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Feminist Perspectives on Science
Feminists have a number of distinct interests in, and perspectives on, science. The tools of science have been a crucial resource for understanding the nature, impact, and prospects for changing gender-based forms of oppression; in this spirit, feminists actively draw on, and contribute to, the research programs of a wide range of sciences. At the same time, feminists have identified the sciences as a source as well as a locus of gender inequalities: the institutions of science have a long tradition of excluding women as practitioners; feminist critics of science find that women and gender (or, more broadly, issues of concern to women and sex/gender minorities) are routinely marginalized as subjects of scientific inquiry, or are treated in ways that reproduce gender-normative stereotypes; and, closing the circle, scientific authority has frequently served to rationalize the kinds of social roles and institutions that feminists call into question.
Feminist perspectives on science therefore reflect a broad spectrum of epistemic attitudes toward and appraisals of science. Some urge the reform of gender inequities in the institutions of science and call for attention to neglected questions with the aim of improving the sciences in their own terms; they do not challenge the standards and practices of the sciences they engage. Others pursue jointly critical and constructive programs of research that, to varying degrees, aim at transforming the methodologies, substantive content, framework assumptions, and epistemic ideals that animate the sciences. The content of these perspectives, and the degree to which they generate transformative critique, depends not only on the types of philosophical and political commitments that inform them but also on the nature of the sciences and subject domains on which they bear. Feminist perspectives have had greatest impact on sciences that deal with inherently gendered subjects—the social and human sciences—and, secondarily, on sciences that study subjects characterized in gendered terms, metaphorically or by analogy (projectively gendered subjects), chiefly the biological and life sciences. Feminist perspectives are relevant to sciences that deal with non-gendered subject matters, but perspectives vary substantially in content and in critical import depending on the sciences and the particular research programs they engage.
- 1. Dimensions of Difference among Feminist Perspectives on Science
- 2. Feminist Equity Critiques
- 3. From Selective Appropriation to Content Critique
- 4. The Feminist Method Debate
- 5. Feminist Science Studies
- 6. Philosophical Implications
- 7. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Feminist scientists and feminist critics and analysts of science articulate positions that range from profound ambivalence to respect, even enthusiasm, for the sciences. At the critical end of this spectrum of feminist perspectives on science lie such famous indictments of science as Virginia Woolf's declaration: “science, it would seem, is not sexless: he is a man, a father and infected too” (1938). Lorraine Code takes a similar view, at a meta-scientific level, arguing that science-based epistemologies are inherently anti-feminist (1991, 314; 1993, 20). The worry here is that the sciences are not just superficially or inadvertently androcentric—male-centered in the questions they ask, in their claims and practice, their institutions and authority, their implications for the lives of women and for those marginalized within normative sex/gender systems—but are unreconstructably sexist; they embody deep and systematic gender bias by which women themselves, and any interests, perspectives, insights associated with them, are disvalued and marginalized. On this view the sciences are “master's tools,” to use Audre Lorde's phrase (1984), that will inevitably subvert attempts to turn them to emancipatory or, at least, non-oppressive ends.
In fact, such implacably negative views of science are more often attributed to feminists than embraced by them. In arguments characteristic of the Science Wars of the 1990s, philosophical critics like Haack 1993, Pinnick 2005, Gross and Levitt 1994, as well as contributors to Pinnick et al. 2003, and to Gross et al. 1996, insist that feminist and other allegedly naïve critiques of science are predicated on a cynical, anti-enlightenment rejection of the epistemic ideals that (properly) animate scientific inquiry. They maintain this position despite trenchant criticism that challenges the accuracy of their claims about feminist science studies scholarship, and exposes inconsistencies within their own arguments (e.g., Anderson 2004a, 1995; Nelson and Nelson 1994; Wylie 1995a). The claim that feminists are categorically hostile to science appears to derive from a conviction that feminism, as a political stance, is inimical to science; the politics of feminism threaten the epistemic integrity of science. This presupposes the convention of a sharp distinction between the contexts of discovery, in which contingent social values and interests have free reign setting the research agenda (shaping questions and generating hypotheses), and contexts of justification in which the scientific adjudication of knowledge claims (prospective answers, competing hypotheses) is rigorously rational and exclusively informed by considerations of evidence. On this view, the distinctive objectivity of the sciences depends on shielding scientific inquiry (in its justificatory mode) from the influence of contextual (non-epistemic) values and interests of just the sort that feminists would bring to bear. Haack finds it so profoundly counter-intuitive that feminist perspectives might be relevant to the sciences in any constructive sense that she speculates about the motivations of those who embrace this category mistake. Feminist philosophers of science and their fellow travellers must either be cynics who intend to subvert the ideals and the authority of science, or disillusioned romantics who held such unrealistically high expectations of science that, when evidence from actual practice undermined these ideals, they lost epistemic faith altogether (Haack 1993, 560–562).
