Comparative Philosophy: Chinese and Western

First published Tue Jul 31, 2001; substantive revision Thu Oct 1, 2009

Comparative philosophy brings together philosophical traditions that have developed in relative isolation from one another and that are defined quite broadly along cultural and regional lines — Chinese versus Western, for example. Several main issues about the commensurability of philosophical traditions make up the subject matter of comparative philosophy. One issue is methodological commensurability -- whether and how comparisons between different philosophical traditions, in this case the Chinese and Western, are to be conducted. Views run the gamut from those holding that meaningful comparisons cannot be conducted at all to those holding that the content of traditions must largely be the same. Other issues concerning commensurability concern specific subject matters of traditions. The issue of metaphysical and epistemological commensurability involves the comparison of traditions on their conceptions of the real and their modes of inquiry and justification. Ethical commensurability involves the comparison of these traditions on the matters of how people ought to live their lives, whether both traditions have moralities and if so how similar and dissimilar they are. The separation between these main issues is somewhat artificial, given that a discussion of methodological commensurability will inevitably involve the comparison of traditions on metaphysical, epistemological, and ethical matters. There is some heuristic value, however, in beginning with a general discussion of views on methodological commensurability with a brief illustration of how these views might be applied to some Chinese/Western comparisons. Subsequent sections will address Chinese-Western comparisons in metaphysics, epistemology, and ethics that have assumed special prominence in the literature.

Doing comparative philosophy well can be very difficult because of the vast range of texts and their intellectual and historical contexts it requires its practioners to cover. Oversimplifications, excessively stark contrasts, and illicit assimilations count as the most frequent sins. One benefit of comparative philosophy lies in the way that it forces reflection on the most deeply entrenched and otherwise unquestioned agendas and assumptions of one's own tradition. Another benefit at which its practioners often aim is that the traditions actually interact and enrich one another. Demands for rigor and depth of scholarship obviously rank as some of the most important standards applying to philosophy inquiry. The task of meeting these standards becomes more manageable as the field of inquiry narrows. Such a result can be legitimate but sometimes myopic and impoverishing.

1. Methodological Commensurability

Those arguing for radical incommensurability — the view that the questions and answers in one tradition cannot sustain meaningful statement in the other tradition — rely on the recognition of radical difference in basic concepts and modes of inquiry. Given such radical differences, they argue, there can be no cross-traditional reference to a common subject matter and to a truth about that subject matter that is independent of the basic conceptual vocabulary and theories and justificatory practices of a particular tradition (see Rorty, 1989, and Shweder, 1989). Looking for a possible Chinese-Western instance of radical incommensurability, one might go to Daoist texts such as the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi. When it is said in chapter one (as traditionally arranged and on one translation) of the Daodejing that “The Way that can be spoken of is not the constant Way,” or in chapter two that the “sages abide in nonaction and practice the teaching that is without words,” one is finding something different from the usual in Western texts infused with ideals of discursive rationality and argumentation. Or consider the Lunyu or Analects 1:2, where the importance of rightly ordered family relations is emphasized for right order in the state (“He who has grown to be a filial son and respectful younger brother will be unlikely to defy his superiors and there has never been the case of someone inclined to defy his superiors and stir up a rebellion”). The prominent and enduring place of this theme of state as family writ large sets that tradition apart from Western contractual traditions that have come to emphasize right order in the state as that which can be ratified by an uncoerced agreement among equals concerned to protect their private interests. Opponents of radical incommensurability will level the charge that it presupposes a hyperdramatic contrast between traditions. For example, the Western tradition has not lacked for skeptics on the power of discusive rationality, and some of these skeptics have nevertheless believed in a mode of veridical access to something of supreme significance — to a powerful experience within themselves or to something much larger outside themselves. At the same time, it must be noted that the positive theme is more recessive in the Western tradition and appears mainly in theistic versions, as it does in Plotinus (Enneads), Meister Eckhart (Von unsagbaren Dingen) and Hildegaard of Bingen (Scivias). Similarly, the Western tradition has certainly housed strains of thought that do view the state as more of a natural outgrowth of small human groups such as family and community. Even a major modern figure such as David Hume (Treatise of Human Nature, 3.2.2) explicitly rejects the idea of contract as central to understanding the origin or justification of social and political bonds. There might still be a difference between Chinese and Western traditions with respect to which strains of thought become dominant or at least prevalent, but that difference does not appear to come under the heading of radical incommensurability..

Samuel Fleischacker (1992) proposes a more moderate version of incommensurability — sometimes we can understand others just well enough to know that we don't understand them. His argument has roots in Wittgenstein's view that knowledge depends on a background of shared assumptions and standards of evidence. “World pictures” are embedded within cultures. Our world picture involves not only a distinctive set of beliefs about the world but also an ordering of interests that determines how we go about trying to have reliable beliefs. This ordering differs from those dominant in other cultures. We in the West have given precedence to our interests in “egalitarian knowledge” (wanting and believing that people have roughly equal access to the truth) and in prediction and control of this-worldly objects. The world pictures of other cultures embody other interests, and we may not be able to prove that they are wrong, or indeed, we may be unable to fully understand why it is that they value the interests they value so highly. Nevertheless, we understand that they do value these interests highly and think they are wrong to do so. We make such judgments despite our merely partial understanding because we tend to see a certain set of interests as the proper guide for a minimally decent or sensible human life.

The idea that the distinctive character of a “world picture” lies partly in the interests they embody seems plausible. Daoism and Confucianism, at least after a certain stage in the development of these schools, exemplify the way that a set of interests intertwine with beliefs about the world. Both schools exemplify in different ways a conception of understanding the world that is inseparable from the interest in coming into “attunement” with it, to use a felicitous word from Charles Taylor (1982). To become attuned to the world is to see its goodness and to know one's place in the order of the world. To say that Daoists exemplify this theme about seeing the goodness of the world is in a way misleading, since there is in the Daodejing and Zhuangzi a profound mistrust of our conceptual separations between opposites such as good and bad. However, as has been noted many times, the notion of “nonaction” or wuwei does not denote literal inaction but presupposes something like the possibility of an unforced acting with the grain of things, and that presupposes that it is possible to become attuned to that grain while in a state of awareness that is not cluttered by distorting conceptual oppositions. Both Daoist texts straightforwardly recommend wuwei and in this sense presuppose the goodness of the world and the way its “grain” goes. Confucian texts uphold the ideal of a different kind of attunement, under which the world and its order can be called good without the ambiguity that Daoist skepticism with conceptual opposition creates. For example, the Mencius (the name is actually a latinization given by Christian priests for ‘Mengzi’) presents a theory that human nature contains the germs or sprouts of goodness, tendencies to certain feelings and judgments such as manifested by the feeling of compassion for a child about to fall into a well. These sprouts are in human nature because they were sent by tian (literally meaning ‘sky’ but most often translated as ‘Heaven’ and perhaps best conceived as an impersonal ordering force of the universe). Taylor thinks that modern science has severed the connection between understanding and attunement. In Fleischacker's terms, modern science is predicated on different interests, prediction and control foremost among these interests. Taylor believes that the severance of understanding and attunement resulted in superior understanding at least of physical nature. But as he is careful to point out, no single argument can prove global superiority. If we can take attunement as an ideal, we have failed miserably, even as our technological control of nature has increased immeasurably. Perhaps, then, the contrast between a Chinese world picture in which attunement figures prominently and a modern scientific view predicated on the interests of prediction and control serves as an example of the sort of moderate incommensurability Fleischacker has in mind. One question to be raised about this kind of incommensurability, however, is whether it truly involves lack of understanding between traditions. Taylor himself draws examples of the theme of attunement from Plato and the European cultural tradition. Do we really fail to understand the appeal behind world pictures of attunement? Taylor's complex assessment suggests no inability on our part to understand the force behind both kinds of world pictures. Even to take the stance that attunement pictures are comforting illusions (an assessment less complex than the one Taylor adopts) is to suppose that one does understand the appeal behind them.

