Consciousness and Intentionality
To say one has an experience that is conscious (in the phenomenal sense) is to say that one is in a state of its seeming to one some way. In another formulation, to say experience is conscious is to say that there is something it's like for one to have it. Feeling pain and sensing colors are common illustrations of phenomenally conscious states. Consciousness has also been taken to consist in the monitoring of one's own states of mind (e.g., by forming thoughts about them, or by somehow "sensing" them), or else in the accessibility of information to one's capacities for rational control or self-report. Intentionality has to do with the directedness or aboutness of mental states — the fact that, for example, one's thinking is of or about something. Intentionality includes, and is sometimes taken to be equivalent to, what is called ‘mental representation.’
It can seem that consciousness and intentionality pervade mental life — perhaps one or both somehow constitute what it is to have a mind. But achieving an articulate general understanding of either consciousness or intentionality presents an enormous challenge, part of which lies in figuring out how the two are related. Is one in some sense derived from or dependent on the other? Or are they perhaps quite independent and separate aspects of mind?
Sections (1) and (2) offer introductory accounts of what is meant by ‘consciousness’ and ‘intentionality,’ with sensitivity to the difficulties raised by their varying interpretation. Then, influential perspectives on intentionality that have emerged in both phenomenological (Section 3) and analytic (Section 4) philosophical traditions are sketched, so as to highlight basic issues about the relationship of consciousness and intentionality, and provide some of the background against which they have been understood. Sections (5) through (8) survey some contemporary views about consciousness, considering their implications for the connection between consciousness and intentionality. Section (9) distinguishes four broad options for understanding their relationship, and closes with some observations about the philosophical consequences of choosing among them.
- 1. Consciousness: Different Senses (or Kinds)?
- 2. Intentionality: Directedness; Conditions of Satisfaction; Content
- 3. Brentano, Husserl, and the Phenomenological Movement
- 4. Frege, Russell, and the Analytic Tradition
- 5. Consciousness and Sensory Content
- 6. Consciousness and Higher Order Representation
- 7. Is Phenomenal Consciousness Intentional?
- 8. Is Phenomenality Essential to Intentionality?
- 9. Four Views of the Consciousness-Intentionality Relationship
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On one understanding frequent among philosophers, consciousness is a certain feature shared by sense-experience and imagery, perhaps belonging also to a broad range of other mental phenomena (e.g., episodic thought, memory, and emotion). It is the feature that consists in its seeming some way to one to have experiences. To put it another way: conscious states are states of its seeming somehow to a subject.
For example, it seems to you some way to see red, and seems to you (some other way) to hear a crash, to visualize a triangle, and to suffer pain. The sense of ‘seems’ relevant here may be brought out by noting that, in the last example, we might just as well speak of the way it feels to be in pain. And — some will want to say — in the same sense, it seems to you some way to think through the answer to a math problem, or to recall where you parked the car, or to feel anger, shame, or elation. (Note however, that it is not simply to be assumed that saying it seems some way to you to have an experience is equivalent to saying that the experience itself seems or appears some way to you — that it is an object of appearance. The point is just that the way something sounds to you, the way something looks to you, etc., all exemplify ‘ways of seeming.’) States that are conscious in this sense are said to have some phenomenal character or other — their phenomenal character being the specific way it seems to one to have a given experience. Sometimes this is called the ‘qualitative’ or ‘subjective’ character of experience.
Another oft-used means for trying to get at the relevant notion of consciousness, preferable to some, is to say that there is, in a certain sense, always ‘something it is like’ to be in a given conscious state — something it's like for one who is in that state. Relating the two locutions we might say: there is something it is like for you to see red, to feel pain, etc., and the way it seems to you to have one of these experiences is what it is like for you to have it. The phenomenal character of an experience then, is what someone would inquire about by asking, e.g., ‘What is it like to experience orgasm?’ — and it is what we speak of when we say that we know what that is like, even if we cannot convey this to one who doesn't know. And, if we want to speak of persons, or other creatures (as distinct from their states) being conscious, we will say that they are conscious just if there is something it is like for them to be the creatures they are — for example, something it is like to be a bat.
The examples of conscious states given comprise a various lot. But some sense of their putative unity as instances of consciousness might be gained by contrasting them with what we are inclined to exclude, or can at least conceive of excluding, from their company. Much of what goes on we would ordinarily believe is not (or at any rate, we may well suppose is not) conscious in the sense at issue. The leaf's fall from a tree branch, we may suppose, is not a conscious state of the leaf — a state of its seeming somehow to the leaf. Nor, for that matter, is a person's fall off a branch a conscious state of that person — rather, it is the feeling of falling that is conscious, if anything is. Dreaming of falling would also be a conscious experience in this sense. But, while we can in some way be said to sense the position of our limbs even while dreamlessly asleep, we may still suppose that this proprioception (though perhaps in some sense a mental or cognitive affair) is not conscious — we may suppose that it does not then seem (or feel) any way to us sleepers to sense our limbs, as ordinarily it does when we are awake.
The ‘way of seeming’ or ‘what it's like’ conception of consciousness I have just invoked is sometimes marked by the term ‘phenomenal consciousness.’ But this qualifier ‘phenomenal’ suggests that there are other kinds of consciousness (or perhaps, other senses of ‘consciousness’). Indeed there are, at least, other ways of introducing notions of consciousness. And these may appear to pick out features or senses altogether distinct from that just presented. For example, it is said that some (but not all) that goes on in the mind is ‘accessible to consciousness.’ Of course this by itself does not so much specify a sense of ‘conscious’ as put one in use. (One will want to ask: And just what is this ‘consciousness’ that has ‘access’ to some mental goings-on but not others, and what could ‘access’ mean here, anyway?) However, some have evidently thought that, rather than speak of consciousness as what has access, we should understand consciousness as itself a certain kind of susceptibility to access. For example, Daniel Dennett (1969) once theorized that one's conscious states are just those whose contents are available to one's direct verbal report — or, at least, to the ‘speech center’ responsible for generating such reports. And Ned Block (1995, 2001, 2002) has proposed that, on one understanding of ‘conscious,’ (to be found at work in many ‘cognitive’ theories of consciousness) a conscious state is just a ‘representation poised’ (or as he later put it, ‘broadcast’) ‘for free use in reasoning and other direct ‘rational’ control of action and speech.’ Block labels consciousness in this sense ‘access consciousness.’(For examples of what Block would consider theories of access consciousness, see Baars 1997 and Dennett 1978, 1991).
Block would insist that we distinguish the notion of phenomenal consciousness from that of ‘access consciousness,’ and he argues that a mental representation's being poised or broadcast for use in reasoning and rational control of action is neither a conceptually necessary nor a sufficient condition for the state's being phenomenally conscious. Similarly he distinguishes phenomenal consciousness from what he calls ‘reflexive (or monitoring) consciousness’ — where this has to do with one's capacity to represent one's mind's to oneself — to have, for example, thoughts about one's own thoughts, feelings, or desires. Such a conception of consciousness finds some support in a tendency to say that conscious states of mind are those one is ‘conscious of’ or ‘aware of’ being in, and to interpret this ‘of’ to indicate some kind of reflexivity is involved — wherein one represents one's own mental representations (Rosenthal 1986, 1991, 1993, 2002b). On one prominent variant of this conception, consciousness is taken to be a kind of scanning or perceiving of one's own psychological states or processes — an ‘inner sense’ (Armstrong 1968, Carruthers 2000, 2002, Lycan 1995).
Block's threefold division of phenomenal, access, and reflexive (or monitoring) consciousness need not be taken to reflect clear and coherent distinctions already contained in our pre-theoretical use of the term ‘conscious.’ Block himself seems to think that (on the contrary) our initial, ordinary use of ‘conscious’ involves a ‘mongrel’ concept, too confused even to count as clearly ambiguous. Thus in articulating an interpretation, or set of interpretations of the term adequate to frame theoretical issues, we cannot simply describe how it is currently employed — we must assign it a more definite and coherent meaning than extant in common usage (Block 1995, 2002).
Whether or not this is correct, getting a firm footing here is not easy, and a number of theorists of consciousness would balk at proceeding on the basis of Block's proposed threefold distinction. Sometimes the difficulty may be merely terminological. John Searle, for example, would recognize phenomenal consciousness, but deny Block's other two candidates are proper senses of ‘conscious’ at all (Searle 1995). The reality of some sort of access and reflexivity is apparently not at issue — just whether either captures a sense of ‘conscious’ (perhaps confusedly) woven into our use of the term. However, in contrast to both Block and Searle, there are also those who raise doubts that there is a properly phenomenal sense we can apply, distinct from both of the other two, for us to pick out with any term (see Dennett 1988, 1991 and Rey 1997). That the issues here are not merely or trivially terminological is evident also when we consider the idea that while phenomenal consciousness is real, and while we may have a notion of it distinct from notions of access or monitoring, a proper theory of these latter two explains what consciousness is—what it consists in. So, what it is to be a phenomenally conscious visual experience of a color or shape, for example (what it is for there to be something it's like for one to have such an experience) is just for one to have a visual state of a certain (potentially unconscious) type, which is poised to affect belief (Tye 1995, 2002), or which is targeted by an appropriate sort of higher-order representation (Rosenthal 2002b, Carruthers 2000, 2004, Lycan 1995, 2004). However, some (e.g., Siewert 1998) will worry that theories which would reduce phenomenal consciousness to some form of access or monitoring either commit one to unwarranted claims of greater-than-nomological impossibility that undercut their claims to recognize the reality of phenomenal consciousness, or they postulate forms of (higher-order) representations we lack adequate reason to believe actually coincide with it. These are not just disputes about words, but about what there is for us to talk about with them—substantive issues that are very much bound up with controversies over the proper way to conceive of the relationship between consciousness and intentionality .
To clarify further the disputes about consciousness and their links to questions about its relation to intentionality, we need to get an initial grasp of the relevant way the terms ‘intentionality’ and ‘intentional’ are used in philosophy of mind.
The previous section gives some indication of why it is difficult to get a theory of consciousness started. While the term ‘conscious’ is not esoteric, its use is not easily characterized or rendered consistent in a manner providing some uncontentious framework for theoretical discussion. Where the term ‘intentional’ is concerned, we also face initially confusing and contentious usage. But here the difficulty lies partly in the fact that the relevant use of cognate terms is simply not that found in common speech (as when we speak of doing something ‘intentionally’). Though ‘intentionality,’ in the sense here at issue, does seem to attach to some real and fundamental (maybe even defining) aspect of mental phenomena, the relevant use of the term is tangled up with some rather involved philosophical history.