Feminist perspectives on the sciences are more complex and diverse than such critics acknowledge. It does not follow from feminist critiques—of scientific institutions, the authority vested in the disciplines identified as scientific, framework assumptions, or specific methodologies and research results—that feminists are hostile to the sciences, to the epistemic ideals presumed to underpin the sciences, or to the diverse assumptions and methods associated with specific research traditions. Many feminists embrace (and defend) the orienting ideals and tradition-specific conventions associated with the fields in which they work. Some focus chiefly on equity issues, often insisting that gender bias in the institutions of science do not bear on issues of content or method (see section Feminist Equity Critiques below). Others make a case for redefining research priorities without challenging existing research traditions; they aim to extend well established modes of inquiry to questions that have not been asked and to aspects of otherwise well mapped subject domains that have been neglected but that are of particular interest to women and feminists. This selective appropriation of the conventional tools of science also serves critical ends when feminists use them to expose and correct gender bias in the content of favored models and theories or background assumptions; these critiques are sometimes presupposed by, and sometimes arise from remedial interventions. Advocates of these “successor science” projects, as Harding describes them (1986, 160, 240), often endorse the very epistemic ideals of objectivity and value freedom feminists are accused of repudiating. They insist that feminist critiques of and contributions to the sciences should be taken seriously because they represent better science, in a quite traditional sense, not because they are feminist; although feminist interests contribute to exposing gender bias and raising new questions, these scientists assume that their interests are irrelevant to the empirical and conceptual grounds that warrant their claims.
In practice these more circumscribed feminist critiques of science—equity critiques, arguments for applying the tools of science to new research questions, localized critiques of sexism or androcentrism in specific claims or methods, and remedial research designed to correct these omissions or biases—often raise more profound epistemic/methodological, ontological/theoretical, and socio-political questions about the sciences than their advocates (initially) intend (see section From Selective Appropriation to Content Critique and section The Feminist Method Debate below). Even epistemically conservative critiques expose a depth and pervasiveness of gender bias in our best science as well as in manifestly bad science (Harding 1986, 19, 102–105), calling into question the neutrality of the conceptual frameworks within which scientists work and, by extension, the capacity of standard research methodologies to ensure the objectivity of the scientific understanding informed by them. Conversely, new questions lead to new research strategies, new categories of analysis, and an expanded repertoire of explanatory hypotheses, which frequently result in research programs that chart new domains of inquiry (see section From Selective Appropriation to Content Critique below). In the end, feminist initiatives often reshape scientific practice, in the process challenging conventional models of scientific practice and its orienting ideals (see section Philosophical Implications below).
It is epistemically significant that critical reflection on these feminist interventions in the sciences, undertaken internally by practitioners and by external commentators and scholars, suggest that the interests and “angle of vision” that feminists bring to bear on the sciences can play a constructive role in exposing error, raising evidential standards, and generating innovative insights (see section From Selective Appropriation to Content Critique below). This poses a fundamental challenge to the conviction that contingent contextual values unavoidably corrupt the capacity of science to generate credible knowledge. More generally, it challenges the assumption that, if the success of scientific inquiry is not measured by its ability to produce timeless, context-transcendent truths, the only alternative must be capitulation to some form of epistemic nihilism: a corrosive relativism or subjectivism according to which we can only ever endorse beliefs that have been fixed, in advance of inquiry, by shifting context-specific interests. What constructive as well as critical feminist engagements with science demonstrate is that contextual values and interests are not only ineliminable from scientific practice, but are instrumental to its empirical and explanatory success, including its capacity to disrupt entrenched patterns of understanding (see section Philosophical Implications below). The central epistemic challenge for feminists, then, is to conceptualize what counts as success in scientific inquiry in terms that realistically capture both its capacity to generate empirically rigorous, explanatorily probative knowledge and its context-specificity (see section The Feminist Method Debate below). The usefulness of the sciences to feminists—the emancipatory promise of scientific inquiry as a resource for understanding and changing sex/gender inequities—depends on precisely this paradoxical epistemic character of empirical inquiry: that the sciences are a thoroughly social, human undertaking which bear the marks of their contexts of origin and the interests of their practitioners, and yet have the capacity to challenge—to critically transform—the very assumptions, interests, and beliefs that constitute these contexts and animate scientific inquiry.