A different kind of incommensurability that may arise is not incomprehensibility between traditions but lack of common standards sufficient for settling significant conflicts between them. Alasdair MacIntyre (1988, 1989) has illustrated the difference between being able to understand a tradition and being able to translate all its claims into the language of another tradition by pointing to the possibility of “bilinguals” — people who, for example, might have been raised within one community and its tradition, and then through migration or conquest, become a member of another community and its different tradition. Such bilinguals might very well understand each tradition, and such understanding might include knowledge of those parts of each that cannot be translated into the language of the other. Such bilinguals would not encounter the sort of radical incommensurability constituted by incomprehensibility, but they may be unable to resolve conflicts of belief between the traditions, instead having to relativize the claims of each in some such form as “seems true to this particular community” or “seems justified to this particular community.” This kind of “evaluational” incommensurability, rather than meaning incommensurability, might fit better the case of world pictures based on attunement versus world pictures that sever the connection between understanding and attunement. MacIntyre himself presents a possibility for resolving such conflicts in case one tradition continually fails in its attempts to address certain key problems or issues. If another tradition has the conceptual resources to explain why it is that the first tradition continues to fail, then advocates of that first tradition may have to acknowledge its limitations and even transfer their allegiances. Whether that is the case for conflicts over attunement is not obvious (See Wong, 1989).

Moving to the end opposite from various forms of incommensurability, we find views holding that there must be substantial agreeement between traditions. The argument stems from a conception of the way interpretation works. We proceed on the assumption that the others we are interpreting live in the same world as we do.We subvert this assumption, however, if we attribute to them beliefs that substantially differ from our own. As Donald Davidson (1980) has argued, a belief is identified by its location in a pattern of beliefs, and it is this pattern that determines the subject matter of the belief, what the belief is about. If we attribute to others a pattern of beliefs that are different from our own, i.e., false beliefs, this tends to undermine the identification of the subject matter; to undermine, therefore, the validity of the belief as being about that subject. David Cooper (1978) applies a Davidsonian principle of charity to the question of whether different cultures have more or less the same morality. We can only identify others' beliefs as moral beliefs about a given subject matter if there is a massive degree of agreement between their and our beliefs about that subject matter. For Cooper this implies that the moral beliefs we attribute to others must be about something connected with welfare, happiness, suffering, security, and the good life. Michele Moody-Adams (1997) gives a more recent version of the same argument, starting with the premise that understanding others requires that there be quite substantial agreement about many of the basic concepts that are relevant to moral reflection. She concludes that “ultimate” or “fundamental” moral disagreement is not possible.

The way that an earlier example of putative radical difference can be questioned serves as some confirmation of this argument from charity for strong agreement between traditions. Confucian conceptions of the state as family writ large are not especially puzzling even when we do not subscribe to them. We find similar themes that have arisen within the Western tradition, and again, it is possible to conceive what the appeal would be. However, these points also raise certain doubts about the use of charity to argue for strong agreement. The fact that we can point to similar beliefs within our own tradition and that we can imagine what the appeal would lie behind such beliefs does not mean that we share those beliefs with others even as we attribute to them. Even if we were to share with them a belief in certain values, that would not necessarily mean that we place the same importance on those values relative to other values we (and perhaps they also) hold. It is often observed that a distinctive feature of the Chinese Confucian tradition is the very high value placed on filial piety. It is a common feature of many cultures that one should honor thy father and mother, of course, and it is not difficult to find analogies within American society to Confucian filial piety. At the same time, the Confucian tradition is unusual in the stringency of its duties to parents. The scope of filial duties includes taking care of what parents alone could have given one—one's body. Cengzi, one of Confucius' students, is portrayed in 8.3 of the Analects as gravely ill and near death. He bids his students to look at his hands and feet, and quotes lines from the Book of Poetry to convey the idea that all his life he has been keeping his body intact as part of his duty to his parents. It is only now near death, he says, that he can be sure of having been spared and thus fulfilling this duty to parents. This very idea, that one must keep one's body intact as a duty of gratitude to one's parents, has remained a central idea in Chinese culture. While American culture certainly contains similar themes of gratitude toward those from whom one has received great benefits, such themes do not necessite agreement on the centrality and stringency of filial duties in the Confucian tradition. Important kinds of moral difference, then, may consist in the differing emphases given to values that are shared across cultural traditions (Wong, 1996b). Thomas Kasulis (2002) puts a similar point in a visual metaphor: what is foreground in one culture may be background in another culture.

To accommodate this more subtle kind of difference, proponents of the principle of charity might point out that charity does not require complete agreement, but only “substantial” agreement or agreement on “ultimate” or “fundamental” disagreement. A further question that will pressed against this position is how much agreement is sufficient for identification of others' beliefs as being about the same subject matter as ours. We do attribute to others error and simple difference (without judging that someone is in error) of belief about the same subject matter. We can attribute error to others if we believe them to be in circumstances that encourage error, and we identify such types of circumstance from past experience of discovering ourselves to be in error. Furthermore, we attribute simple difference of belief when we recognize that there is a range of reasonable interpretations or weightings to be given to evidence.

In his later writings on charity (2001, p. 196), Davidson recognized its ambiguities, noting that he previously tended to construe it in terms of “maximizing” agreement in belief and that a more perspicuous statement of what he had in mind all along is that agreement in beliefs should be “optimized.” Rather than the “most” agreement, we need the “right sort” of agreement that enables understanding of others. We should try to reach agreement “as far as possible, subject to considerations of simplicity, hunches about the effects of social conditioning, and of course our common-sense, or scientific, knowledge of explicable error.” This very qualified formulation of charity amounts to the admission that the principle of charity itself needs interpretation and hence cannot be the ultimate standard for interpretation. Henry Richardson (1997) points out that interpreting a philosophical text requires taking account of the cognitive aims the authors had in writing what they did. Is it more charitable, Richardson asks, for a translator of Machiavelli's The Prince to resolve ambiguities and seek to maximize agreement between Machiavelli and ourselves? Or is it more charitable to set him out as intentionally provocative and deliberately cryptic? It should be unsurprising that charity cannot fulfill its promise as a firm and clear guide to interpretation. Charity bids us to render others like “us,” but “we” are already a diverse group who believe and want and value somewhat different things. That is, the range of the intelligibly human already embraces diversity (think of how impoverished our models of understanding would be if we could only rely on our individual selves). See Mou (2006) for a range of articles on the way that Davidson's interpretive principle and other aspects of his philosophy relate to Chinese philosophy.