One way of explaining what is meant by ‘intentionality’ in the (more obscure) philosophical sense is this: it is that aspect of mental states or events that consists in their being of or about things (as pertains to the questions, ‘What are you thinking of?’ and ‘What are you thinking about?’). Intentionality is the aboutness or directedness of mind (or states of mind) to things, objects, states of affairs, events. So if you are thinking about San Francisco, or about the increased cost of living there, or about your meeting someone there at Union Square — your mind, your thinking, is directed toward San Francisco, or the increased cost of living, or the meeting in Union Square. To think at all is to think of or about something in this sense. This ‘directedness’ conception of intentionality plays a prominent role in the influential philosophical writings of Franz Brentano and those whose views developed in response to his (to be discussed further in Section 3).
But what kind of ‘aboutness’ or ‘of-ness’ or ‘directedness’ is this, and to what sorts of things does it apply? How do the relevant ‘intentionality-marking’ senses of these words (‘about,’ ‘of,’ ‘directed’) differ from: the sense in which the cat is wandering ‘about’ the room; the sense in which someone is a person ‘of’ high integrity; the sense in which the river's course is ‘directed’ towards the fields?
It has been said that the peculiarity of this kind of directedness/aboutness/of-ness lies in its capacity to relate thought or experience to objects that (unlike San Francisco) do not exist. One can think about a meeting that has not, or never will occur; one can think of Shangri La, or El Dorado, or the New Jerusalem; one may think of their shining streets, of their total lack of poverty, or of their citizens' peculiar garb. Thoughts, unlike roads, can lead to a city that is not there.
But to talk in this way only invites new perplexities. Is this to say (with apparent incoherence) that there are cities that do not exist? And what does it mean to say that, when a state of mind is in fact ‘directed toward’ something that does exist, that state nevertheless could be directed toward something that does not exist? It can well seem to be something very fundamental to the nature of mind that our thoughts, or states of mind more generally, can be of or about things or ‘point beyond themselves.’ But a coherent and satisfactory theoretical grasp of this phenomenon of ‘mental pointing’ in all its generality is difficult to achieve.
Another way of trying to get a grip on the topic asks us to note that the potential for a mental directedness towards the non-existent is evidently closely associated with the mind's potential for falsehood, error, inaccuracy, illusion, hallucination, and dissatisfaction. What makes it possible to believe (or even just suppose) something about Shangri La is that one can falsely believe (or suppose) that something exists. In the case of perception, what makes it possible to seem to see or hear what is not there is that one's experience may in various ways be inaccurate, nonveridical, subject to illusion, or hallucinatory. And, what makes it possible for one's desires and intentions to be directed toward what does not and never will exist is that one's desires and intentions can be unfulfilled or unsatisfied. This suggests another strategy for getting a theoretical hold on intentionality, employing a notion of satisfaction, stretched to encompass susceptibility to each of these modes of assessment, each of these ways in which something can either go right, or go wrong (true/false, veridical/nonveridical, fulfilled/unfulfilled), and speak of intentionality in terms of having ‘conditions of satisfaction.’ On John Searle's (1983) conception, intentional states are those having conditions of satisfaction. What are conditions of satisfaction? In the case of belief, these are the conditions under which the belief is true; in the case of perception, they are the conditions under which sense-experience is veridical; in the case of intention, the conditions under which an intention is fulfilled or carried out.
However, while the conditions of satisfaction approach to the notion of intentionality may furnish an alternative to introducing this notion by talking of ‘directedness to objects,’ it is not clear that it can get us around the problems posed by the ‘directedness’ talk. For instance, what are we to say where thoughts are expressed using names of nonexistent deities or fictional characters? Will we do away with a troublesome directedness to the nonexistent by saying that the thoughts that Zeus is Poseidon's brother, and that Hamlet is a prince, are just false? This is problematic. Moreover, how will we state the conditions of satisfaction of such thoughts? Will this not also involve an apparent reference to the nonexistent? (For discussion of these issues, see, for example, Thomasson 1999.)
A third important way of conceiving of intentionality, one particularly central to the analytic tradition derived from the study of Frege and Russell (see Section 4), asks us to focus on the notion of mental (or intentional) content. Often, it is assumed: to have intentionality is to have content. And frequently mental content is otherwise described as representational or informational content — and ‘intentionality’ (at least, as this applies to the mind) is seen as just another word for what is called ‘mental representation,’ or a certain way of bearing or carrying information.
But what is meant by ‘content’ here? As a start we may note: the content of thought, in this sense, is what is reported when answering the question, ‘What does she think?’ by something of the form, ‘She thinks that p.’ And the content of thought is what two people are said to share, when they are said to think the same thought. (Similarly, the content of belief is what two people share when they hold the same belief.) Content is also what may be shared in this way even while ‘psychological modes’ of states of mind may differ. For example: believing that I'll soon be bald and fearing that I'll soon be bald share the content: that I'll soon be bald.
Also, commonly, content is taken as not only that which is shared in the ways illustrated, but that which differs in a way revealed by considering certain logical features of sentences we use to talk about states of mind. Notably: the constituents of the sentence that fills in for ‘p’ when we say ‘x thinks that p’ or ‘x believes that p’ are often interpreted in such a way that they display ‘failures of substitutivity’ of (ordinarily) co-referential or co-extensional expressions, and this appears to reflect differences in mental content. For example: if George W. Bush is the eldest son of the vice-president under Ronald Reagan, and George W. Bush is the current U.S. President, then it can be validly inferred that the eldest son of Reagan's vice-president is the current U.S. President. However, we cannot always make the same sort of substitutions of terms when we use them to report what someone believes. From the fact that you believe that George W. Bush is the current U.S. President, we cannot validly infer that you believe that the eldest son of Reagan's vice-president is the current U.S. President. That last may still be false, even if George W. Bush is indeed the eldest son. These logical features of the sentences ‘x believes that George W. Bush is the current U.S. President’ and ‘x believes that George W. Bush is the eldest son of Reagan's vice-president’ seem to reflect the fact that the beliefs reported by their use have different contents: these sentences are used by someone to state what is believed (the belief content), and what is believed in each case is not just the same. Someone's belief may have the one content without having the other.
Similar observations can be made for other intentional states and the reports made of them — especially when these reports contain an object clause beginning with ‘that’ and followed by a complete sentence (e.g., she thinks that p; he intends that p; she hopes that p; he fears that p; she sees that p). Sometimes it is said that the content of the states is ‘given’ by such a ‘that p’ clause when ‘p’ is replaced by a sentence — the so-called ‘content clause.’
This ‘possession of content’ conception of intentionality may be coordinated with the ‘conditions of satisfaction’ conception roughly as follows. If states of mind contrast in respect of their satisfaction (say, one is true and the other false), they differ in content. (One and the same belief content cannot be both true and false — at least not in the same context at the same time.) And if one says what the intentional content of a state of mind is, one says much or perhaps all of what conditions must be met if it is to be satisfied — what its conditions of truth, or veridicality, or fulfillment, are. But one should be alert to how the notion of content employed in a given philosopher's views is heavily shaped by these views, and one should note how commonly it is held that the notion of content is in this or that way ambiguous or in need of refinement. (Consider, for example: Jerry Fodor's (1991) defense of a distinction between ‘narrow’ and ‘wide’ content; Edward Zalta's (1988) distinction between ‘cognitive’ and ‘objective’ content; and John Perry's (2001) distinction between ‘reflexive’ and ‘subject-matter’ content.)
It is arguable that each of these gates of entry into the topic of intentionality (directedness; conditions of satisfaction; mental content) opens onto a unitary phenomenon. But evidently there is also considerable fragmentation in the conceptions of both consciousness and intentionality that are in the field. To get a better grasp of some of the ways the relationship between consciousness and intentionality can be viewed, without begging questions or trying to present a positive theory on the topic, it is useful to take a look at the recent history of thinking about intentionality, in a way that will bring several issues about its relationship with consciousness to the fore. Together with the preceding discussion, this should provide the background necessary for examining some of the differences that divide those who theorize about consciousness that are very intimately involved with views of the consciousness-intentionality relation.
If we are to acknowledge the extent to which the notion of intentionality is the creature of philosophical history, we have to come to terms with the divide in twentieth century western philosophy between so-called ‘analytic’ and ‘continental’ philosophical traditions. Both have been significantly concerned with intentionality. But differences in approach, vocabulary, and background assumptions have made dialogue between them difficult. It is almost inevitable, in a brief exposition, to give largely independent summaries of the two. We will start with the ‘continental’ side of the story — more, specifically, with the phenomenological movement in continental philosophy. However, while these traditions have developed without a great deal of intercommunication, they do have common sources, and have come to focus on issues concerning the relationship of consciousness and intentionality that are recognizably similar.
A thorough look at the historical roots of controversies over consciousness and intentionality would take us farther into the past than it is feasible to go in this article. A relatively recent, convenient starting point would be in the philosophy of Franz Brentano. He more than any other single thinker is responsible for keeping the term ‘intentional’ alive in philosophical discussions of the last century or so, with something like its current use, and was much concerned to understand its relationship with consciousness (Brentano  1973). However, it is worth noting that Brentano himself was very aware of the deep historical background to his notion of intentionality: he looked back through scholastic discussions (crucial to the development of Descartes' immensely influential theory of ideas), and ultimately to Aristotle for his theme of intentionality (Brentano  1977). One may well go further back, to Plato's discussion (in the Sophist, and the Theaetetus) of difficulties in making sense of false belief, and yet further still, to the dawn of Western Philosophy, and Parmenides' attempt to draw momentous consequences from his alleged finding that it is not possible to think or speak of what is not.
In Brentano's treatment what seems crucial to intentionality is the mind's capacity to ‘refer’ or be ‘directed’ to objects existing solely in the mind — what he called ‘mental or intentional inexistence.’ It is subject to interpretation just what Brentano meant by speaking of an object existing only in the mind and not outside of it, and what he meant by saying that such ‘immanent’ objects of thought are not ‘real.’ He complained that critics had misunderstood him here, and also appears to have revised his position significantly as his thought developed. But it is clear at least that his conception of intentionality is dominated by the first strand in thought about intentionality mentioned above — intentionality as ‘directedness towards an object’ — and whatever difficulties that brings in train.
Brentano's conception of the relation between consciousness and intentionality can be brought out partly by noting he held that every conscious mental phenomenon is both directed towards an object, and always (if only ‘secondarily’) directed towards itself. (That is, it includes a ‘presentation’ — and ‘inner perception’ — of itself). Since Brentano also denied the existence of unconscious mental phenomena, this amounts to the view that all mental phenomena are, in a sense ‘self-presentational.’
His lectures in the late nineteenth century attracted a diverse group of central European intellectuals (including that great promoter of the unconscious, Sigmund Freud) and the problems raised by Brentano's views were taken up by a number of prominent philosophers of the era, including Edmund Husserl, Alexius Meinong, and Kasimir Twardowski. Of these, it was Husserl's treatment of the Brentanian theme of intentionality that was to have the widest philosophical influence on the European Continent in the twentieth century — both by means of its transformation in the hands of other prominent thinkers who worked under the aegis of ‘phenomenology’ — such as Martin Heidegger, Jean-Paul Sartre, and Maurice Merleau-Ponty — and through its rejection by those embracing the ‘deconstructionism’ of Jacques Derrida.