The diversity evident in the various feminist perspectives on the sciences arises, then, on several dimensions:
- feminists engage the sciences from quite different positions and in a number of quite different ways: as practitioners operating within particular sciences intent on improving their particular field; as science studies scholars of various kinds interested in understanding the histories, social dynamics, and epistemic norms that animate sciences; as external commentators concerned with issues of accountability and with the impact of science on society, specifically, on women and gender minorities;
- feminists focus on distinct aspects of science: its institutions; its methodologies and underlying epistemic commitments; its content, ranging from highly specific models and empirical claims to quite general framework assumptions (ontological or theoretical, and epistemic);
- feminist critiques of sexist or androcentric content take different forms depending on the nature of the science and its subject domain (e.g., whether it is intrinsically gendered, projectively gendered, or non-gendered);
- feminists adopt a range of different epistemic stances: some embrace quite conventional ideals of objectivity, and the distinctions that underpin them (between fact and value, discovery and justification) while others reject these epistemic presuppositions as untenable; some insist that a distinctive new departure is required while others bring established philosophical perspectives to bear in articulating alternative epistemologies (e.g., they develop feminists variants of Quinean empiricism, pragmatism, or post-positivist philosophies of science);
- the level of abstraction at which feminist perspectives on the sciences are formulated varies considerably, from critiques and interventions that are specific to particular research programs and the claims they generate, to conceptual analysis of overarching theoretical/ontological commitments and orienting epistemic ideals (like truth, objectivity).
Those who reject feminist perspectives on science as inevitably cynical or incoherent tend to treat the sciences as a unitary object of analysis, with clear boundaries and a defining (distinctive and unifying) core of epistemic and ontological commitments. Feminist perspectives on science, especially those developed since the early 1990s, reflect an appreciation that the sciences embody much greater internal diversity, and much more continuity with other forms of practice, than this suggests. Rather than positing a general masculinist orientation, as attributed to Keller's object relations theory-based analyses (1978, 1983), or to early examples of standpoint theory (Hartsock 1983), they respond to the diverse constellations of theoretical and methodological commitments associated with particular sciences or research programs (see, for example, Keller's later work, 1992; and reassessments of standpoint theory, Wylie 2003). The result is, not surprisingly, a highly diverse array of feminist perspectives on science.
Feminists have regarded with scepticism both the presumption that the sciences are an inherently masculine domain—that women are unfit for science, or science unfit for women—and the conviction that the institutions of science are a model of gender-neutral meritocracy. Feminist historians of science document entrenched historical patterns of exclusion of women but, at the same time, they recover evidence of women's active participation in the sciences, often in the face of stiff resistance. Analyses of the gender structure of contemporary science show that inequalities persist in the representation, recognition, and effective integration of women into science, even as they gain access to the “training pipeline,” demonstrating an aptitude for scientific training and a capacity to make substantial contributions to the sciences that undermines gender-conventional explanations for their continued marginality.
The historical research on women in science suggests that the masculine profile of the sciences, as they have developed in Euro-American contexts in the last 300 years, was by no means monolithic or inevitable. For example, Londa Schiebinger argues that elite women and women involved in traditions of craft production in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries played an active role in the early formation of the sciences. The best known are noblewomen like Queen Christina of Sweden (1626–1689), Margaret Cavendish, the Duchess of Newcastle (1623–1673), and Madame du Chatelet (1706–1749), all of whom made contributions recognized by their peers but were denied membership in the scientific academies that were taking shape in their day. The emerging New Science “st[ood] at a fork in the road” with respect to the inclusion of women, Schiebinger argues (1989, 100), but as it became established it was defined by monastic university traditions and associations of aristocratic men that not only excluded women but, more generally, purged all things feminine (Schiebinger 1989, 9, chapter 8). The major academies of science excluded women: Marie Curie (1867–1934) was denied membership in the French Academie des Sciences in 1911 despite being the first person to win two Nobel Prizes (in 1903 and 1911); the U.S. National Academy of Sciences admitted its first woman (Florence R. Sabin) in 1925, but it was not until 1962 that the French Academie elected Marguerite Perey, an assistant to Marie Curie, as a correspondent of the Academie (Ramey 1992; Schiebinger 1989, 2). After the 1860s, when women were first admitted to universities and colleges, they slowly gained access to training in the sciences. By the 1940s there were “thousands of … women working in a variety of fields and institutions, whereas sixty or seventy years earlier there were about ten at a few early women's colleges” (Rossiter 1982, xviii). This was an achievement realized by “the best efforts of a host of talented women, who, seeing how both science and women's roles were changing around them, took steps to carve out a legitimate place for themselves in the new order” (Rossiter 1982, xviii). Nonetheless, these gains came at the price of what Rossiter describes as “a pattern of segregated employment and underrecognition” which few women escaped (Rossiter 1982, xviii); they served predominantly as technicians, assistants, or “computers,” and populated women's colleges and schools of home economics. Moreover, these gains proved to be vulnerable. The “new order” suffered a sharp downturn in the 1950s, when conventional views about the social roles appropriate for women regained prominence and women's participation declined in the sciences, as in paid jobs and the professional workforce generally, in the post-war years. It was another twenty years before women regained the levels of representation they had achieved in the sciences in the 1920s and 1930s.