An alternative to both the radical incommensurability and strong agreement positions is that there is no general answer on how much agreement or disagreement is to be found between complex and hetereogeneous traditions such as the Chinese and Western. As emerged above, one must distinguish between meaning and evaluational incommensurabilities. Furthermore, how much disagreement we will find not only depends on the particular subject matter but also on the answers we find most plausible within a larger context of inquiry: the attempt to explain others, their actions, practices, institutitions, and history. In such a larger context, attribution to others of beliefs different from ours may be more or less reasonable depending on how it fits into a reasonable explanation of them. And what counts as a reasonable explanation in particular cases will be set within the context of one's larger theories about persons and societies, among other things. One's explanation of people can reasonably attribute error or simple difference of belief on an indefinite number of important matters that might even deserve to be called ’fundamental’ as long as it seems plausible to attribute error or simple difference of belief to them in their epistemic situation as we construe it (see also Grandy, 1973). Or one's explanation can reasonably imply convergence or similarity of belief. An intermediate possibility is that the difference or similarity becomes more prominent as one defines the subject matter in a ‘thicker’ or ‘thinner’ way (Shun, 2004). Does the Chinese tradition recognize individual rights? The answer, as shall emerge below, may depend on how specifically one defines the notion of a right. If one defines a right rather thinly as what one has whenever one has justifiable claims on others to assure one's possession of things or one's exercise of certain capacities, then one can plausibly argue that there is a common notion of rights between the Chinese and Western traditions (Wong, 2004). If, on the other hand, one ‘thickens’ one's definition of rights with the idea that they are justifiable independently of what is a good and worthwhile life for human beings, then one plausibly argue against a common notion of rights.

2. Metaphysical and Epistemological Commensurability

One common portrait of the difference between the Chinese and Western traditions posits a radical incommensurability on the very nature of philosophical inquiry. Chinese philosophy is “wisdom” literature, composed primarily of stories and sayings designed to move the audience to adopt a way of life or to confirm its adoption of that way of life. Western philosophy is systematic argumentation and theory. Is there such a difference? One reason to think so is the fairly widespread wariness in Chinese philosophy of a discursive rationality that operates by deduction of conclusions about the particular from high-level generalizations. The seventeenth chapter of the Zhuangzi notes that the sage-king Yao looked for a suitable successor, found the perfect candidate in Shun, and then abdicated so that Shun could take over the throne. The result was glorious. However, when Kuai imitated Yao the result was disastrous. Tang and Wu were kings who fought and conquered. But Duke Bo also acted on that rule, fought, and lost. That is why it is impossible to establish “any constant rule.” Inspired by the achievement of insight or wisdom in some particular cases, we create general rules that we believe will work for many other cases in the future. The unfortunate result is that our original insights and wisdom are magnified beyond the scope of their applicability. Confucians are more willing to articulate their teachings in the form of principles, but such principles seem to function as designators of values or general considerations that ought to be given weight in judgments about what to do. Never lost is recognition of the necessity for the exercise of discretion in judgment according to the particular circumstances at hand. The best rules lose applicability in unusual circumstances. Rules and values conflict in many circumstances, and there are no “super-principles” to supply ready answers. The appropriate resolution to each conflict depends very much on the situation. In Mencius 7A35, Mencius is asked what the legendary sage-king Shun would have done if his father had killed a man.Mencius replies that the only thing to do would be to apprehend him. Shun could not interfere with the judge, who was acting on the law. However, Mencius continues, Shun would then have abdicated and fled with his father to the seacoast. As Mencius portrays it, then, Shun's actions strike a balance between the different values in tension with one another. The refusal to interfere with the judge is a way of acknowledging the necessity of impartially administering a social order. At the same time, fleeing with one's father is honoring the value of greater loyalty to family. Shun manages to honor both values at different moments in his dealing with the situation. Deduction from a principle could not yield such a balance. We are expected, however, to learn from stories such as Shun's, precisely because they function as concrete paradigms for judgment-making in the future. When we encounter situations that pose similar-looking conflicts between impartial concern and familial loyalties, we have Shun's judgment as a resource and a model. That model is not the same as a general principle that would deductively yield a judgment about what to do in the present situation. We must exercise judgment in determining whether new situations are similar enough to the case of Shun, and we must exercise judgment as to what actions would be parallel to Shun's actions.

Naes and Hanay (1972) have characterized Chinese philosophy as “invitational” in its method of persuasion, meaning that it portrays a way of life in a vivid fashion so as to invite the audience to consider its adoption. The Analects, for example, portrays the ideal of the junzi (often translated as “gentleman” but perhaps more accurately glossed as the noble person) as realized by persons of genuine substance who are undisturbed by the failure of others to recognize their merits (1.1: “To be undisturbed by others yet not complain, is this not the mark of the junzi?”). In the Mencius (2A2), such a person possesses a kind of equanimity or heart that is unperturbed by the prospects of fame and success. This unperturbed heart corresponds to the cultivation of one's qi (vital energies) by uprightness. One might be able to see such passages as appealing to experiences the audience might have in its encounters with persons who do seem to possess special strength, substance, and tranquillity through identification with and commitment to a cause they perceive to be far greater than themselves. One need not interpret such sayings as attempting to persuade by the pure emotive effect of certain words, as in propaganda. Rather, they may correspond to a way of doing philosophy that attempts to say something about values in life that can be supported by experience, even if not all testimony will agree (Kupperman, 1999). The Daoists recommend a way of life that they explicitly characterize as one that cannot be argued for, but their recommendation receives some support through commonly shared experience. Consider again the notion of wuwei and its illustrations in the Zhuangzi through stories of exemplary craft. Most famously, Zhungzi's Cook Ding cuts up an oxen so smoothly and effortlessly that his knife never dulls, and it is if he is doing a dance with his knife as it zips through the spaces between the joints. He does this not through “perception and understanding” but through the qi, the vital energies of the body. His marvelous skill is knowledge of how to adjust his own movements to the spaces within oxen so that he and the oxen form seamless wholes. Similarly, Woodcarver Qing has learned to prepare for carving his marvelous bellstands in such a way that he clears his mind of all distraction and sees the stand within the timber he has selected. Suggested here is a portrait of acting in the world that consists of complete and full attention to present circumstances so that the agent can act with the grain of things (the Cook Ding passage refers to tianli or heavenly patterns). Such a portrait does resonate with the actual experience of craftspeople, artists, athletes, musicians and dancers who have advanced beyond self-conscious technique and rule-following, who become fully absorbed in the experience of working with the material, the instruments or in the movement of their bodies, and who experience their actions as an effortless flow and in fact perform at very high levels. In such ways, Chinese thinkers draw a picture of the world that must in the end be evaluated by explanatory power in some very broad sense. We must ask whether the picture helps make sense of our experience of the world (again in a broad sense of ‘experience’ not limited to quantifiable observations in replicable experiments) and whether it preserves features of that experience that think are prima facie genuine.