In responding to Brentano, Husserl also adopted his concern with properly understanding the way in which thought and experience are “directed towards objects.” Husserl ( 1970,  1966) criticized Brentano's doctrines of intentionality and ‘inner perception,’, but he retained Brentano's primary focus on describing conscious ‘mental acts.’ Husserl did hold that knowledge of one's own mental acts rests on an ‘intuitive’ apprehension of their instances, and that one is, in some sense, conscious of each of one's conscious experiences, but he denied this meant that every conscious experience is an object of an intentional act. Evidently Husserl wished to deny that all conscious acts are objects of inner perception, while also affirming that some kind of reflexivity — one that is, however, not ‘objectivating,’ and neither judgment-like nor sense-like — is essentially built into every conscious act. But the details of the view are not easy to make out. (A similar (and similarly elusive) view was expressed by Jean-Paul Sartre in the doctrine that “every consciousness is a non-positional consciousness of itself”( 1957,  1953).) (For recent discussion of Brentano and Husserl and of the relation between the two, see Kelly 2003, Siewert 2006, Thomasson 2000 and Zahavi 1998, 2005.)
One of Husserl's principal points of departure in his early treatment of intentionality (in the Logical Investigations  1970) was his criticism of (what he took to be) Brentano's notion of the ‘mental inexistence’ of the objects of thought and perception. Husserl thought it a fundamental error to suppose that the object (the ‘intentional object’) of a thought, judgment, desire, etc. is always an object ‘in’ (or ‘immanent to’) the mind of the thinker, judger, or desirer. The objects of one's ‘mental acts’ of thinking, judging, etc. are often objects that ‘transcend,’ and exist independently of these acts (states of mind) that are directed towards them (that ‘intend’ them, in Husserl's terms). This is particularly striking, Husserl thought, if we focus on the intentionality of sense perception. The object of my visual experience is not something ‘in my mind,’ whose existence depends on the experience — but something that goes beyond or ‘transcends’ any (necessarily perspectival) experience I may have of it. This view is phenomenologically based, for (Husserl says), the object is experienced as perspectivally given, hence as ‘transcendent’ in this sense.
In cases of hallucination, we should say, on Husserl's view, not that there is an object existing ‘in one's mind,’ but that the object intended does not exist at all. This does not do away with the ‘directedness’ of the experience, for that is properly understood (according to the Logical Investigations) as its having a certain ‘matter’ — where the matter of a mental act is what may be common to different acts, when, for example, one believes that it will not rain tomorrow, and hopes that it will not rain tomorrow. The difference between the mental acts illustrated (between hoping and believing) Husserl would term a difference in their ‘quality.’ Husserl was to re-interpret his notions of act-matter and quality as components of what he called (in Ideas  1983) the ‘noema’ or ‘noematic structure’ that can be common to distinct particular acts. So intentional directedness is understood not as a relation to special (mental) objects towards which one is directed, but rather: as the possession by mental acts of matter/quality (or later, ‘noematic’) structure.
This unites Husserl's discussion with the ‘content’ conception of intentionality described above: he himself would accept that the matter of an act (later, its ‘noematic sense’) is the same as the content of judgment, belief, desire, etc., in one sense of the term (or rather, in one sense he found in this ambiguous term. However, it is not fully clear how Husserl would view the relationship between either act-matter or noematic sense quite generally and such semantic correlates of ordinary language sentences that some would identify as the contents of states of mind reported in them. This is a difficulty partly because of his later emphasis (e.g., in Experience and Judgment  1972) on the importance of what he called ‘pre-predicative’ experience. He believed that the sort of judgments we express in ordinary and scientific language are ‘founded on’ the intentionality of pre-predicative experience, and that it is a central task of philosophy to clarify the way in which such experience of our surroundings and our own bodies underlies judgment, and the capacity it affords us to construct an ‘objective’ conception of the world. Pre-predicative experience is, paradigmatically, sense experience as it is given to us independently of any active judging or predication. But did Husserl hold that what makes such experience pre-predicative is that it altogether lacks the content that is expressed linguistically in predicative judgment, or did he think that such judgment merely renders explicit a predicative content that even ‘pre-predicative’ experience already (implicitly) has? Just what does the ‘pre-’ in ‘pre-predicative’ entail?
Perhaps this is not clear. In any case, the theme of a type of intentionality more fundamental than that involved in predicative judgments that ‘posit’ objects, and to be found in everyday experience of our surroundings, was taken up, in different ways, by later phenomenologists, Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty. The former describes a type of ‘directed’ ‘comportment’ towards beings in which they ‘show themselves’ as ‘ready-to-hand,’ (or, in Dreyfus' (1991) interpretation, as ‘available’). Heidegger thinks this characterizes our ordinary practical involvement with our surroundings, and regards it as distinct from, and somehow providing a basis for, entities showing themselves to us as ‘present-at-hand’ (or ‘occurrent’) — as they do when we take a less context-bound, more theoretical stance towards the world (Heidegger  1962). Later, Merleau-Ponty ( 1962), influenced by his study of Gestalt psychology and neurological case studies describing pathologies of perception and action, held that normal perception involves a consciousness of place tied essentially to one's capacities for exploratory and goal-directed movement, which is indeterminate relative to attempts to express or characterize it in terms of ‘objective’ representations — though it makes such an objective conception of the world possible.
Whether Heidegger's and Merleau-Ponty's moves in these directions actually contradict Husserl, they clearly go beyond what he says. Another basic, exegetically complex, apparent difference between Husserl and the two later philosophers, pertinent to the relationship of consciousness and intentionality, lies in the controversy over Husserl's proposed ‘phenomenological reduction.’ Husserl claimed it is possible (and, indeed, essential to the practice of phenomenology) that one conduct an investigation into the structure of consciousness that carefully abstains from affirming the existence of anything in spatio-temporal reality. By this ‘bracketing’ of the natural world, by reducing the scope of one's assertions first to the subjective sphere of consciousness, then to its abstract (or ‘ideal’) atemporal structure, one is able to apprehend what consciousness and its various forms essentially are, in a way that supplies a foundation to the philosophical study of knowledge, meaning and value. Both Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty (along with a number of Husserl's other students) appear to have questioned whether it is possible to reduce one's commitments as thoroughly as Husserl appears to have prescribed through a ‘mass abstention’ from judgment about the world, and thus whether it is correct to regard one's intentional experience as a whole as essentially detachable from the world at which it is directed. Seemingly crucial to their doubts about Husserl's reduction is their belief that an essential part of intentionality consists in a distinctively practical involvement with the world that cannot be broken by any mere abstention from judgment. However, it must be noted that the interpretation of Husserl's reduction is highly controversial in ways that bear on the present issue. (See, e.g., Zahavi 2003.)
The phenomenological themes just hinted at (the notion of a ‘pre-predicative’ type of intentionality; the (un)detachability of intentionality from the world) link up with issues regarding consciousness and intentionality as these are understood outside the phenomenological tradition — in particular, the notion of non-conceptual content, and the internalism/externalism debate, to be considered in Section (4). But it is by no means a straightforward matter to describe these links in detail. Part of the reason lies in the general difficulty in being clear about whether what one philosopher means by ‘consciousness’ (or its standard translations) is close enough to what another means for it to be correct to see them as speaking to the same issues. And while some of the phenomenological philosophers (Brentano, Husserl, Sartre) make thematically central use of terms cognate with ‘consciousness’ and ‘intentionality,’ and consider questions about intentionality first and foremost as questions about the intentionality of consciousness, they do not explicitly address much that (in the latter half of the twentieth century) came to seem problematic about consciousness and intentionality. Is their ‘consciousness’ the phenomenal kind? Would they reject theories of consciousness that reduce it to a species of access to content? If so, on what grounds? (Note: given their interest in the relation of consciousness, inner perception, and reflection, it may be easier to discern what their stance on reductive ‘higher order representation’ theories of consciousness would be.)
In some ways the situation is more difficult still in the cases of Merleau-Ponty and Heidegger. For the former, though he willingly enough uses words standardly translated as ‘consciousness’ and ‘intentionality,’ says little to explain how he understands such terms generally. And the latter deliberately avoids these terms in his central work, Being and Time, in order to forge a philosophical vocabulary free of errors in which they had, he thought, become enmeshed. However, it is not obvious how to articulate the precise difference between what Heidegger rejects, in rejecting the allegedly error-laden understanding of ‘consciousness’ and ‘intentionality’ (or their German translations), and what he accepts when he speaks of beings ‘showing’ or ‘disclosing’ themselves to us, and of our ‘comportment’ directed towards them.
Nevertheless, one can plausibly read Brentano's notion of ‘presentation’ as equivalent to the notion of phenomenally conscious experience, as this is understood in other writers. For Brentano ( 1973) says, ‘We speak of presentation whenever something appears to us.’ And one may take ways of appearing as equivalent to ways of seeming, in the sense proper to phenomenal consciousness. Further, Brentano's attempt to state in a ‘descriptive’ or ‘phenomenological’ psychology, based on how intentional presentations present themselves, the fundamental kinds to which they belong and their necessary interrelationships, may plausibly be interpreted as an effort to articulate the philosophically salient, highly general phenomenal character of intentional states (or acts) of mind. And Husserl's attempts to delineate the structure of intentionality as it is ‘given’ in consciousness, as well as the phenomenological productions of Sartre, can arguably be seen as devoted to laying bare to thought the deepest and most general characteristics of phenomenal consciousness, as they are found in ‘directed’ perception, judgment, imagination, emotion and action. Also, one might reasonably regard Heideggerian disclosure of the ready-to-hand and Merleau-Ponty's ‘motor-intentional’ consciousness of place as forms of phenomenally conscious experience — as long as one's conception of phenomenal consciousness is not tied to the notion that the subjective ‘sphere’ of consciousness is, in essence, independent of the world revealed through it.
In any event, to connect classic phenomenological writings with current discussions of consciousness and its relation to intentionality, more background is needed on aspects of the other main current of Western philosophy in the past century particularly relevant to the topic of intentionality — broadly labeled ‘analytic.’
It seems fair to say that recent work in philosophy of mind in the analytic tradition that has focussed on questions about the nature of intentionality (or ‘mental content’) has been most formed not by the writings of Brentano, Husserl and their direct intellectual descendants, but by the seminal discussions of logico-linguistic concerns found in Gottlob Frege's (1892) “On Sense and Reference,” and Bertrand Russell's “On Denoting” (1905). (Roderick Chisholm (1957), much influenced by his study of Brentano, is a notable exception.)