Second wave feminist activism was instrumental in regaining and building on the educational gains realized by first wave feminism. These challenges to the continuing marginalization of women, in the sciences as in many other spheres of professional and public life, resulted in landmark legislation in the late 1960s and early 1970s that mandated equal opportunity in employment and education; chief among these were the Title IX Education Amendments of 1972 that extended the Equal pay Act of 1963 to higher education (Rossiter 1995, 382). Women have since made dramatic gains, doubling and quadrupling their representation in college and graduate programs in science, and among employed scientists and engineers. Taking all the science and engineering disciplines together (the NAS includes social and life sciences, as well as physical science and engineering), women have received 25% or more of the PhD's awarded in the sciences for the last thirty years; since 2000, they have accounted for more than 50% of the bachelor's degrees awarded in the sciences. Disaggregating by area, women have been awarded 30% of the doctorates in social and behavioral sciences and over 20% in the life sciences for the last thirty years; they now approach 30% of the Ph.D.'s granted in the physical sciences and 15% in engineering, up from less than 10% and 5% in the mid-1970s, respectively (NAS 2006, 1-4).
Since the mid-1980s, however, there has been growing concern that these gains for women in the science training “pipeline” have not been translating into comparable improvements in their representation in faculties of science and in “leadership positions” in the sciences (NAS 2006, ix); as one commentator put it in 2000, thirty years after the formal barriers to women's participation had been struck down, the representation of women among full professors was still less than 10%, well below what you would expect given “the number of doctorates awarded … [and] the number of years it takes to move from PhD to full professor” (Greenwood 2000, 19). In a Presidential Address to the AAAS in 1988, Widnall argued that, even though increasing numbers of girls and women were getting the necessary math and science training, they were disproportionately choosing against undergraduate programs and, later, graduate work and careers in the sciences and engineering; the training pipeline was “leaking all the way along” (Widnall 1988; Alper 1993). In academia as a whole, women continued to be concentrated in the most insecure positions and at the lowest ranks of the academic hierarchy; despite their growing representation in the PhD training pipeline, this “inverted pyramid” pattern of distribution—a primary target of feminist challenges to educational and employment inequities in the 1960s—had proven to be stubbornly resistant to change. In all but a few fields women are appointed to tenure-track positions at a rate that falls below their representation in the candidate pools of recent doctorates; their likelihood of holding non-tenure track jobs is significantly higher than that of men (30% of full-time women faculty compared to 18% of men); and their representation in the ranks of tenured faculty is lower still, especially in doctoral institutions (West and Curtis 2006, 9–10). This pattern of distribution is especially clear in the sciences, and it is amplified at the top research institutions. Summarizing a comprehensive review of data on the representation of women in the sciences, the National Academy of Sciences Committee on Maximizing the Potential of Women in Academic Science and Engineering observes that, “at every academic milestone the proportion of women in science and engineering declines” (NAS 2006, I-2). This pattern of decline is most marked in the fields that have the best representation of women in their graduate and undergraduate programs, in fields that require postdoctoral study, and for minority women (NAS 2006, I-2, I-5). It is reflected in salary differences and other professional rewards, in disparities in types of appointment and in rates of promotion, even when a range of other variables—e.g., institutional type, measures of productivity, discipline—are taken into account (Ginther 2004; West and Curtis 2006, 12).