So then, is it right to say that Chinese philosophy is invitational while Western philosophy is argumentative? One answer is that there is a difference but that it is more a matter of degree than an absolute contrast. It was Aristotle, after all, who said that discussions about the good in human life cannot be properly assimilated by the young because they do not have enough experience of life (Nichomachean Ethics I.3). And Plato despite his insistence on the centrality of argumentation to philosophy, dispatches the short analytical arguments presented in Book I of the Republic in favor of lengthy expository portraits of the ideal city-state and the harmonious soul for the rest of that work. Those portraits sometimes present only the thinnest of arguments for crucial premises, and at other times no argument at all. Some of his claims, about the divisive effects of family loyalties and the ill-effects of democracy, obviously appeal to experience, even if not all testimony will agree. In fact, it is hard work to find an acknowledged great in the Western tradition to whom such characterizations do not apply, at least to some degree. Sometimes, as in Spinoza (The Ethics), the contrast is glaring between the aspiration to prove points by way of deductive argument from self-evident axioms and the obvious source of those points from experience of life. It is true that much Western philosophy, especially of the late modern variety, and most especially emanating from the United Kingdom and North America, attempts to establish its claims through argumentation that is more rigorous than appeals to experience and explanatory power in the broad sense. But it must also be noted that there is argument in Chinese philosophy. Chad Hansen (1992) has pointed out the pivotal role of the philosopher Mozi, who criticized the Confucians for an uncritical acceptance of tradition and who explicitly introduced standards for the evaluations of belief. This introduction of argumentation required response in kind. Mencius gives a Confucian response to to the Mohists and argues on behalf of his theory of human nature as containing the germs or sprouts of the ethical virtues, in the form of natural dispositions to have certain kinds of feeling and judging reactions to situations, such as compassion for a child about to fall into a well (2A6, and see Shun, 1997 for an extensive analysis of argumentation in the Mencius text). He defends himself against the arguments of rival theorists who hold that human nature has no innate ethical predispositions but is neutral (6A). Xunzi, a later Confucian thinker, attempts to give a refutation of Mencius's theory in favor of his own theory that human nature has dispositions that get us into trouble and that ethical norms are an invention designed to avoid that trouble (Xunzi, chapter 23). Methods of argumentation reach their most sophisticated state of development in Xunzi (See Cua, 1985).

Differences in the way philosophy is conceived may reflect differences in the interests philosophy is meant to satisfy. Chad Hansen (1992) points to another possible difference in interests — this time in interests that language is meant to satisfy, arguing that the classical Chinese thinkers did not conceive of the primary function of language to be descriptive and as attempting to match propositions with states of affairs, but rather as a pragmatic instrument for guiding behavior. In fact, Hansen sees the Chinese tradition as centrally concerned with the conflict of daos, which he defines as sets of behavior-guiding practices, including discourses. Western interpreters have been unable to see this, argues Hansen, because they have imposed their own concerns with correspondence truth and metaphysics on the Chinese tradition. They have as a result imposed upon Daoism an irrational mysticism focused on a metaphysically absolute Dao. Michael LaFargue (1992) also argues that the Daodejing is not to be interpreted as as concerning some metaphysical entity called the Dao, but is rather concerned with self cultivation that allows one to have a transforming experience of deep and peaceful stillness within one's personal center. Wuwei is the style of action that is rooted in such an experience. David Hall and Roger Ames (1987) give a related interpretation of Confucius, in part reacting against Herbert Fingarette's (1972) influential interpretation of Confucius' Dao as an ideal normative order transcending the contingencies of time, place, history, and culture. Hall and Ames argue Confucius's Dao was not conceived as a tradition and language-independent reality against which linguistically formulated beliefs were to be measured as reliable or unreliable, but in fact a cumulative creation of individuals working from within a context provided by a society's tradition, consisting of customs, conventions, conceptions of proper behavior and good manners, conceptions of right conduct and of what is of ultimate value and of what lives are worth living.

These interpretations perform valuable functions in questioning what is sometimes an unreflective imposition of Western philosophical agendas on Chinese thinkers. The debate will go on, however. Concerning Confucius, it is true that the Analects often displays an attitude of tolerance and flexibility in judging where the Dao lies. On the other side, it can be pointed out that in sayings such as 1.2 (filial piety and brotherly love are at the root of the virtue of ren or humanity), there is no indication that the claim is limited to Chinese culture but extended to human beings generally. One way to understand it is to take it as saying that human beings have to learn to respond to a kind of authority that is not based on force and coercion, but respect and care. Or consider the consistent Confucian theme that rulers cannot hold power simply on the basis of law and punishment. There is no sign such judgments are meant to be limited in scope to one's own time and place. Concerning the Daodejing, it is clear that there are very strong practical concerns underlying the text. A way of life is being recommended (as in Hansen), and perhaps that way of life is rooted in a certain kind of transforming experience (as in LaFargue). On the other side, it could be argued that such practical and experiential concerns do not exclude metaphysical concerns. Consider chapter four of that text where Dao is described as being empty, as seeming something like the ancestor of the myriad of things, as appearing to precede the Lord (di). For something that at least looks metaphysical in the Mencius, consider aforementioned 2A2, concerning the unperturbed heart that can be achieved by cultivating one's floodlike qi. Such qi is vast and unyielding, and if cultivated with uprightness will fill up the space between tian (Heaven) and earth. Perhaps the lesson to draw is not that Chinese thinkers lacked metaphysical concerns but that they did not separate practical from metaphysical concerns in the way that contemporary Western thinkers might.

However this issue is resolved with respect to the classical Chinese thinkers, few have disputed that classical concepts such as that of nonbeing eventually acquired frankly metaphysical meanings in the Chinese tradition, where it refers at the least to an indeterminate ground in which the determinate “ten thousand things” are incipient (Neville, 1989). This embrace of an indeterminate ground of the determinate may reflect the decision to give the phenomenon of change a fundamental place in ontology, rather than an absolutely stable being as in Parmenidean ontology and as later reflected in Aristotelian and Cartesian notions of substance (Cheng, 1989, 1991). The revival of interest in Chinese metaphysics has partly been fueled by the perception that twentieth century physics has in fact undermined the strategy of giving determinate being ontological primacy (Zukov, 1979). The Neo-Confucian Chu Hsi (Zhuzi yulei) reinterpreted ethical themes inherited from the classical thinkers and grounded them in a cosmology and metaphysics. On his conception of ren as an all inclusive virtue, it constitutes the Dao and consists of the fact that the mind of Heaven and Earth to produce things is present in everything, including the mind of human beings. Another great Neo-Confucian, Wang Yang-Ming (Quan xilu) does seem more pragmatic than metaphysical, He taught of the sage who formed one body with Heaven and Earth and the myriad things, but he showed little of Chu's interest in the li or principle of existent things. The investigation of things prescribed in the Great Learning (Da Xue) was not the empirical inquiry Chu envisioned but a rectification of the mind with evil thoughts. Perhaps Chu and Wang represent development of tendencies that were present from the beginning, and between which there was never conceived to be a mutually exclusive choice.

