why disability-based discrimination is morally objectionable and even unjust are essentially the same as the reasons why racial discrimination is so. At the individual level, disadvantageous treatment of the disabled is often rooted in ill-will, disregard, and moral arbitrariness. At the systemic level, such treatment creates a social pattern of disadvantage that reduces the disabled to second-class status. In those two respects, the grounds of civil rights law are no different when it comes to the disabled.
Another way in which disability is thought to be fundamentally different from race concerns the special needs that the disabled often have that make life more costly for them. These extra costs would exist even if the socially-constructed physical environment were built to provide the disabled with fair equality of opportunity and their basic civil and political liberties were secured. In order to function effectively, disabled persons may need to buy medications or therapies or other forms of assistance that the able-bodied do not need for their functioning. And there does not seem to be any parallel in matters of race to the special needs of some of those who are disabled. The driving idea of the civil rights movement was that blacks did not have any special needs: all they needed was to have the burdens of racism lifted from them and, once that was accomplished, they would flourish or fail like everyone else in society.
However, Silvers (1998) argues that the parallel between race and disability still holds: all the disabled may claim from society as a matter of justice is that they have fair equality of opportunity and the same basic civil rights as everyone else. Any special needs that the disabled may have do not provide the grounds of any legitimate claims of justice. On the other hand, Kittay (2000) argues that the special needs of the disabled are a matter of basic justice. She focuses on the severely mentally disabled, for whom fair opportunity in the labor markets and political rights in the public sphere will have no significance, and on the families which have the responsibility of caring for the severely disabled. Pogge (2000) also questions Silvers' view, suggesting that it is implausible to deny that justice requires that society provide resources for meeting the needs of the severely disabled. Still, it may be the case that some version of Silvers' approach may be justifiable when it comes to disabled persons who have the capacity “to participate fully in the political and civic institutions of the society and, more broadly, in its public life” (Pogge, 2000: 45). In the case of such persons, the basic civil right to equal citizenship would require that they have the equal opportunity to participate in such institutions, regardless of their disability. Although there may be some aspects of the racial model that cannot be applied to persons with severe forms of mental disability, the principles behind the American civil rights struggles of the 1950's and 60's remain crucial normative resources for understanding and combating forms of unjust discrimination that have only more recently been addressed by philosophers and by society more broadly.
The emergence of the issue of disability rights has posed an important challenge for versions of liberalism inspired by the social contract tradition. One of the putative advantages of such forms of liberalism is that they better reflect strong and widely held intuitions about justice and individual rights than does utilitarianism. As Rawls famously wrote, “Each person possesses an inviolability founded on justice that even the welfare of society as a whole cannot override” (1999: 3). However, several thinkers have argued that Rawls's own theory does not make adequate room for the rights of the disabled.
Social contract theory is commonly divided between two competing versions: contractarianism and contractualism. The former represents principles of justice as principles that would be agreed to by rational and self-interested individuals for the regulation of a society in which they are to cooperate with one another (Gauthier 1986). The principles chosen will, like a typical contract, result from bargaining among the parties in which each party offers to bring something of value to the others (i.e., his potential cooperative efforts and the fruits thereof) on the condition that the others bring something of sufficient value to him. Thus, contractarian justice is justice understood in terms of mutual advantage. In contrast, contractualism represents principles of justice as principles that would be agreed to individuals who are not only advantage-seeking but also “reasonable,” in the sense that they are seeking terms of cooperation that can be justified to all of the parties as “free and equal citizens” (Rawls 1993: 48–54). Contractualist justice is justice understood in terms of mutual respect and reciprocity.
Contractarianism runs into the problem that (some of) the disabled might simply be excluded from the bargaining altogether, because they do not bring anything of sufficient value to the table to make it worthwhile for the parties to bargain with them. Thus, Nussbaum (2006) construes Rawls's theory as (in part) contractarian and criticizes it as exclusionary when it comes to the disabled. But Becker defends the contractarian view of justice in terms of mutual advantage, arguing that it can incorporate a conception of reciprocity sufficiently rich to underwrite principles that truly do justice to the disabled. Stark (2007) and Brighouse (2001) argue that Rawls's theory can be extended or modified to take account of disabled, without repudiating its contractarian core. But Hartley (2009a, 2009b, and 2011) construes Rawls's theory as a fully contractualist one and contends that almost all of the disabled can make a cooperative contribution in some area of social life, even if not in the market economy.
Kittay (1999 and 2001) agrees with the liberal idea that justice must not be sacrificed for other values, but she doubts that any form of liberalism can make adequate room for the claims of justice made on behalf of the severely disabled. In contrast, Silvers and Francis (2005) defend a form of contract theory in which the parties seek to build mutual trust. They argue that the interests of disabled would not be discounted in such a contract.
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