The question of how to explain these persistent inequalities in the representation of women in the sciences has been the focus of intense controversy. Conventional accounts typically invoke the talents, drive, and preferences of women. For example, in (1979) Cole argued that inequities in the employment status, compensation, and reputational standing of women in the sciences are best explained in terms of their self-selection out of the training pipeline and, when they persist in professional careers, by lower levels of productivity that cannot be accounted for by marital or parental status; in short, women conform to the gender-conventional expectation that they are less interested in and inherently less well suited to competitive careers in science, even when they are talented and get the necessary training. In a statement that generated intense public debate twenty-five years later (2005), Summers (who was then the president of Harvard) reiterated these intuitions without the backing of any systematic analysis of the kind Cole presented, and without responding to the wide range of critiques and reassessments that have substantially undermined Cole's claims in the intervening twenty-five years. From the outset, feminists challenged both the specifics of Cole's analysis and the assumptions that informed it. In a review of Cole's Fair Science Rossiter objected that, in his eagerness to affirm the fairness of science despite inequitable outcomes, Cole “seemed unwilling to face his own evidence” (1981, 101). She reinterprets his distributional data as evidence that women in science might be facing a persistent pattern of underestimation and marginalization, such that the “rate of exchange” by which they build research careers and reputations was different than for comparably trained and situated men (1981, 102); their successes as researchers typically bring them less in the way of recognition, uptake, and support, and their failures count more heavily against them, compared to male peers. Through the 1980s, a growing body of grass-roots, activist research documented what came to be known as the “chilly climate” for women in academic institutions (Hall and Sandler 1982; The Chilly Collective 1995; Wylie, Jakobsen, Fosado 2008). These interview-based, workplace ethnographies drew attention to patterns of devaluation of just the kind posited by Rossiter. While overt, intentional discrimination was by no means a thing of the past, what these reports documented were the debilitating effects for women of having to negotiate a “host of subtle personal and social barriers” that run along lines of gender difference and that often operate “below the level of awareness of both men and women” (Sandler 1986, 17; Hall and Sandler 1982, 2984). The sorts of mechanisms reported in these studies include, for example, the patterns of exclusion of women from informal mentoring and communication networks within the profession and the workplace; gender-normative work assignments that channel women into heavy advising and undergraduate teaching, and into administrative positions that carry substantial organizational responsibility but little decision making power; gendered patterns of evaluation bias by which, for example, the accomplishments of women are more readily attributed to luck or external factors while those of men are treated as evidence of talent, training, and hard work (for an overview, see Wylie 1995b; Wylie, Jakobsen, Fosado 2008).
The insights central to these reports and pamphlets came to prominence when the authors of the 1999 MIT report on the Status of Women in the Faculty of Science declared that women continue to face gender discrimination in this “post-civil rights era” but that it does not operate through the formal, overt barriers to participation that had mobilized activists in the 1960s. It takes the form of diffuse but persistent differences in recognition and response: “a pattern of powerful but unrecognized attitudes and assumptions that work systematically against women despite good will” (MIT 1999, 11). The MIT study documented systematic differences in such tangibles as salary and merit increments, institutional responses to external job offers, internal support for research, and the allocation of office and laboratory space, as well as more subtle differences in service expectations, teaching assignments, and the influence women have over decisions that affect their worklife. Although “micro-inequities” in these various areas may each seem trivial, taken individually, they translate into patterns of devaluation and marginalization that amplify through the trajectory of a career. The MIT study reports an age-related pattern of gender differences that is corroborated by a growing number of quantitative studies of gender difference in scientists' career trajectories (e.g., Ginther 2004; Sonnert and Holton 1995; Xie and Shauman 2003); small initial differences (in salary, initial appointment, workload) are compounded in ways that have a substantial cumulative impact on the quality of women's work lives and their effectiveness in the workplace, and that result in significant differences in their career outcomes compared to those of similarly well trained and accomplished men (1999, 8). These forms of “subtle” discrimination are now the primary target of initiatives designed to redress what the Chair of the NAS Committee describes as a “needless waste of the nation's scientific talent” (Shahala, in NAS 2006, ix). For example, they figure prominently in the arguments for extending Title IX requirements for equal opportunity in education to science training programs (Rolison 2000, Zare 2006), where they had chiefly been applied, in the past, to inequities in support for women's sports. They are also addressed by projects designed to foster “institutional transformation” that have been funded by the National Science Foundation ADVANCE program (the Program for the Advancement of Women in Academic Science and Engineering Careers); these include a range of strategies for counteracting gender-based evaluation bias in the allocation of resources, in the review of researchers' credentials at the point of hiring, promotion and tenure, and in a range of other decision making processes (for links to ADVANCE projects see “Internet Resources” below).