When we get to Chinese Buddhism, there is more evidence for metaphysical concerns that at the same time are urgently practical. It is difficult to view as anything but a metaphysical doctrine the Buddha's view of the self as a floating collection of various psychophysical reactions and responses with no fixed center or unchanging ego entity. He did not deny that we think of the self as a fixed and unchanging center, but considered such a self a delusion. Our bodily attributes, various feelings, perceptions, ideas, wishes, dreams, and in general a consciousness of the world display a constant interplay and interconnection that leads us to the belief that there is some definite ‘I’ that underlies and is independent of the ever-shifting series. But there is only the interacting and interconnected series. This metaphysical concern, of course, had deep practical implications for the Buddha. It points toward the answer to human suffering, which ultimately stems from a concern for the existence and pleasures and pains of the kind of self that never existed in the first place. The recognition that none of the “things” of ordinary life are fixed and separate entities, anymore than the self is, leads to a recognition of all of life as an interdependent whole and to the practical attitude of compassion for all of life. In a comparative perspective, one cannot help but be struck by the similarity between the Buddhist view of the self and David Hume's doubts about the existence of a unitary and stable self (Treatise of Human Nature, 1.4.6). Consider also Derek Parfit's (1984) point that acceptance of a Humean or a Buddhist view of the self can lead to sense that one is less separate from other selves and to a wider concern when “my” projects seem not so absolutely different from “your” projects. However one might regard the argument for impersonal concern from such a view of the self, the view itself may seem to have a claim to a our renewed attention. It certainly fits better with a naturalized conception of human beings as part of this world and not as Cartesian thinking substances that somehow operate apart from the rest of nature.

3. Ethical Commensurability

Confucianism is a perfectionist virtue ethic if such an ethic is distinguished by its central focus on three subjects: character traits identified as the virtues; the good and worthwhile life; and particularist modes of ethical reasoning. These three subjects are interrelated. The virtues are traits of character necessary for living a good life. The virtues typically involve acting on particularist modes of ethical reasoning that do not rely on deducing specific action-guiding conclusions about how to act from general principles but rather on judging in the context at hand what needs to be done (see Van Norden, 2004, 2007, Hutton, 2003, Wong, 2002, and Ivanhoe, 2002 for discussions of judgment and its relation to reasoning and emotion in Mencius). Consider some of the virtues that belong to the junzi (the noble person): ren (humanity, benevolence), xiao (filial piety), yi (righteousness), and li (acting according to ceremonial ritual or more generally propriety). The very concept of yi connotes the ability to identify and perform the action that is appropriate to the particular context (Analects 4:10 says that the junzi is not predisposed to be for or against anything, but rather goes with what is yi). While traditional rules of ritual provide one with a sense of what is courteous and respectful action given standard contexts, the virtue of yi allows one to identify when those rules need to be set aside in exigent circumstances (see Cua, 1997). The previously discussed example in the Mencius of Shun and his father shows how a ruler's more general concern for his subjects and his filial duties to his fathers must be balanced in ways that cannot be given by principle but only by reflection on what the particular circumstances suggest and allow. Finally, consider that another example from the Mencius about the time when Shun wanted to marry. He knew that his parents, not the wisest nor the best of parents, would not permit him to marry if told of Shun's intention. Shun went ahead and got married without telling his parents, an act that normally would be a grave offense against filial piety. Two reasons are given for the justifiability of this act. One is that the worst way of being a bad son is to provide no heir (4A26); the other is that letting his parents thwart his desire to realize the greatest of human relationships which in turn would cause bitterness toward his parents (5A2). Hence an act that normally would be a grave offense against filial piety constitutes filial piety in the particular circumstances. Particularist modes of reasoning are needed, then, to judge when the usual rules apply, to balance conflicting values, and to specify the concrete meaning of single values in application to context.

The parallels to ancient Greek virtue ethics, medieval virtue ethics, and also to contemporary virtue ethics in the West are striking, and help to account for the renewal of Western interest in Confucianism. For example, Jiyuan Yu (2007) argues that the concept of eudaimonia (happiness, living well, flourishing) in Aristotle and the concept of dao (the way for human beings to live) in Confucius are parallel starting points in their ethics, and that the next step in both their ethics is to discuss virtue (arete for Aristotle and de for Confucius). In general, Chinese and Western virtue ethics converge in focusing on certain virtues as crucial for ethical development of the person. There are particularly interesting discussions of courage and the possible role of fear in Mencius and Aristotle (see Van Norden, 1997, 2007). Particularist modes of reasoning in Confucianism parallel the Aristotelian notion of a phronesis or practical wisdom that depends significantly on knowledge of particulars acquired through experience. A good example is his doctrine of the mean, which holds that virtuous action and feeling consists of avoiding the extremes of deficit and excess. The doctrine does not imply that we ought always to act moderately and with moderate feeling. Aristotle says that the mean is “relative to us,” giving the illustrative analogy that too little food for Milo is too much for the beginner in athletic exercises (Nichomachean Ethics, 2.6). Depending on the situation, the appropriate action and feeling may be extreme on a common sense understanding but appropriate given the agent and the circumstances. Part of the contemporary revival of virtue ethics is premised partly on a reaction against the ambition of modern ethical theory to guide primarily through general principles of action rather than through the specification of ideal character traits. Virtue ethics also tend to embody the theme that the ethical life of right (and in the case of Chinese and contemporary Western virtue ethics) caring relationship to others is necessary for human flourishing. In the Mencius this theme emerges in identification of the distinctively human potentials with the incipient tendencies to develop the moral virtues (Mencius 2A6, 6A1, 6A3, 6A7). Aristotle held that reason makes us distinctively human and that our reason and social nature compel recognition of the desirability of the ethical life for human beings (see Nivison, 1996 for comparisons of Aristotle and Mencius; and Yearley, 1990 for comparisons of Acquinas and Mencius). Xunzi is equally emphatic about the necessity of right and caring relationship to others for human flourishing, even though he denies (at least when he is criticizing Mencius) that human nature contains tendencies to engage in such relationships (see Ivanhoe, 1991, on the way ethical norms help human beings to flourish; and Nivison, 1996a, 1996b, Van Norden, 1992, 2007, Wong, 1996b, and Kline, 2000, on the difference between Mencius and Xunzi's theories of human nature; see Goldin, 1999, for a book-length treatment of Xunzi's philosophy).