But Frege's and Russell's work comes from much the same era, and from much the same intellectual environment as Brentano's and the early Husserl's. And fairly clear points of contact have long been recognized, such as: Russell's criticism of Meinong's ‘theory of objects’; and the similarities between Husserl's meaning/object distinction (in Logical Investigation I) and Frege's (prior) sense/reference distinction. Indeed the case has been influentially made (by Føllesdal 1969, 1990) that Husserl's ‘meaning/object’ distinction is borrowed from Frege (though with a change in terminology) and that Husserl's ‘noema’ is properly interpreted as having the characteristics of Fregean ‘sense.’
Nonetheless, a number of factors make comparison and integration of debates within the two traditions complicated and strenuous. Husserl's notion of noema (hence his notion of intentionality) is most fundamentally rooted, not in reflections on the logical features of language, but in a contrast between the object of an intentional act, and the object ‘as intended’ (the way in which it is intended), and in the idea that a structure would remain to perceptual experience, even if it were radically non-veridical. And what Husserl seeks is a characterization of this (and other) kinds of experience from the point of view of the experiencer. On the other hand, Frege's and Russell's writings bearing on the topic of intentionality concentrate mainly and most explicitly on issues that grow from their own pioneering achievements in logic, and have given rise to ways of understanding mental states primarily through questions about the logic and semantics of the language used to speak of them.
Broadly speaking, logico-linguistic concerns have been methodologically and thematically dominant in the analytic Frege-Russell tradition, while the phenomenological Brentano-Husserl lineage is rooted in attempts to characterize experience as it is evident from the subject's point of view. For this reason perhaps, discussions of consciousness and intentionality are more obviously intertwined from the start in the phenomenological tradition than in the analytic one. The following sketch of relevant background in the latter case will, accordingly, most directly concern the treatment of intentionality. But by the end, the bearing of this on the treatment of consciousness in analytic philosophy of mind will have become more evident, and it will be clearer how similar issues concerning the consciousness-intentionality relationship arise in each tradition.
Central to Frege's legacy for discussions of mental or intentional content has been his distinction between ‘sense’ (Sinn) and ‘reference’ (Bedeutung), and his use of this distinction to cope with the apparent failures of substitutivity of (ordinarily) co-referential expressions in contexts created by psychological verbs, of the sort mentioned above in exposition of the notion of mental content — a task important to his development of logic. The need for a distinction between the sense and reference of an expression became evident to Frege, when he considered that, even if a is identical to b, and you understand both ‘a’ and ‘b,’ still, it can be for you a discovery, an addition to your knowledge, that a = b. This is intelligible, Frege thought, only if you have different ways of understanding the expressions ‘a’ and ‘b’ — only if they involve for you distinct ‘modes of presentation’ of the self-same object to which they refer. In Frege's celebrated example: you may understand the expressions ‘The Morning Star’ and ‘The Evening Star’ and use them to refer to what is one and the same object — the planet Venus. But this is not sufficient for you to know that the Morning Star is identical with the Evening Star. For the ways in which an object (‘the reference’) is ‘given’ to your mind when you employ these expressions (the senses or Sinne you ‘grasp’ when you use them) may differ in such a manner that ignorance of astronomy would prevent your realizing that they are but two ways in which the same object can be given.
The relevance of all this to intentionality becomes clearer, once we see how Frege applied the sense/reference distinction to whole sentences. The sentence, ‘The Evening Star = The Morning Star’ has a different sense than the sentence ‘The Evening Star = The Evening Star’, even if their reference (according to Frege, their truth value) is the same. The failure of substitutivity of co-referential expressions in ‘that p’ contexts created by psychological verbs can consequently be understood (Frege proposed) in this way: the reference of the terms shifts in these contexts, so that, for example, ‘the Evening Star’ no longer refers to its customary reference (the planet Venus), but to a sense that functions, for the subject of the verb (the person who thinks, judges, desires) as his or her mode of presentation of this object. The sentence occurring in this context no longer refers to its truth value, but to the sense in which the mode of presentation is embedded — which might otherwise be called the ‘thought’ — or, by other philosophers, the ‘content’ of the subject's state of mind. This thought or content is to be understood not as a mental image, or indeed as anything essentially private to the thinker's mind — but as one and the same abstract entity that can be ‘grasped’ by two minds, and that must be so grasped if communication is to occur.
While on the surface this story may appear to be only about logic and semantics, and though Frege did not himself elaborate a general account of intentionality, what he says readily suggests the following picture. Intentional states of mind — thinking about Venus, wishing to visit it — involve some special relation (such as ‘mental grasping’) — not to a Venus ‘in one's mind,’ nor to an image of Venus, but — to an abstract entity, a thought, which also constitutes the sense of a linguistic expression that can be used to report one's state of mind, a sense which is grasped or understood by speakers who use it.
This style of account, together with the Fregean thesis that ‘sense determines reference,’ and the history of criticisms both have elicited, form much of the background of contemporary discussions of mental content. It is often assumed, with Frege, that we must recognize (as some thinkers in the empiricist tradition allegedly did not) that thoughts or contents cannot consist in images or essentially private ‘ideas.’ But philosophers have frequently criticized Frege's view of thought as some abstract entity ‘grasped’ or ‘present to’ the mind, and have wanted to replace Frege's unanalyzed ‘grasping’ with something more ‘naturalistic.’
Relatedly, it may be granted that the content of the thought reported is to be identified with the sense of the expression with which we report it. But then, it is argued, the identity of this content will not be determined individualistically, and may in some respects lie beyond the grasp (or not be fully ‘present to’ the mind of) the psychological subject. For what determines the reference of an expression may be a natural causal relation to the world — as Saul Kripke (1972) and Hilary Putnam (1975) have influentially argued is true for proper names, like ‘Nixon’ and ‘Cicero,’ and ‘natural kind’ terms like ‘gold’ and ‘water.’ Or (as Tyler Burge (1979) has influentially argued) two speakers who, considered as individuals, are qualitatively the same, may nevertheless each assert something different simply because of differing relations they bear to their respective linguistic communities. (For example, what one speaker's utterance of ‘arthritis’ means is determined not by what is ‘in the head’ of that speaker, but by the medical experts in his or her community.) And, if reference and truth conditions of expressions by which one's thought is reported or expressed are not determined by what is in one's head, and the content of one's thought determines their reference and truth conditions, then the content of one's thought is also not determined individualistically. Rather it is necessarily bound up with one's causal relations to certain natural substances, and one's membership in a certain linguistic community. Both linguistic meaning and mental contents are ‘externally’ determined.
The development of such ‘externalist’ conceptions of intentionality informs the reception of Russell's legacy in contemporary philosophy of mind as well. Russell also helped to put in play a conception of the intentionality of mental states, according to which each such state is seen as involving the individual's ‘acquaintance with a proposition’ (counterpart to Fregean ‘grasping’) — which proposition is at once both what is understood in understanding expressions by which the state of mind is reported, and the content of the individual's state of mind. Thus, intentional states are ‘propositional attitudes.’ Also importantly, Russell's famous analysis of definite descriptions into phrases employing existential quantifiers and general predicates underlay many subsequent philosophers' rejection of any conception of intentionality (like Meinong's) that sees in it a relation to non-existent objects. And, Russell's treatment drew attention to cases of what he called ‘logically proper names’ that apparently defy such analysis in descriptive terms (paradigmatically, the terms ‘this’ and ‘that’), and which (he thought) thus must refer ‘directly’ to objects. Reflection on such ‘demonstrative’ and ‘indexical’ (e.g., ‘I,’ ‘here,’ ‘now’) reference has led some (Kaplan 1979, Perry 1977) to maintain that the content of our states of mind cannot always be constituted by Fregean senses but must be seen as consisting partly of the very objects in the world outside our heads to which we refer, demonstratively, indexically — another source of support for an ‘externalist’ view of mental content, hence, of intentionality.
Yet another important source of externalist proclivities in twentieth century philosophy lies in the thought that the meaningfulness of a speaker's utterances depends on its potential intelligibility to hearers: language must be public — an idea that has found varying and influential expression in the work of Ludwig Wittgenstein, W.V.O. Quine, and Donald Davidson. This, coupled with the assumption that intentionality (or ‘thought’ in the broad (Cartesian) sense) must be expressible in language, has led some to conclude that what determines the content of one's mind must lie in the external conditions that enable others to attribute content.
However, the movement from Frege and Russell toward externalist views of intentionality should not simply be accepted as yielding a fund of established results: it has been subject to powerful and detailed challenges (by Searle (1983), and Kirk Ludwig (1996b), for example). But without plunging into the details of the internalism/externalism debate about mental content, we can recognize, in the issues just raised, certain themes bearing particularly on the connection between consciousness and intentionality.
For example: it is sometimes assumed that, whatever may be true of content or intentionality, the phenomenal character of one's experience, at least, is ‘fixed internally’ — i.e., it involves no necessary relations to the nature of particular substances in one's external environment or to one's linguistic community. But then the purported externalist finding that neither meaning nor content is ‘in the head’ may be read as showing the insufficiency of phenomenal consciousness to determine any intentionality or content. Something like this consequence is drawn by Putnam (1981), who takes the stream of consciousness to comprise nothing more than sensations and images, which (as Frege saw) should be sharply distinguished from thought and meaning. This interpretation of the import of externalist arguments may be reinforced by a tendency to tie (phenomenal) consciousness to non-intentional sensations, sensory qualities, or ‘raw feels,’ and hence to dissociate consciousness from intentionality (and allied notions of meaning and reference), a tendency that has been prominent in the analytic tradition (perhaps largely through the influence of that Ryle (1949) and Wittgenstein (1953) — (see Section (7)).
But it is not at all evident that externalist theories of content require us to estrange consciousness from intentionality. One might argue (as do Martin Davies 1997, Fred Dretske 1997, and Michael Tye 1995, 2002) that in certain relevant respects the phenomenal character of experience is also essentially determined by causal environmental connections. By contrast, one may argue (as do Ludwig (1996b) and Horgan and Tienson (2002)) that since it is conceivable that a subject have experience much like our own in phenomenal character, but radically different in external causes from what we take our own to be (in the extreme case, a mind bewitched by a Cartesian demon into massive hallucination), there must indeed be a realm of mental content that is not externally determined.
One other aspect of the Frege-Russell tradition of theorizing about content that impinges on the consciousness/intentionality connection is this. If ‘content’ is identified with the sense or the truth-condition determiners of the expressions used in the object-clause reporting intentional states of mind, it will seem natural to suppose that possession of mental content requires the possession of conceptual capacities of the sort involved in linguistic understanding — ‘grasping senses.’ But then, to the extent the phenomenal character of experience is inadequate to endow a creature with such capacities, it may seem that phenomenal consciousness has little to do with intentionality.