This shift of attention to the cumulative effects of small scale disadvantages that exist in the social fabric of everyday interaction represents a highly consequential reframing of the issues with which advocates for gender equity in the sciences have been struggling for several decades. It converges on, and increasingly draws inspiration and empirical grounding from, several lines of demographic, experimental (social psychological), and sociological research that have been developing since the late 1970s. Statistical analyses of the large scale databases established by national science monitoring agencies have become substantially more sophisticated since Cole published his distributional data in 1979. Xie and Shauman (2003) decisively challenge Cole's claim that women demonstrate a productivity deficit unrelated to marital or parental status (2003, chapter 9), and they call into question the reliance in later gender equity research on a rigid “pipeline” metaphor, arguing that a less linear life course model provides a better framework for recognizing the more complex patterns of delayed entry, short-term withdrawal and reentry evident in the scientific training and career paths typical for many women (2003, 6–9). As summarized in the reports published by the NAS (2006) and the AAUP (West and Curtis 2006), these refined statistical analyses document a residual “gender discrimination” effect in many areas of comparison, and an age-graded pattern of cumulative disadvantage at a discipline-wide and national scale consistent with the local patterns reported by the MIT women scientists (MIT 1999), and in many chilly climate studies. The experimental work of cognitive psychologists and social psychologists delineates a set of mechanisms—in the form of cognitive schemas and other heuristics that play a role in automatic cognitive processing—that operate below the threshold of conscious awareness, generating patterns of evaluation bias that track not only gender but also race/ethnicity and a range of other dimensions along which social inequality is constituted (Steele 1998; Valian 1999). Sociological studies, of the kind described by Reskin in a 2002 presidential address to the American Sociological Association (Reskin 2003), throw light on the features of context and institutional structure that are conducive to the operation of these “intra-psychic” mechanisms and that amplify their effects. The research Reskin summarizes converges on that reported by cognitive and social psychologists in suggesting that evaluation bias is most likely to arise when we make judgements under time pressure, when we lack contextual information about candidates and their credentials, when evaluation procedures are not transparent and we are not accountable for demonstrating that their outcomes are equitable.
Finally, a number of ambitious longitudinal and cohort studies have put sociologists and historians of science in a position to refine models of the complex processes by which the “micro-inequities” generated by the operation of cognitive schemas (described above), small-scale interaction patterns, and local institutional cultures, can produce large-scale gender differences in outcome. In the late 1960s Merton characterized academic careers as structured by processes of cumulative advantage; he posited a “Matthew effect” by which recognition accrues disproportionately to those who are already successful, amplifying the “rate of exchange” by which they build their reputations. Thirty years later Rossiter reframed this model with the aim of making sense of women's experiences in the academy; she posited a complementary “Matilda effect” by which the “psychosocial processes” that structure the scientific reward system amplify the disadvantage of those whose contributions are under-recognized (1993). Both positive and negative dynamics were integrated into a “kick-reaction” model that shows how significant divergence in career paths can arise from quite small differences in the number of positive as opposed to negative “kicks” scientists receive, and in the pattern of positive or negative responses to these kicks (Cole and Singer 1991). This model, further refined, served as the point of departure for a detailed study of elite scientists, Project Access (Sonnert and Holton 1996), that examines these dynamics and their effects in the careers of individual scientists and cohorts of scientists. Most important, Sonnert and Holton argue that the kicks and responses identified by Cole and Singer must be understood to be interactive; differences in behavioral-attitudinal response widen as those subject to a differentially negative pattern of kicks—more negative kicks with fewer positive offsets—come to appreciate that they may face structural impediments in the development of their careers. Sonnert and Holton conclude that “it is no longer possible to point to a few dramatic and clear-cut career obstacles for women scientists” (1996, 63). Internal agent-centered factors, such as motivation and drive, must be understood to be co-constituted by external, environmental barriers that systematically reinforce (or undermine) confidence and shape the expectations that inform women's career decisions.
What has taken shape in the last two decades is, then, a fundamental reorientation in our understanding of the gendered nature of scientific institutions that both informs and is rooted in the critical perspectives brought to bear by feminists. It can no longer be assumed that, unless formal barriers to access or discriminatory intent can be established, the persistent under-representation and marginalization of women in the sciences must be attributed to factors internal to the women themselves. As the NAS report makes clear, the preponderance of evidence tells against conventional explanations that attribute to women an inherent cognitive deficit or a lack of drive and commitment to succeed in science; explanations of the forms of gender inequality that persist in the sciences must take into account the effects of training and workplace environments that are inhospitable for women and minorities, the role of various forms of evaluation bias that operate below the threshold of conscious awareness, and the impact of institutional structures that fail to counteract, or that amplify, these disadvantages (NAS, S-2, 3). These insights have far reaching implications. Most immediately, they suggest that gender inequities in the sciences cannot be expected to resolve themselves without concerted effort, and that this effort should focus, not (primarily) on adapting women to existing institutions, but on ensuring that these institutions are accountable for changing entrenched practices that are responsible for the continued loss of trained scientific talent. A primary focus of efforts to realize “institutional transformation” of this sort (as outlined by the ADVANCE projects mentioned above) is to counteract subtle forms of bias as they operate in small-scale interactions in the workplace, in training and mentoring relationships, and in decision processes throughout the institutions of science education and employment.