The similarities coexist with significant differences, however. There is no parallel in Greek virtue ethics for the centrality of family life in the Confucian conception of the good life. Part of the reason for this lies in the Confucian appreciation for the family as the first arena in which care, respect, and deference to legitimate authority is learned (Analects 1.2; see also Cline, 2007 for a discussion of the Confucian view of the family in moral development and for an interesting comparison to John Rawls' conception of the role of the family). Van Norden (2004, 2007) points out that the moral emotion of shame plays a crucial role in Mencius' conception of moral development and that there is no comparable role played by the emotion in Aristotle. He suggests that the explanation lies in Mencius' greater focus on moral agency in media res. The way in which particularist reasoning is illustrated in historical stories such as those about Shun is also a distinctive feature of Confucian ethics. These stories present paradigms of good judgment and of good individuals, from which persons engaged in ethical cultivation of themselves should learn. Another distinctive feature of Confucian ethics is the emphasis it gives to an aesthetic dimension of the good life. To act according to ritual propriety is not simply to conform to notions of appropriate behavior in this or that context. It is to act with the right attitude, reverence, say, in the case of serving one's parents in an appropriately respectful manner, and it is to express such an attitude so gracefully and without internal conflict that doing so has become second nature (see Kupperman, 1999 and Cua, 1997). The importance attached to li, to ritual propriety itself, indicates the Confucian appreciation for the role of culture and convention in enabling human beings to express ethical attitudes toward each another such as care and respect (see Cua, 2005 for rich explorations of li in the thought of Xunzi). It is not as if bowing naturally means deferential respect; it must be agreed through convention that it does mean something like this (see Fingarette, 1972; see Shun, 1993, for a discussion of the relationship of li to the important virtue of ren). Mencius and Xunzi engaged in a vigorous, provocative debate over human nature and whether there are natural tendencies that form the basis for development of a good person. They debate in a highly sophisticated manner issues as to whether ethical norms and values are discovered or invented, and their arguments are based partly on what would make for a plausible explanation of how human beings develop into goodness and of how they become bad. Taking all these distinctive features together, it is fair to say that Confucianism offers an especially rich moral psychology (see Nivison, 1996, for several influential essays on moral psychology in comparative perspective, including “Motivation and Moral Action in Mencius,” “Philosophical Voluntarism in Fourth-Century China,” “Two Roots or One?” and “Xunzi on ‘Human Nature’”).

One debate that arises within the comparative perspective, however, is whether the Confucians had anything that fits the Western notion of morality. The words ’ethics’ and ‘ethical’ have been used to in this piece to remain neutral on this matter. Some contemporary thinkers (most prominently, Williams, 1985) have tended to confine the ‘moral’ to a relatively narrow set of characteristics associated with Kant's moral philosophy — a belief in universal laws validated by pure reason, a belief that responsibility for one's actions requires a freedom from determination from external causes — and on this view of the moral, it could be argued that there is no equivalent in Chinese philosophy (see Rosemont, 1988). If such a contrast is made, then Confucians are acknowledged to have an ethics as opposed to a morality, where an ethics does embrace questions about value, how one ought to live one's life, and what the good life consists in. One question to be debated here is whether Western notions of the moral are so uniform and narrow as to conform to one philosopher's (even a great one) specific conception of the moral. On the criteria given by Williams, Hume wouldn't have a morality, even though he used the term. It is true that a dominant strain of modern Western morality makes use of a crucial distinction between a morally significant sphere of life that has to do primarily with one's relationships with others and a “private” sphere of life in which one has moral “time-off” that is no one's business but one's own. If this dominant strain is taken to define morality, then Confucians would have no morality. It also would eliminate certain utilitarians from having a morality: those who insist that there is no purely private sphere because any type of action or omission could have substantial impact on others given the right circumstances.

Another potential contrast arises from the focus in modern Western moralities on individual rights to liberty and to other goods, where the basis for attributing such rights to persons lies in a moral worth attributed to each individual independently of what conduces to individual's responsibilities to self and others. Confucianism lacks a comparable concept, given its assumption that the ethical life of responsibility to others and individual flourishing are inextricably intertwined (Shun, 2004). A frequent criticism from the Western side is that Confucianism fails to provide adequate protection to those legitimate interests an individual has that may conflict with community interests. On the other side, some advocates of Confucian ethics criticize rights-focused moralities for ignoring the social nature of human beings and of portraying human life in an excessively “atomistic” or “individualist” conception of persons (e.g., Rosemont, 1986). Against those who argue that Confucianism does not protect the individual enough, it could be replied that the Confucian framework of responsibilities to others can afford significant protections to the individual and arguably addresses the human need for community and belonging better than rights frameworks (Rosemont, 1991, 2004). Another criticism from the Western side is that the dignity of the individual cannot be honored without recognition of individual rights. It has been replied, however, that dignity can lie in one's human capacity to participate in the distinctively human life of relationship and in living up to one's responsibilities to others (Ihara, 2004). Moreover, it is possible that rights in some sense can play a role in the Confucian tradition, even if such rights are not grounded in the idea of the independent moral worth of the autonomous individual. Within that tradition, rights may be seen as necessary for protecting individuals' interests when the right relationships of care irretrievably break down (Chan, 1999). Rights in the sense of justified claims to be protected in one's speech even when protest and dissenting against authority can be justified as conducive to the health of the community (Wong, 2004). Mencius recognized a right to revolution against tyrannical kings (1B8); he furthermore advised kings to attach more weight to the opinions of his people than to those of his ministers and officers in making certain crucial decisions (1B7). Xunzi recognized the need for subordinates to speak their views freely to their superiors (Xunzi, Zigong, Way of the Son). If we carry the reasoning in Mencius and Xunzi one step further, we see the need to protect a space in which they may speak freely without fear of suppression, and hence a derive a right in the “thin” sense of what one has whenever one has justifiable claims on others to assure one's possession of things or one's exercise of certain capacities. (This article focuses on rights in relation to classical Confucianism. For a detailed discussion of rights discourse in seventeenth and eighteenth century Confucianism, see Angle, 2002). On the other side, one must be wary of oversimplifications of Western rights-oriented ethical codes. The social nature of persons is not denied by all such codes (of the major theories only Hobbes seems to take an unambiguously “atomistic” view of human beings, and Rousseau and Locke seem to require no such view).