But this raises large issues. One is this: it should not be granted without question that the phenomenal character of our experience could be as it is in the absence of the sorts of conceptual capacities sufficient for (at least some types of) intentionality. And this is tied to the issue of whether or not the phenomenal character of experience is (as some suppose) a purely sensory affair. Some argue, on the contrary, that thought (not just imagistic, but conceptual thought) has phenomenal character too. (See Flanagan 1992, Horgan and Tienson 2002, Pitt 2004, Siewert 1998, Strawson 1994.) If so, then it is very far from clear that phenomenal character can be divorced from whatever conceptual capacities are necessary for intentionality.
Moreover we may ask: are concepts, properly speaking, always necessary for intentionality anyway? Here another issue rears its head: is there not perhaps a form of sensory intentionality, which does not require anything as distinctively intellectual or conceptual as is needed for the grasping of linguistic senses or propositions? (This presumably would be a kind of intentionality had by the pre-linguistic (e.g., babies) or by non-linguistic creatures (e.g., dogs).) Suppose that there is, and that this type of intentionality is inseparable from the phenomenal character of perceptual experience. Then, even if one assumes that such phenomenal consciousness is insufficient to guarantee the possession of concepts, it would be wrong to say that it has little to do with intentionality. (Advocates of varying versions of the idea that there is a distinctively ‘non-conceptual’ kind of content include Bermudez 1998, Crane 1992, Evans 1982, Peacocke 1992, and Tye 1995 — for a notable voice of opposition to this trend, see McDowell 1994.) A deep difficulty in assessing these debates lies in getting an acceptable conception of concepts to work with. We need to understand clearly what ‘having a concept of F’ does and does not require, before we can be clear about the content of and justification for the thesis of non-conceptual content.
These proposals about non-conceptual content bear some affinity with aspects of the phenomenological tradition alluded to earlier: Husserl's notion of ‘pre-predicative’ experience; Heidegger's treatment of the ‘ready-to-hand;’ and Merleau-Ponty's idea that in normal active perception we are conscious of place, not via a determinate ‘representation’ of it, but rather, relative to our capacities for goal-directed bodily behavior. Though to see the extent to which any of these are ‘non-conceptual’ in character would require not only more clarity about the conceptual/non-conceptual contrast, but considerable novel exegesis of these philosophers' works. (For one recent effort to draw a connection between phenomenological and analytic traditions on the issue of ‘non-conceptual content’ see Kelly 2001. For an effort to explain a Merleau-Pontyan notion of non-representational intentionality without drawing on a conceptual/non-conceptual contrast, see Siewert 2005.)
Also, one may plausibly try to find an affinity between externalist views in analytic philosophy, and the later phenomenologists' rejection of Husserl's reduction, based on their doubt that we can prise consciousness off from the world at which it is directed, and study its ‘intentional essence’ in solipsistic isolation. But if externalism can be defined broadly enough to encompass Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, Kripke, and Burge, still the comparison is strained when we take account of the different sources of ‘externalism’ in the phenomenologists. These have to do it seems (very roughly) with the idea that the way we are conscious of things (or at least, for Heidegger, the way they ‘show themselves’ to us) in our everyday activity cannot be quite generally separated from our actual practical engagement with entities of which we are thus conscious (which show themselves in this way)—such as in our use of tools. Also relevant is the idea that one's use of language (hence one's capacity for thought) requires gearing one's activity to a social world or cultural tradition, in which antecedently employed linguistic meaning is taken up and made one's own through one's relation with others. All this is supposed to make it infeasible to study the nature of intentionality by globally uprooting, in thought, the connection of experience with one's spatial surroundings (and — crucially for Merleau-Ponty — one's own body), and one's social environment. Whatever the merits of this line of thought, we should note: neither a causal connection with ‘natural kinds’ unmediated by reference-determining ‘modes of presentation,’ nor deference to the linguistic usage of specialists, nor belief in the need to reconstruct speaker's meaning from observed behavior, plays a role in the phenomenologists' doubts about the reduction, and what it reveals about consciousness.
The arduous exegesis required for a clearer and more detailed comparison of these views is not possible here. Nevertheless, following some of the main lines of thought in treatments of intentionality, descending on the one hand, primarily from Brentano and Husserl, and on the other, from Frege and Russell, certain fundamental issues concerning its relationship to consciousness have emerged. These include, first, the connection between consciousness and self-directed or self-reflexive intentionality. (It has already been seen that this topic preoccupied Brentano, Husserl and Sartre; its emergence as an important issue in analytic philosophy of mind will become more evident below, in Section 6.) Second, there is concern with the way in which (and the extent to which) mind is world-involving. (In the phenomenological tradition this can be seen in controversy over Husserl's phenomenological reduction; within the analytic tradition, in the critique of Fregean sense and the internalism/externalism debate.) Third, there is the putative distinction between conceptual or theoretical, and sensory or practical forms of intentionality. (In phenomenology this shows up in Husserl's contrast between judgment and pre-predicative experience, and related notions of his successors; in analytic philosophy this shows up in the (more recent) attention to the notion of ‘non-conceptual’ content.)
For more clarity regarding the consciousness-intentionality relationship and how these three topics figure prominently in views about it, it is necessary now to turn attention back to philosophical disagreements regarding consciousness that are much bound up with the distinctions mentioned in Section (1), among phenomenal consciousness, access consciousness, and reflexive/monitoring consciousness.
Consider the proposal that sense experience manifests a kind of intentionality distinct from and more basic than that involved in propositional thought and conceptual understanding. This might help form the basis for an account of consciousness. Perhaps conscious states of mind are distinguished partly by their possession of a type of content proper to the sensory subdivision of mind.
One source of the idea that a difference in type of content helps constitute a distinction between what is and is not phenomenally conscious lies in the apparent distinction between sense experience and judgment. To have conscious visual experience of a stimulus — for it to look some way to you — is one thing. To make judgments about it is something else. (This seems evident in the persistence of a visual illusion, even once one has become convinced of the error.) However, on some accounts of consciousness, this distinction itself is doubtful, since conscious sense experience is taken to be nothing more than a form a judging. Such a view is expressed by Daniel Dennett (1991), who takes the relevant form of judging to consist in one's possession of information or mental content available to the appropriate sort of ‘probes’ — the availability of content he calls ‘cerebral celebrity.’ For Dennett what distinguishes conscious states of mind is not their possession of a distinctive type of intentional content, but rather the richness of that content, plus its availability to the appropriate sort of cognitive operations. (Since the relevant class of operations is not sharply defined, neither, for Dennett, is the difference between which states of mind are conscious and which are not.)
Recent accounts of consciousness that, by contrast, give central place to a distinction between (conceptual) judgment and (non-conceptual — but still intentional) sense-experience include Michael Tye's (1995) theory, holding that it is (by metaphysical necessity) sufficient to have a conscious sense-perception that some representation of sensory stimuli is formed in one's head, ‘map-like’ in character, whose (‘non-conceptual’) content is ‘poised’ to affect one's (conceptual) beliefs. This form of mental representation Tye would contrast with the ‘sentential’ form proper to belief and judgment — and in that way, he might preserve the judgment/experience contrast as Dennett does not. Consider also Fred Dretske's (1995) view, that phenomenally conscious sensory intentionality consists in a kind of mental representation whose content is bestowed through a naturally selected ‘function to indicate.’ Such natural (evolution-implanted) sensory representation can arise independently of learning (unlike the more conceptual, language dependent sort), and is found widely distributed among evolved life.
Both Tye's and Dretske's views of consciousness (unlike Dennett's) make crucial use of a contrast between the types of intentionality proper to sense-experience, and that proper to linguistically expressed judgment. On the other hand, there is also some similarity among the theories, which can be brought out by noting a criticism of Dennett's view, analogues of which arise for Tye's and Dretske's views as well.
Some might think Dennett's account concerns only some variety of what Block would call ‘access consciousness.’ For on Dennett's account, it seems, to speak of visual consciousness is to speak of nothing over and above the sort of availability of informational content that is evinced in unprompted verbal discriminations of visual stimuli. And this view has been criticized for neglecting phenomenal consciousness (Block 1995 and Siewert 1998). It seems we may conceive of a capacity for spontaneous judgment triggered by and responsive to visual stimuli, which would occur in the absence of the judger's phenomenally conscious visual experience of the stimuli: the stimuli don't look any way to the subject, and yet they trigger accurate judgments about their presence. The notion of such a (hypothetical) form of ‘blindsight’ may be elaborated in such a way that we conceive of the judgment it affords as being at least as finely discriminatory (and as fine in informational content) as that enjoyed by those with extremely poor, blurry and un-acute conscious visual experience (as in the ‘legally blind’).But a view like Dennett's seems to make this scenario inconceivable.
However, this kind of criticism does not concern only those theories that would elide any experience/judgment distinction. For Tye's and Dretske's theories, though they depend on forms of that contrast (and are offered as theories of phenomenal consciousness), can raise similar concerns. For one might think that the hypothetical blindsighter would be as rightly regarded as having Tye's ‘poised’ maplike representations in her visual system as would someone with a comparable form of conscious vision. And one might find it unclear why we should think the visual system of such a blindsighter must be performing naturally endowed indicating functions more poorly than the visual system of a consciously sighted subject would.
Whatever the cogency of these concerns, one should note their distinctness from the issues about ‘kinds of intentionality’ that appear to separate both Tye and Dretske from Dennett. The notion that there is a fundamental distinction to be drawn in kinds of intentional content (separating the more intellectual from the more sensory departments of mind) sometimes forms the basis of an account of consciousness (as with Dretske's and Tye's, though not with Dennett's). But it is also important to recognize what unites Dennett, Tye, and Dretske. Despite their differences, all propose to account for consciousness by starting with a general understanding of intentionality (or mental content or representation) to which consciousness is inessential. They then offer to explain consciousness as a special case of intentionality thus understood — so, in terms of the operations the content is available for, or the form in which it is represented, or the nature of its external source. The blindsight-based objection to Dennett, and its possible extension to Dretske and Tye, helps bring this commonality to light.
The last section showed how some theories purport to account for consciousness on the basis of intentionality, in a way that focuses attention on attempts to discern a distinctively sensory type of intentionality. A different strategy for explaining consciousness via intentionality highlights the importance of clarity regarding the connection between consciousness and reflexivity. On such a view (roughly): experiences or states of mind are conscious just insofar as the mind represents itself as having them.
In David Rosenthal's (1986, 1991, 1993, 2002b) variant of this approach, a state is conscious just when it is a kind of (potentially non-conscious) mental state one has, which one (seemingly without inference) thinks that one is in. A theory of this sort starts with some way of classifying mental states that is supposed to apply to conscious and non-conscious states of mind alike. The proposal then is that such a state is conscious just when it belongs to one of those mental kinds, and the (‘higher order’) thought occurs to the person in that state that he or she is in a state of that kind. So, for example it is maintained that certain non-conscious states of mind can possess ‘sensory qualities’ of various sorts — one may, in a sense, be in pain without feeling pain, one may have a red sensory quality, even when nothing looks red to one. The idea is that one has a conscious visual experience of red, or a conscious pain sensation, just when one has such a red sensory quality, or pain-quality, and the thought (itself also potentially non-conscious) occurs to one that one has a red sensory quality, or pain-quality.