In addition, although many self-identified feminist scientists insist that their critiques of gender inequity in no way impugn the epistemic integrity of their fields, there are good reasons to think that systematic institutional biases do affect the content and practice of the sciences. What form this takes will vary widely by field and subfield depending, for example, on whether gender categories are constitutive of the subject domain (as in the case of most social sciences), or on how directly they can be projected onto it (as in the case of animal behavior research). But even in those areas of the physical sciences where the subject domain is, at most, attributed gender characteristics on a metaphorical basis (as symbolically or projectively gendered subjects), patterns of workplace segregation that run along gender lines (e.g., with women predominantly working in particular subfields and research niches), and gender differences in recognition and support (e.g., in funding and in citation patterns), may well have an impact on what questions are given priority, what hypotheses get uptake, and what results are recognized as bearing on problems that are central to the research agenda of the discipline.
What feminists share, despite enormous internal diversity of perspective, is a concern to understand and to change conditions of oppression that operate along lines of gender difference. To realize these goals it is necessary to understand with accuracy, subtlety, and explanatory precision the nature and sources of oppression, and scientific inquiry is one of the most powerful tools available for doing this. Thus, feminists have an interest in research programs that address questions of particular concern to women and to feminists or, more generally, to those who are systematically disadvantaged by traditional gender roles and social relations structured by conventions of heterosexuality (heteronormative and sex/gender-normative conventions).
At their most conservative, epistemically and conceptually, the research initiatives undertaken by feminists are not intended to challenge the background assumptions and methodological commitments that underpin existing programs of scientific research; often the goal is to expand the range of questions addressed in particular social, medical, and biological sciences or to selectively appropriate the tools of scientific inquiry for application in feminist-directed research. Key examples come from the medical sciences where the women's health movement has been pivotal, not only in educating women and redefining their relationship with health care professionals, but in bringing feminist critique and activist pressure to bear on medical research that has chiefly focused on the ailments of men, or has taken male bodies and disease profiles as the norm for the medical diagnosis and treatment of women. The feminist activism responsible for making breast cancer a primary focus in the “war on cancer” is one high profile example. Feminist advocacy played a critical role, in the 1960s and 1970s, in challenging a tradition of medical practice that made radical mastectomy the treatment protocol of choice much longer in the U.S. than elsewhere. The clinical trials that demonstrated the efficacy of less invasive alternatives to radical mastectomies were a model of rigorous medical research (e.g., Fischer's trials, as described by Lerner 2001, 136–138), but considerable pressure was required to convince the medical establishment that such research was needed and to take its results seriously (Lerner 2001, 115–169). More generally, feminist activism was responsible for “a great awakening [in the 1980s] of mainstream medicine to women's health concerns,” as Schiebinger describes it, that put pressure on the medical establishment not only to direct attention to neglected conditions that are specific to women (e.g., osteoporosis and breast cancer rather than heart disease and erectile dysfunction), but also to take account of ways in which women's health and disease profiles diverge from models based on studies of male subjects (1999a, 113). Heart disease is one especially prominent example of a well studied condition the understanding of which was based, until the late 1980s, almost entirely on samples of men, even when it concerned the effects of hormones like estrogen (Schiebinger 1999a, 113). Feminist activism was directly responsible for federally enforced reforms of medical research, instituted in the early 1990s, that required the inclusion of female subjects in clinical trials, given findings that FDA-approved drugs were routinely tested exclusively on men and that publicly funded research on women was largely limited to reproductive health issues (Schiebinger 1999a, 114–117).
A similar impulse is evident in a great deal of research undertaken by feminists in the social sciences, or in response to feminist demands, where the goal has been to apply established research tools to neglected questions that particularly concern women and feminists. These “successor science” traditions of research have faced stiff internal criticism since at least the mid-1980s, on grounds that they are “insufficiently critical” of the scientific ideals that animate many social sciences (Harding 1986, 30), but they continue to thrive and have made substantial contributions in a number of contexts. The sophisticated quantitative analysis of the career paths, patterns of compensation, and professional outcomes for women in the sciences described in the last section (Feminist Equity Critiques) is one example in which conventional social scientific methods have been used to good effect to document persistent patterns of gender-based discrimination in institutions that purport to be meritocratic. It is, at least in part, the epistemically mainstream nature of the studies reported by the National Academy of Sciences (2006), the Association of University Professors (West and Curtis, 2006), and many discipline and institution-specific task forces that has lent them credibility. They amass a wealth of data and robust explanatory models, drawn from a range of fields, that systematically challenge the gender-conventional assumptions about women's nature and capabilities that underpinned Cole's analysis (1979) and were reiterated twenty-five years later by Summers (2005; see Feminist Equity Critiques). Other examples include a wide range of policy-oriented research aimed at documenting, and designing effective strategies for solving, specific problems created by gendered social institutions, cultural conventions, and divisions of labor. One strand of research on violence against women (Greaves and Wylie 1995) makes use of conventional demographic analysis to show that gender-based patterns of violence cross-cut class and ethnic, race, and religious identification; the aim was to effect a change in policing and funding policies that address domestic violence. Other action and policy oriented research includes, for example, studies of the “gender gap” in voting patterns, the gendered nature of poverty world-wide, and the differential impact of development policies on women.