The fact that there are developments of each tradition that bring each closer to the other may suggest that each could learn from the other. Even if not all rights-oriented codes are “atomistic,” an increasing worry about Western culture as it has actually developed in practice is the prevalence of an individualism that Tocqueville defined as a “calm and considered feeling which disposes each citizen to isolate himself from the mass of his fellows and withdraw into the circle of family and friends,” such that “with this little society formed to his taste he gladly leaves the greater society to look after itself.” Such people, Tocqueville observed, form “the habit of thinking of themselves in isolation and imagine that their whole destiny is in their hands.” They come to “forget their ancestors” and also their descendants, as well as isolating themselves from their contemporaries. “Each man is forever thrown back on himself alone, and there is danger that he may be shut up in the solitude of his own heart” (1969, pp. 506, 508). Those impressed with this worry and connect it with gross inequality in the most affluent nation in the world would do well to look to a tradition that appreciates the way we thrive or falter within specific communities that nurture or shut us out. Or consider an intriguing argument by Bell (2008, pp. 43–55) that in contemporary East Asian societies the importance placed on social hierarchy provides an outlet for the rich and powerful members of these societies to distinguish themselves, whereas in socially egalitarian societies such as the U.S., the primary outlet is through the accumulation of wealth, and hence the relative economic equality of East Asian societies as compared to Western societies such as the U.S. On the other side, a tradition that has tended to value the idea of social harmony at the cost of sufficiently protecting dissenters who desire to point out abuses of power or just plain bad thinking by authorities would do well to look at another tradition that does not value social harmony as highly but has endured and is vigorous.

These arguments for greater compatibility between Chinese and Western ethics do not eliminate all significant differences between them on the subject of rights. It is possible to argue that even if responsibility-frameworks are developed and institutionalized to provide genuine protection to dissenting individuals, they cannot provide as much protection as rights frameworks when individual interests seriously threaten communal or social interests. And if Western ethics sometimes provides more protection to the individual against communal or social interests, this could be seen as unacceptable from a Confucian standpoint. One possible stance on these kinds of differences is evaluational incommensurability. The stance is that each tradition is not wrong to emphasize different values, that no judgment of superiority can be made here. The argument for this may start with the claim that each sort of ethic focuses on a good that may reasonably occupy the center of an ethical ideal for human life. On the one hand, there is the good of belonging to and contributing to a community; on the other, there is the good of respect for the individual apart from any potential contribution to community. It would be surprising, the argument goes, if there were just one justifiable way of setting a priority with respect to the two goods, even when we take into account the justifiable ways in which the two kinds of ethics could be brought closer together. On this view, comparative ethics teaches us about the diversity and richness of what human beings may reasonably prize, and about the impossibility of reconciling all they prize in just a single ethical ideal (e.g., Wong, 1984, 1996).

Daoist ethics are often cited as exemplars of substantial difference with the Western tradition. Both the Zhuangzi's and Daodejing's commendation of wuwei is a case in point. It is a commendation of a style of action that consists in being receptive rather than aggressive, following from behind rather than leading in front, accommodating rather than confrontational, and being flexible and ready to change with the situation rather than rigid and operating from general predetermined principles. While the theme of attunement with the world is present at the roots of Western traditions, no major ethic in the West gives the ideal of spontaneous, effortless attunement the kind of centrality Daoism gives to it, and indeed, Slingerland (2003) argues that the ideal of spontaneous and effortless action that is in accord with the normative order of the cosmos is quite important to the early Confucian thinkers. Ames (1994) traces the wu-wei ideal as it is applied to rulership in Confucianism, Daoism, and Legalism.

Another case for substantial difference with the Western tradition rests on the strong skepticism in Daoist ethics about the benefits of conceptualized distinctions between good and bad, right and wrong. Yet these ethics make recommendations that add up to putting forward a way of life. In the Zhuangzi, that way of life involves not taking taking oneself and one's ideas so seriously. Chapter two contains a story of monkeys who were furious with their keeper when he announced the policy of three nuts every morning and four in the evening. The keeper then announced a change: “four nuts in the morning and three in the evening,” this time to the great delight of the monkeys. Kupperman (1999) suggests that we are invited to view our own urgent concerns in the humorous light of the monkeys' concern about the difference between the two policies. At the same time we are invited to question our own judgment of the monkeys. Why think the monkeys are silly if our urgent concerns might look to some other kind of creature the way the monkeys' concerns look to us? The way of life recommended in the Zhuangzi, then, includes openness to what might escape our current conceptualizations and preconceptions. We are invited to see that our conceptualizations of the world are inevitably incomplete and distorting. We attempt to order the world by sorting its features under pairs of opposites, but opposites in the real world never match up neatly with our conceptual opposites. Real “opposites” escape our attempts to cleanly separate them. Despite our best efforts, they switch places in our conceptual maps, blur, and merge into one another. That is why chapter two of the Zhuangzi says that the sage recognizes a “this,” but a “this” which is also “that,” a “that” which is also “this.”The appropriate response to the inadequacies of our conceptual structures is to remain open to what those structures distort or hide. In chapter five, men who have had their feet amputated as criminal punishment are scorned by society, but not by their Daoist masters, who see what is of worth in them. In chapter one, Zhuangzi chastises his friend Huizi for failing to see beyond the ordinary, humdrum uses of some large gourds. Huizi tried using one of the gourds for a water container, but it was so heavy he couldn't lift it. He then tried to make dippers from them, but they were too large and unwieldy. He deemed the gourds of no use and smashed them to pieces. Zhuangzi asks why he didn't think of making the gourd into a great tub so he could go floating around the rivers and lakes, instead of worrying because it was too big and unwieldy to dip into things! “Obviously you still have a lot of underbrush in your head!” concluded Zhuangzi. He does not deny that the more ordinary uses are genuine uses for the gourds, and indeed, they are. Rather, Zhuangzi's point is to clear the underbrush from our heads and to get an enlarged view of what is of value. Much of the value of Daoist ethics lies in its warnings against the constricting effects of conventional ethical codes, the blinkering of vision that comes with what we might otherwise regard as admirable integrity and dedication. The other side of this warning is an intriguing positive: that there is a way we can pay attention to the world that allows us to “see around” our blinkering conceptualizations, to see what is of value that we have missed, to move with the grain of things. One of the central interpretive problems concerning the Zhuangzi in particular is how to reconcile the skeptical themes about the limits of our concepts and theories with the recommendations for living in a certain way, since the recommendations are framed with concepts (see Kjellberg and Ivanhoe, 1996, Hansen, 2003, and Wong, 2005 for a variety of interpretations).

It is not easy to find an analogue to someone such as Zhuangzi in the Western tradition. There are some important parallels in the Hellenistic Stoics and Epicureans to certain themes in Zhuangzi. They, like him, emphasized the need to accept the inevitable in human life, the need to dampen one's desires to achieve tranquillity in the face of the inevitable, and to identify with the world that makes acceptance and dampening of desires possible (Nussbaum, 1994). On the other hand, there is contrast in the Stoic belief in logos as the basis of order in the universe. There are parallels to some Zhuangist themes in Nietzsche: the skepticism about the adequacy of our conceptualizations of the world and of value; the warnings against conventional moralities as constricting, and the awareness of how the application of ethical judgment to others can be a means of asserting power over them (The Genealogy of Morals). However, Zhuangzi's vision possesses a generosity and inclusiveness, an embrace of the lowly and cast-off, that seems anathema to Nietzsche's celebration of the übermensch and his project of fashioning himself like a work of art. Nietzsche proposes strong, vital desire at the heart of this aesthetic project, rather than the dampening of desire. He represents a kind of radical individualism that did not find a congenial home in the Chinese tradition (Solomon, 1995).