Such theories are sometimes bolstered by attention to the idea that phenomenally conscious states are states such that there's something it's like for one to be in them. Proponents of higher-order theories of consciousness (Carruthers 2002, Lycan 1995, 2004, Rosenthal 2002a, 2002b) argue that what it's like for one to be in a (first-order) sensory state is best construed in terms of one's representing that state in a special way—hence as higher-order representation. (See Byrne 2004 for criticism of this move.)
The higher-order representation way of accounting for consciousness in terms of intentionality may, like theories mentioned in Section 5, provoke the concern that the distinctively phenomenal sense of consciousness has been slighted — though this time, not in favor of some ‘access’ consciousness, but in favor of reflexive consciousness. One focus of such criticism lies in the idea that such higher-order thought requires the possession of concepts — concepts of types of mental states — that may be lacking in creatures with first order mentality (Seager 2004, Siewert 1998). It is unclear (in fact it seems false to say) we would be justified in concluding these beings would in that case have no conscious sensory experience in the phenomenal sense. Are we entitled to say that there is no way the world looks to rabbits, dogs, monkeys, and human babies, and they don't feel pain, on the grounds that they lack the conceptual wherewithal to think about their own experience?
One line of response to such concerns is simply to bite the bullet: dogs, babies and the like might altogether lack higher order thought, but that's no problem for the theory because, indeed, they also altogether lack feelings (Carruthers 1989). Rosenthal, for his part, takes a different line: lack of cognitive sophistication needn't instantly disqualify one for consciousness, since the possession of primitive mentalistic concepts requires so little that practically any organism we would consider a serious candidate for sensory consciousness (certainly babies, dogs and bunnies) would obviously pass muster.
A number of additional worries have been raised about both the necessity and the sufficiency of ‘higher-order thought’ for conscious sense experience. (See, for example, Dretske 1993, Güzeldere 1997, Seager 1999, and Siewert 1998.) In the face of such doubts, one may preserve the idea that consciousness consists in some kind of higher order representation — the mind's ‘scanning’ itself — by abandoning ‘higher-order thought’ for some other form of representation: one which is not thought-like or conceptual, but somehow sensory in character (Lycan 1995, 2004). Maybe somewhat as we can distinguish between primitive sensory perception of things in our environment, and the more intellectual, conceptual operations based on them, so we can distinguish the thoughts we have about our own (‘inner’) mental goings-on from the (‘inner’) sensing of them. And, if we propose that consciousness consists in this latter sort of higher order representation, it seems we will escape the worries occasioned by the Rosenthalian variant of the ‘reflexivist’ doctrine. In considering such theories, two of the consciousness-themes earlier discerned come together, namely: reflexivity (or higher order representation), and the contrast between the conceptual and non-conceptual (or sensory).
Criticism of ‘inner sense’ theories is likely to focus not so much on the thought that such inner sensing can occur without phenomenal consciousness, or that the latter can occur without the former, as on the difficulty in understanding just what inner sensing (as distinct from higher order thought) is supposed to be, and why we should think we have it. It seems the inner sense theorists share with those who distinguish between conceptual and non-conceptual (or sensory) flavors of intentionality the challenge of clarifying and justifying some version of this distinction. But they bear the additional burden of showing how such a distinction can be applied not just to intentionality directed at tables and chairs, but at the "furniture of the mind" as well. One may grant that there are non-conceptual sensory experiences of objects in one's external environment while doubting one has anything analogous regarding the ‘inner’ landscape of mind.
It should be noted that, in spite of the difficulties faced by higher order representation theories, they draw on certain perennially influential sources of philosophical appeal. We do have some willingness to speak of conscious states of mind as states we are conscious or aware of being in. It is tempting to interpret this as indicating some kind of reflexivity. And the history of philosophy reveals many thinkers attracted to the idea that consciousness is inseparable from some kind of self-reflexivity of mind. As noted varying versions of this idea can be found in Brentano, Husserl, and Sartre. And we can go further back: Kant (1787) spoke explicitly of ‘inner sense,’ and Locke (1690) defined consciousness as the ‘perception of what passes in a man's mind.’ Brentano (controversially) interpreted Aristotle's enigmatic and terse discussion of “seeing that one sees” in De Anima III.2 as an anticipation of his own ‘inner perception’ view.
However, there is this critical difference between the thinkers just cited and contemporary purveyors of higher order representation theories. The former do not maintain, as do the latter, that consciousness consists in one's forming the right sort of higher-order representation of a possibly non-conscious type of mental state. Even if they think that consciousness is inseparable from some sort of mental reflexivity, they do not suggest that consciousness can, so to speak, be analyzed into mental parts, none of which themselves essentially require consciousness. (Some could not maintain this, since they explicitly deny mentality without consciousness.) There is a difference between saying that reflexivity is essential to consciousness and saying that consciousness just consists in, and can be explained as, and reduced to a species of mental reflexivity. Advocacy of the former without advocacy of the latter is certainly possible. (See, for example, Smith 1986, 2005, Levine 2001, Ludwig 2001, Zahavi 1997, 2005.)
Suppose one holds that phenomenal consciousness is distinguishable both from ‘access’ and ‘reflexivity,’ and that it cannot be explained as a special case of intentionality. One might conclude from this that phenomenal consciousness and intentionality comprise two quite distinct realms of the mental, and embrace the idea that the phenomenal is a matter of non-intentional qualia or raw feels. One important current in the analytic tradition has evinced this attitude — it is found, for example, in Wilfrid Sellars' (1956) distinction between ‘sentience’ (sensation) and ‘sapience.’ Whereas the qualities of feelings involved in the former — mere sensations — require no cognitive sophistication and are readily attributable to brutes, the latter — involving awareness of, awareness that — requires that one have the appropriate concepts, which cannot be guaranteed by just having sensations; one needs learning and inferential capacities of a sort Sellars believed possible only with language. “Awareness,” Sellars says, “is a linguistic affair.”
Thus we may arrive at a picture of mind that places sensation on one side, and thought, concepts, and ‘propositional attitudes’ on the other. If one recognizes a distinctively phenomenal consciousness not captured in ‘representationalist’ theories of the kinds just scouted, one may then want to say: that is because the phenomenal belongs to mere sentience, and the intentional to sapience. Other influential philosophers of mind have operated with a similar picture. Consider Gilbert Ryle's (1949) contention that the stream of consciousness contains nothing but sensations that provide “no possibility of deciding whether the creature that had these was an animal or a human being; an idiot, a lunatic, or a sane man” — nothing of which it is appropriate to ask whether it is correct or incorrect, veridical or nonveridical. And Wittgenstein's (1953) influential criticisms of the notion of understanding as an ‘inner process,’ and of the idea of a language for private sensation divorced from public criteria, could be interpreted in ways that sever (phenomenal) consciousness from intentionality. (Such an interpretation would assume that if consciousness could secure understanding, understanding would be an ‘inner process,’ and if phenomenal character bore intentionality with it, private sensations could impart meaning to words.) Also recall Putnam's conviction that the (internal) stream of consciousness cannot furnish the (externally fixed) content of meaning and belief. A similar attitude is evident in Donald Davidson's (1983, 1986) distinction between sensation and thought (the former is nothing more than a causal condition of knowledge, while the latter can furnish reasons and justifications, but cannot occur without language). Richard Rorty (1979) makes a Sellarsian distinction between the phenomenal and the intentional key to his polemic against epistemological philosophy in general, and ‘foundationalism’ in particular (and takes a generally deflationary view of the phenomenal or ‘qualitative’ side of this divide).
But it is possible to reject attempts to subsume the phenomenal under the intentional as in the ‘representationalist’ accounts of consciousness variously exemplified in Carruthers, Dennett, Dretske, Lycan and Tye, without adopting this ‘two separate realms’ conception. We can believe that there is no conception of the intentional from which the phenomenal can be explanatorily derived that does not already include the phenomenal, but still believe also that the phenomenal character of experience cannot be separated from its intentionality, and that having experience of the right sort of phenomenal character is sufficient for having certain forms of intentionality (McGinn 1991, Horgan and Tienson 2002, Siewert 1998). Here one might leave open the question whether there is also some kind of phenomenal character (perhaps that involved in some kinds of bodily sensation or after-images) whose possession is not sufficient for intentionality. (Though if we say there is such non-intentional phenomenal character, this would give us a special reason for rejecting the representationalist explanations of phenomenal consciousness mentioned in Section 5.) If, on the other hand, we say phenomenal character always brings intentionality with it, that might be ‘representationalism’ of a sort. But its endorsement is consistent with a rejection of attempts to derive phenomenality from intentionality, or reduce the former to a species of the latter, which commonly attract the ‘representationalist’ label. We should distinguish the question of whether the phenomenal can be explained by the intentional from the question of whether the phenomenal is separable from the intentional. And so we should recognize a distinction between reductive and non-reductive forms of representationalism or intentionalism about consciousness (Chalmers 2004).
Closer consideration of two of the three themes earlier identified as common to phenomenological and analytic traditions is needed to evaluate representationalist views of consciousness. It is necessary to inquire: (a) whether an externalist conception of intentionality can justify separating phenomenal character from intentionality. And one needs to ask: (b) whether one's verdict on the ‘separability’ question stands or falls with acceptance of some version of a distinction between conceptual and non-conceptual (or distinctively sensory) forms of intentionality.
The dialectical situation regarding (a) is complex. One way it may seem plausible to answer question (a) in the affirmative, and restrict phenomenal character and intentionality to different sides of some internal/external divide, is to conduct a Cartesian thought experiment, in which one conceives of consciousness with all its subjective riches surviving the utter annihilation of the spatial realm of nature. (Similarly, but less radically, one may conceive of a ‘brain in a vat’ generating an extended history of sense experience indistinguishable in phenomenal character from that of an embodied subject.) If one is committed to an externalist view of intentionality — but rejects the intentionalizing strategies of Sections (5) and (6) for dealing with consciousness — one may conclude that phenomenal character is altogether separable from (and insufficient for) intentionality. However, one may draw rather different conclusions from the Cartesian thought experiment — turning it against externalism. It may seem to one that, since the intentionality of experience would apparently survive along with its phenomenal character, one may then infer that the causal tie between the mind's content and the world of objects beyond it that (according to some versions of externalism) fixes content, is in reality and in at least some cases (or for some contents), no more than contingent. (This is the lesson Husserl, Ludwig, Horgan and Tienson would draw.)
Alternatively, whatever one relies on to argue that this or that relation of experience and world is essential to having any intentionality at all, one may well take this to show that phenomenal character is also externally determined in a way that renders the Cartesian scenario of consciousness totally unmoored from the world an illusion. And, if Merleau-Ponty or Heidegger think that Husserl's phenomenological reduction to a sphere of ‘pure’ consciousness cannot be completed, and their reasons make them externalists of some sort, it hardly seems to establish that they are committed to a (Sellarsian or Rylean) realm of raw sensory phenomenal consciousness, devoid of intentionality. In fact their rejection of Husserl's notion of ‘uninterpreted’ sensory or ‘hyletic’ data in experience would seem to indicate they, at least, would strongly deny they held such views.
In this arena it is far from clear what we are entitled to regard as secure ground and what as ‘up for grabs.’ However, there do seem to be ways in which all would probably admit that the phenomenal character of experience and externally individuated content come apart, ways in which such content goes beyond anything phenomenal consciousness can supply. For the way it seems to me to experience this computer screen may be no different from the way it seems to my twin to experience some entirely distinct one. Thus where intentional contents are distinguished in such a way as to include the particular objects experienced or thought of, phenomenal character cannot determine the possession of content. Still, that does not show that no content of any sort is fixed by phenomenal character. Perhaps, as some would say, phenomenal character determines ‘narrow’ or ‘notional’ content, but not ‘wide’ (externally ‘fixed’) content. Nor is it even clear that we must judge the sufficiency of phenomenal character for intentionality by adopting some general account of content and its individuation (as ‘narrow’ or ‘wide’ for instance), and then ask whether one's possession of content so considered is entailed by the phenomenal character of one's experience. One may argue that the phenomenal character of one's experience suffices for intentionality as long as having it makes one assessable for truth, accuracy (or other sorts of ‘satisfaction’) without the addition of any interpretation, properly so-called, such as is involved in assessment of the truth or accuracy of sentences or pictures (Siewert 1998).
Even if one does not globally divide phenomenal character from intentionality along some inner/outer boundary line, to address questions of the sufficiency of phenomenal character for intentionality (and thus of the separability of the latter from the former), one still needs to look at question (b) above, and the potential relevance of distinctions that have been proposed between conceptual and non-conceptual forms of content or intentionality. Again the situation is complex. Suppose one regards the notion of non-conceptual intentionality or content as unacceptable on the grounds that all content is conceptual. But suppose one also thinks it is clear that phenomenal character is confined to sensory experience and imagery, and that this cannot bring with it the rational and inferential capacities required for genuine concept possession. Then one will have accepted the separability of phenomenal consciousness from intentionality. However, one may, by contrast, take the apparent susceptibility of phenomenally conscious sense experience to assessment for accuracy, without need for additional, potentially absent interpretation, to show that the phenomenal character of experience is inherently intentional. Then one will say that the burden lies on anyone who claims conceptual powers are crucial to such assessability and can be detached from the possession of such experience: they must identify those powers and show that they are both crucial and detachable in this way. Additionally (as noted in Section 4), one may reasonably challenge the assumption that phenomenal consciousness is indeed confined to the sensory realm; one may say that conceptual thought also has phenomenal character. Even if one does not, one may still base one's confidence in the sufficiency of phenomenal character for intentionality on one's confidence that there is a kind of non-conceptual intentionality that clearly belongs essentially to sense experience. (Such presumably would be Michael Tye's position.)
From these considerations, we can see that it is critical to answer the following questions in order to decide whether or not phenomenal character is wholly or significantly separable from intentionality.
- Does every sort of intentionality that belongs to thought and experience require external connections for which phenomenal character is insufficient?
- Does every sort of intentionality that belongs to sense-experience and sensory imagery require conceptual abilities for which phenomenal character is insufficient?
- Does every sort of intentionality that belongs to thought require conceptual capacities for which phenomenal character is insufficient?
Suppose one finds phenomenal character quite generally inadequate for the intentionality of thought and sense-experience by answering ‘yes’ either to (i), or to both (ii) and (iii). And suppose one makes the plausible (if non-trivial) assumption that what guarantees intentionality for neither sensory experience, nor imagery, nor conceptual thought, guarantees no intentionality that belongs to our minds (including that of emotion, desire and intention — for these latter presuppose the former). Then one will find phenomenal character altogether separable from intentionality. Phenomenal character could be as it is, even if intentionality were completely taken away. There is no form of phenomenal consciousness, and no sort of intentionality, such that the first suffices for the second.
A more moderate view might merely answer only one of either (ii) or (iii) in the affirmative (and probably (iii) would be the choice). But still, in that case one recognizes some broad mental domain whose intentionality is in no respect guaranteed by phenomenal character. And that too would mark a considerable limitation on the extent to which phenomenal consciousness brings intentionality with it.
On the other hand, suppose that one answers ‘no’ to (i), and to either (ii) or (iii). Now, external connections and conceptual capacities seem to be what we might most plausibly regard as conditions necessary for the intentionality of thought and experience that could be stripped away while phenomenal character remains constant. So if one thinks that actually neither are generally essential to intentionality and removable while phenomenal character persists unchanged, and one can think of nothing else that is essential for thought and experience to have any intentionality, but for which phenomenal character is insufficient, it seems reasonable to conclude that phenomenal character is indeed sufficient for intentionality of some sort. If one has gone this far, it seems unlikely that one will then think that actual differences in phenomenal character still leave massively underdetermined the different forms of intentionality we enjoy in perceiving and thinking. So, one will probably judge that some kind of phenomenal character suffices for, and is inseparable from, many significant forms of intentionality in at least one of these domains (sensory or cognitive): there are many differences in phenomenal character, and many in intentionality, such that you cannot have the former without the latter. If one also rejects both (ii) and (iii), then one will accept that (appropriate forms of) phenomenal consciousness are sufficient for a very broad and important range of human intentionality.
It should be noted, however, that even if one maintains the fairly strong connection between consciousness and intentionality for which one could argue on the basis of rejecting (i)-(iii), one still has room to hold back from affirming an even stronger connection: the idea that phenomenal character supervenes on intentional content. For one may allow that phenomenal character is sufficient for many kinds of intentional content of both thought and perception, while holding that there can be differences in character without differences in content. Such would be the case, for example, if one held that there are (or can be) differences in the phenomenal character of different sensory modalities (e.g., visual and tactile) even where they have just the same representational content. One might also think that two visual experiences could represent the same objective color property on account of sharing appropriate causal linkages to the physical environment, even though subjectively the experience of color differed, through some internally contrived inversion of what it was like for one to experience color on the two occasions.
Suppose one rejects both the view that consciousness is explanatorily derived from a more fundamental intentionality, as well as the view that phenomenal character is insufficient for intentionality because it is a matter of raw inward feel. It seems one might then press farther, and argue for what Flanagan (1992) calls ‘consciousness essentialism’ — the view that the phenomenal character of experience is not only sufficient for various forms of intentionality, but necessary also.
This type of thesis needs careful formulation. It does not necessarily commit one to a Cartesian (or Brentanian or Sartrean) claim that all states of mind are conscious — a total denial of the reality of the unconscious. A more qualified thesis does seem desirable. Though Freud's waning prestige has weakened tendencies to assume that he had somehow demonstrated the reality of unconscious intentionality, the rise of cognitive science has created a new climate of educated opinion that also takes elaborate non-conscious mental machinations for granted—the ‘cognitive unconscious.’ Even if we do not acquiesce in this view, we do (and long have) appealed to explanations of human behavior that recognize some sort of intentional states other than phenomenally conscious experiences and thoughts.
One way of maintaining the necessity of consciousness to mind that can preserve some space for mind that is not conscious is Searle's (1990, 1992). He argues, roughly, that we should first distinguish between what he calls ‘intrinsic’ intentionality on the one hand, and merely ‘as if’ intentionality, and ‘interpreter relative’ intentionality, on the other. We sometimes may speak as if artifacts (like thermostats) had beliefs or desires — but this isn't to be taken literally. And we may impose ‘conditions of satisfaction’ on our acts and creations (words, pictures, diagrams, etc.) by our interpretation of them — but they have no intentionality independent of our interpretive practices. Intrinsic intentionality, on the other hand — the kind that pertains to our beliefs, perception, and intentions — is neither a mere ‘manner of speech,’ nor is our possession of it derived from others' interpretive stance towards us. But then, Searle asks, what accounts for the fact that some states of affairs in world have intrinsic intentionality — that they are directed at objects under aspects — and why they are directed under the aspects they are (why they have the content they do)? With conscious states of mind, Searle says, their phenomenal or subjective character determines their ‘aspectual shape.’ Where non-conscious states of mind are concerned, there is nothing to do the job, but their relationship to consciousness. The right relationship, he holds, is this: non-conscious states of mind must be ‘potentially conscious.’ If some psychological theories (of language, of vision) postulate an unconscious so deeply buried that its mental representations cannot even potentially become conscious, so much the worse for those theories.
Searle's views have aroused a number of criticisms. (See the peer commentary in response to Searle 1990.) Among the problem areas are these. First, how are we to spell out the requirement that intrinsically intentional states be ‘potentially conscious,’ without making it either too easy or to difficult to satisfy? Second, just why is it that the intrinsic intentionality of non-conscious states needs accounting for, while that of conscious states is somehow unproblematic? Third, it appears Searle's argument does not offer some general reason to rule out all efforts to give ‘naturalistic’ accounts of conditions sufficient to impose — without the help of consciousness — genuine and not merely interpreter relative intentionality.
Another approach is taken by Kirk Ludwig (1996a), who argues that there is nothing to determine whose state of mind a given non-conscious state of mind is, unless that state consists in a disposition to produce a conscious mental state of the right sort. Alleged mental processes that did not tend to produce someone's conscious states of mind appropriately would be no one's, which is to say that they would not be mental states at all. Roughly: consciousness is needed to provide that unity of mind without which there would be no mind. And Ludwig argues that it is therefore a mistake to attribute many of the unconscious inferences with which psychological theorists have long been wont to populate our minds.
The persuasiveness of Searle's and Ludwig's arguments depends heavily on demonstrating the failure of alternative accounts of the job that they enlist consciousness to do (such as secure ‘aspectual shape,’ or ownership). One may well grant (as does Colin McGinn 1991) that phenomenal character is inseparable from intentionality, but cannot be explained by it, while still maintaining that genuine intentionality (mental content) is quite adequately imposed on animal brains by their acquisition of natural functions of content-bearing — in which consciousness evidently plays no essential role. Or one may (like Jerry Fodor 1987) maintain a robustly realist ‘representational theory of mind,’ proposing that the content of mental symbols is stamped on them by their being in the ‘right causal relation’ to the world — while despairing of the prospects for a credible naturalistic theory of consciousness.