In Buddhism, especially Chan Buddhism, there also is rejection of conventional ethical values as blinkering and distorting (see Hui Neng, Liuxu tanjing, and The Recorded Conversations of I-Hsüan), and also a sense that one can become attuned to the world so as to move with its grain. This is not surprising since Buddhism was profoundly influenced by Daoism upon its importation into China. However, Buddhism may have especially challenging implications for Western ethics in its special emphasis on the elimination of suffering and on the way it explains suffering by referring to the human attachment to self as fixed ego entity. As noted above in discussing Parfit's connection to the Buddhist view of the self, realization that the self is not a bounded and discrete entity may encourage a much more impersonal view of oneself and one's projects and desires. One's concern widens to all of life, and one dampens one's desires so as to lessen attachment to the self's cares and concerns. Some may find this an unacceptably demanding ethic. It may seem to drain all passion from life, and it requires that we dampen the attachment we have not only to our selves but also to special others. This negative reaction may fit with Kupperman's (1999) characterization of much Western ethics as upholding only a limited altruism that allows one a private sphere of life free from moral demands and in which one gives much more weight to the cares and concerns of the self and those close to the self. However, as the above comparison with Parfit suggests, there are themes in Western philosophy that parallel the kind of impersonal altruism urged upon us by Buddhism. Some utilitarians have strongly held to the theme that each counts for one in calculating what produces the greatest good, and they have derived challenging consequences from that theme for the question of what one should be prepared to give to alleviate the suffering of strangers (see Singer, 1972, and Unger, 1996), arguing that the way many in affluent nations indulge themselves and their own is simply insupportable in a world of widespread and severe suffering. Some have seen the sort of impersonal concern that utilitarianism may demand as an indication that it unsuitable for human beings, who are so strongly partial to themselves and their own (see Williams, 1981 and Wolf, 1982). Buddhism presses for the possibility that impersonal concern is humanly possible, and the fact that it is a vibrant and long-lived tradition with many committed practitioners provides some support for the viability of impersonal concern as a ideal that is capable of claiming allegiance and influencing how people try to live their lives (see Flanagan, for a reference to Buddhism in support of the viability of such an ideal .

4. Why Do Comparative Philosophy If It's So Hard?

The most obvious sin of doing comparative philosophy is assimilating another tradition to one's own by unreflectively importing assumptions, frameworks, and agendas into one's reading of that other tradition. Sometimes too much charity (as a principle of interpretation) is insufficiently respectful of the distinctness of the other tradition. There are more subtle dangers. If one is a dissident from main trends in one's home tradition, one is tempted to find another tradition that “got it right.” This is fine as long as the desire to find another such tradition does not lead to distortion or oversimplification of that other tradition (see Hansen, 1992, 2004, for discussions of taking Confucianism as representative of the Chinese tradition as a whole and of trying to find in Confucianism something one may perceive as lacking in one's own tradition). These are dangers one can recognize but not always avoid successfully, because success may require knowing a lot about the other tradition when it is hard enough to master a single tradition to the point where one can avoid saying silly things about it. Are the risks worth it?

One reason for thinking so is that comparative philosophy is an instance of a sound and sensible strategy for doing philosophy. When facing hard problems it is simply a good strategy to consider a wide range of enduring, respected ideas bearing on those problems. We of course must be wary of the possibility that the other tradition is not really addressing the same problem we are, or that it is addressing only part of the problem we are addressing. But when there is common address of a problem, it is not always the case that one tradition must be adjudicated as entirely right and the other as entirely wrong. There is a good possibility that each tradition has something insightful to say about some aspect of the problem and that each tradition could incorporate something of what the other tradition has to say (see Yu and Bunnin, 2001). Yu (2007) appropriates Aristotle's conception of the friend as a second self, a mirror, by which one can come to know oneself better, one's unexamined presuppositions, for instance. May Sim (2007) argues that Aristotle's metaphysics of the soul supplies a substantial self that is both needed and presupposed by Confucius' virtue ethics. At the same time she argues that Aristotle's metaphysics tilts too far towards an individualism that does not motivate sufficient attention to the culturally laden social relations required by his own ethics of character and politics of virtue, and so Aristotelian ethics could benefit by taking from Confucianism an acknowledgment of the ethical importance of ceremony and decorum. When one crosses traditions in enacting such strategies, there is the opportunity for fruitful interaction and mutual influence. Already discussed above is the opportunity for fruitful interaction between rights-oriented traditions and traditions such as Confucianism focused on the value of relationship and community. Consider another area of potential interaction: when a tradition as long-lived and as sophisticated as the Confucian tradition brims full with writing on the nature of agency, human motivation, and the problem of developing ethical excellence and commitment, one cannot afford to ignore it (see Ivanhoe, 2000, for portraits of the tradition of Confucian and neo-Confucian thinkers on these subjects). Confucianism and Daoism emphasize the need to to pay attention to the concrete details of the situation at hand and displays healthy skepticism about the power of general principle to reveal what sort of action is suitable to the situation. Confucianism displays an appreciation for the power of community, custom, convention and ceremony for helping to make vivid and concrete and meaningful such ethical abstractions as love, respect, and care (Fingarette, 1972, Shun, 1993, Kupperman, 2004). From these themes, there is much to be learned, especially if one's home tradition has had a strong focus for a good portion of the modern period on the top-down deduction of specific ethical judgments from extremely abstract principles. At the same time, an appreciation for the concrete and for the culturally specific may obscure the possibility of general and transcultural principles that help to evaluate the concrete and culturally specific, and the Chinese tradition could benefit from interaction with the Western (Cua, 1985). Finally, recall the case of the Buddhist ideal of impersonal concern being brought to bear on a debate in Western philosophy over the viability of ideals of impersonal concern. This illustrates the point that comparative philosophy can stretch one's sense of possibility, in this case, of human possibility. That is a benefit in itself.

Comparative philosophy that is done along the Chinese-Western axis can proceed from one end or the other, in the attempt to bring to bear concepts, frameworks, and insights from one tradition to the project of making progress on questions and problems in the other tradition. Kwong-loi Shun (2009) has observed that there has been an asymmetry in the amount of work done in these two possible directions. There is much more work done that starts from the Western end and works towards the Chinese end. Shun questions whether there is a good intellectual grounding for this asymmetry, given that Chinese philosophy promises to illuminate some aspects of the ethical life that are not as well appreciated or studied in Western philosophy. The alternative, as Shun puts it, is that “that there is no such grounding and that the [asymmetrical] tendency is just a collective phenomenon explainable in terms of historical trends that wax and wane over time” (2009, p. 475). In speculating about possible explanations exemplifying Shun's second alternative, it is worth reminding ourselves that the trends of philosophy are often reflections or distillations of larger historical trends and the shifting balances of power between different regions of the world. If this is so, we may be witnessing an incipient correction in the asymmetry between Chinese and Western philosophy.

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