The preceding discussion has conveyed some of the complexities and potential ambiguities in talk of ‘consciousness’ (Section 1) and ‘intentionality’ (Section 2) that must be appreciated if one is to resolve questions about the relationship between consciousness and intentionality with any clarity. Brief surveys of relevant aspects of phenomenological (Section 3) and analytic (Section 4) traditions have brought out some shared areas of interest, namely: the relationship of consciousness to reflexivity and ‘self-directed’ intentionality; efforts to distinguish between conceptual and non-conceptual (or sensory) forms of intentionality; and a concern with the extent to which the character of either conscious experience or intentional states of mind is essentially ‘world-involving.’ These concerns were seen to bear on attempts to account for consciousness in terms of intentionality in Sections 5 and 6, and also on questions that arise even if those attempts are rejected — questions regarding the separability of phenomenal consciousness and intentionality (Section 7). In Section 8 attention was given to views that, in some sense, reverse the order of explanation proposed by intentionalizing views of consciousness, and take the facts of consciousness to explain the facts of intentionality. Now it is possible to step back and distinguish four general views of the consciousness-intentionality relationship discernable in the philosophical positions canvassed above, as follows.
- Consciousness is explanatorily derived from intentionality.
- Consciousness is underived and separable from intentionality.
- Consciousness is underived but also inseparable from intentionality.
- Consciousness is underived from, inseparable from, and essential to intentionality.
To adopt view (a) is to accept some intentionalizing strategy with respect to consciousness, such as is variously represented by Carruthers, Dennett, Dretske, Lycan, Rosenthal, and Tye. These views differ importantly among themselves, and their differences have much to do with how they treat consciousness-reflexivity issues and the conceptual/non-conceptual (or conceptual/sensory) contrast, and how they view the intersection between the two. But if we adopt (a), then our answer to the question of what consciousness has to do with intentionality will ultimately be given in some prior general account of content or intentionality. And there will be no special issue regarding the internal or external fixation of the phenomenal character of experience, over and above what arises for mental content generally.
On the other hand, suppose one rejects (a), and holds that experiences are conscious in a phenomenal sense that does not yield to an approach in which one conceives of intentionality (or content, or information bearing) independently of consciousness, and then, by adverting to special operations, or sources, or contents, tells us what consciousness is. At this point, one would face a choice between (b) and (c).
Adopting (b) yields the ‘raw feel’ conception of phenomenality seemingly implicit in Sellars and Ryle. If, on the other hand, we adopt (c), we endorse a much more intimate relationship between consciousness and intentionality. Without proposing to account for the former on the basis of the latter, we would hold that phenomenal character is sufficient for intentionality.
But adoption of (c) leaves open a further basic question. Consciousness (of the appropriate sort) may be sufficient for (but underived from) intentionality, and yet, intentionality does not require consciousness. Thus we come to ask whether having conscious experience of an appropriate sort is necessary to having either sensory or more-than-sensory (conceptual) intentionality.
If adopting thesis (d), we say ‘yes’ — that such intentionality can come only with consciousness — we will probably have gone as far in making consciousness fundamental to mind as one reasonably can. Again, this is not necessarily to deny the reality of non-conscious mental phenomena. But it could, in a broad way, be interpreted as siding with Husserl, Ludwig and Searle in thinking of consciousness as the irreplaceable source of intentionality and meaning.
This abstract list of four options might leave one without a sense of what is at stake in adopting this or that view. Perhaps the positions themselves will become a little clearer if we make explicit four broad areas of philosophical concern to which the choice among them is relevant.
First, they are relevant to the issue of how to conceive of the mind or the domain of psychology as a whole. Is there some unity to the concept of mind or psychological phenomenal? Is there something that deserves to be considered the essence of the mental? If consciousness can be thoroughly intentionalized (as (a) would have it), maybe (with suitable qualifications), we could uphold the thesis that intentionality is the "mark of the mental." If we reject (a) and embrace (c), seeing intentionality as inseparable from the phenomenal character of experience, then we still might maintain that both consciousness and intentionality are necessary for real minds — at least, if we adopt (d) as well. But a unified view of the mind seems difficult (if not impossible) to maintain if one segregates phenomenal character to non-intentional sensation — as in (b). Even if one does not, one may lack a unifying conception of the mental domain, if one is not satisfied with arguments that show that phenomenal consciousness is essential to genuine (not merely “as if” or “interpreter derived”) intentionality. In any case, both consciousness and intentionality are broad enough psychological categories, that one's view of their extension and relationship will do much to draw one's map of psychology's terrain.
Second (and relatedly), views about the consciousness-intentionality relationship bear significantly on general questions about the explanation of mental phenomena. One may ask what kinds of things we might try to explain in the mental domain, what sorts of explanations we should seek, and what prospects of success we have in finding them. If we accept (a) and some intentionalizing account of consciousness, we will not suppose as do some (Chalmers 1996, Levine 2001, McGinn 1991, and Nagel 1974) that phenomenal consciousness poses some specially recalcitrant (maybe hopelessly unsolvable) problem for reductive physicalist or materialist explanations. Rather, we will see the basic challenge as that of giving a natural scientific account of intentionality or mental representation. And this indeed is a reason some are attracted to (a). One may believe that it offers us the only hope for a natural scientific understanding of consciousness. The underlying thought is that a science of consciousness must adopt this strategy: first conceive of intentionality (or content or mental representation) in a way that separates it from consciousness, and see intentionality as the outcome of familiar (and non-intentional) natural causal processes. Then, by further specifying the kind of intentionality involved (in terms of its use, its sources, its content), we can account for consciousness. In other words: ‘naturalize’ intentionality, then intentionalize consciousness, and mind has found its place in nature.
However, we should recognize a distinction between those whose envisioned naturalistic explanation would require underlying forms of necessity and impossibility stronger that that pertaining to laws of nature generally — such as either conceptual or ‘metaphysical’ necessity — and those who see the link between explanans and explanandum as simply one of natural scientific law. David Chalmers' (1996) ‘naturalistic dualism’ (unlike those of the aforementioned naturalizers) put him in the second group. He argues that phenomenal consciousness in its various forms supervenes (not conceptually or metaphysically but only as a matter of nature's laws) on functional organization, and that this permits us to envisage (‘non-reductive’) ways of explaining consciousness by appeal to such organization.
Those who reject attempts to explain the phenomenal consciousness via a theory of intentionality still may reasonably proclaim allegiance to ‘naturalism.’ One may take phenomenal consciousness to be, in a sense, psychologically basic (if all that is mental is either phenomenally conscious or intentional, and no intentionalizing account of phenomenal character is feasible). But one might still hold that some non-intentional neuropsychological (or other, recognizably physicalist) explanation of the phenomenal character of experience is to be had, either because the explanatory link here exhibits an appropriately strong (conceptual or metaphysical) necessity (Block 2001), or because nothing stronger than psychophysical laws of nature are needed to give us the prospect of a natural scientific account of consciousness.
However, if we not only reject intentionalizing accounts of phenomenal character, but also see it as inseparable from intentionality (if we reject both (a) and (b) and accept (c)), then whatever problems attach to physicalist explanations of consciousness will also infect prospects for explaining intentionality — to some extent at least. And this will hold, even if we remain aloof from (d), and do not claim that phenomenal consciousness is essential to intentionality. For if we think that much of the intentionality we have in perceiving, imagining, and thinking is integral to the phenomenal character of such experience, then without a reductive explanation of that phenomenal character, our possession of the intentionality it brings will not be reductively explained either.
Finally, it should be noted that if one holds (d), this may have important consequences for what forms of psychological explanation one finds acceptable. For Searle and Ludwig argue that one's mental processes must have the right relationship to one's conscious experiences to count as one's mental processes at all. If they are right, postulated processes that do not bear this relation to our experiential lives cannot be going on in our minds.
A third broad area of concern on which our choice among (a)-(d) bears is epistemological. If one adopts (b), and something like a Sellarsian or Davidsonian distinction between sensation and thought, putting phenomenal character exclusively on the ‘sensation’ side, and intentionality exclusively on the ‘thought’ side of this divide, the place of consciousness in a philosophical account of knowledge will likely be meager — at most phenomenal character will be a causal condition, without a role to play in the warrant or justification of claims to knowledge. However, if one takes route (a) or (c) the situation will appear rather different. If one either intentionalizes consciousness, or else views intentionality as inseparable from phenomenal character, there will then be more room to view consciousness as central to accounts of the warrant involved in first-person (‘introspective’) knowledge of mind, and empirical or perceptual knowledge. Though just how one goes about this, and with what success, will depend on how (if one chooses (a)) one intentionalizes consciousness, and (if one chooses (a) or (c)), that will depend on what sort of intentionality or content one thinks phenomenal consciousness brings with it. The place of consciousness in one's understanding of introspective or empirical knowledge will be rather different, depending on how one resolves the issues regarding: reflexivity; the conceptual/non-conceptual distinction; and externalism.
A fourth area of philosophical concern we may indicate broadly, closely bound to our conception of the relation of consciousness and intentionality, has to do with value. How intimately is consciousness bound up with those features of our own and others' lives that give them intrinsic or non-instrumental value for us? We may think that the pleasure and suffering that demand our ethical concern are necessarily phenomenally conscious — and that this evaluative significance remains even if phenomenal character is non-intentional. However, the more intentionality is seen as inherent to the phenomenal character of experience, the more the latter will be bound to manifestations of intelligence, emotion, and understanding that appear to give human (and perhaps at least some other animal life) its special importance for us.
It may seem that those opting for (c) share at least this much ground with their intentionalizing opponents who go for (a): they both (unlike those who adopt (b)) are in a position to claim consciousness is crucial to whatever special moral regard we think appropriate only towards those whose psychologies involve a kind of intentionality for which possession of painful or pleasant experience is not sufficient. However, this needs qualification on two counts. First, if one's embrace of (a) includes an intentionalizing strategy that limits phenomenal character to the sensory realm, one will limit the moral significance of phenomenal consciousness accordingly. Second, to those who hold (c), it may well seem their opponents' intentionalizing theories remove from view those very qualities of experience that make life worth living, and so they will hardly seem like allies on the issue of value. Further, if the proponent of (c) balks at going so far as to take on (d) — conscious essentialism — those who make that additional commitment may well wonder how those who do not could ultimately accord the possession of consciousness much greater non-instrumental value than the possession of a sophisticated but totally non-conscious mind.
From this survey it seems fair to conclude that working out a detailed view of the relation between consciousness and intentionality is hardly a peripheral matter philosophically. Potentially it has far-reaching consequences for one's views concerning these four important, broad topics:
- The unity of mental phenomena (Do consciousness or intentionality (or both together) somehow unify the domain of the psychological?)
- The explanation of mental phenomena (Can consciousness and intentionality be explained separately? Is explaining the one key to explaining the other?)
- Introspective and empirical knowledge (What relation to intentionality would give consciousness a central epistemological role in either?)
- The value of human and other animal life. (What relation of consciousness and intentionality (if any) underlies the non-instrumental value we accord ourselves and others?)
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- Online Papers on Consciousness, compiled by David Chalmers
- NEH Summer Institute: Consciousness and Intentionality, website for Summer Institute of 2002, maintained by David Chalmers