Another productive tradition of feminist research in this appropriative spirit is characterized by “remedial” research designed to fill lacunae in established theories or bodies of knowledge, correcting errors that arise from ignoring women and gender without changing the terms of disciplinary engagement. For example, the women entering anthropology in unprecedented numbers in the 1960s were quick to recognize the need for compensatory ethnography. Sometimes male researchers had scant access to women informants, and sometimes they ignored or discounted them, with the effect that women, their roles and relationships, their distinctive sub-cultures and activities, were often strikingly absent from ethnographic narratives. Levi-Strauss is famous for a description entered in his field journal in the 1930s that illustrates the problem: “the entire village left the next day in about thirty canoes, leaving us alone in the abandoned houses with the women and children” (1936, cited by Eichler and Lapointe 1985, 11). Deepening this critique, the Ardeners describe the “problem of women” as a case in which ethnographic subjects are muted both within their own societies and by social anthropologists who, they observe, have traditionally characterized the societies they studied in terms of “dominant male systems of perception” (S. Ardener 1975, xiii): “the study of women is on a level little higher than the study of the ducks and fowls they commonly own” (E. Ardener 1975, 1), which is to say, women had been taken into account only insofar as they figured, or were valued, in the public languages and worlds of men. Similar objections catalyzed research on “women worthies,” “women's contributions,” and “women victims” (Harding 1986, 30–31) across the social and historical sciences. It is also reflected in substantial shifts of focus in fields like primatology where projected gender norms had given rise to a “general vision that primate society revolves around males and is based on aggression, domination, and hierarchy” (Strum and Fedigan 2000, 5). Here a reorientation of field observation practices brought into focus the central role played by females in primate societies, and the importance of “tactics other than aggression (particularly those that rely on social finesse and the management of relationships),” making it clear that “hierarchy may or may not have a place in primate society, but that males and females are equally capable of competition” (Strum and Fedigan 2000, 5; see also Fedigan and Fedigan 1989).
Even when they are methodologically and epistemically conservative, feminist interventions that correct specific errors of omission and extend the tools of science to neglected problems often generate more deeply challenging questions. The successes of these remedial exercises make it clear that many fields have been compromised by unrecognized and unintended bias in the way their subject domain had been defined. When women have been restored to the historical record and to sociological, political, and anthropological accounts from which they have been omitted—“eclipsed” (Smith 1978) or relegated to a walk-on role (Novick 1988, 497)—it often has become clear that the problem was not just erasure but systematic distortion. As critical reflection on conceptual androcentrism deepened, the role of ethnocentric gender norms in structuring inquiry has proven to have profound implications, not only for how women and explicitly gendered subjects are conceived, but also for ostensibly gender neutral aspects of social, historical subjects, and for various natural domains as well.
Although the specifics vary, critiques of erasure—of research that ignores women altogether, or assimilates them to male-defined norms and expectations—have taken shape in every field that deals with gendered human subjects. Characteristic examples include Gilligan's reassessment of Kohlberg's model of moral development, an account that had been based exclusively on samples of boys. Kohlberg had assumed that the developmental stages manifest in these all-male samples could be generalized; girls were expected to conform to what he took to be a universal trajectory. But in application (for example, as the basis for the design of educational systems), girls routinely presented a puzzle for Kohlberg's scheme; measured against the norms of his developmental stages they tended to mature more quickly initially but then lagged behind boys. Gilligan challenged the tendency, long established in psychological theorizing (e.g., conventional psychoanalytic accounts), to treat non-conformity to male-defined norms as a failing or inadequacy specific to girls and women, rather than as evidence of problems inherent in the norms themselves. When you attend to the specifics of moral reasoning among girls, she argued, a distinctive trajectory of moral development emerges, characterized by an increasingly sophisticated “contextual mode of judgment” that diverges (in the intermediate stages of moral development) from the decontextualized, universalizing, rule-based forms of moral reasoning typically exercised by boys (1982). She makes the case for recognizing, in this “difference voice,” evidence that calls into question the stage structure and universalizing assumptions fundamental to Kohlberg's system. Gilligan has since been criticized for reproducing the structure of a fixed developmental scheme (taken over from Kohlberg and developmental psychology generally), and for ignoring the impact on moral reasoning of a range of social and economic factors other than gender. Nonetheless, her posit of a “different voice” represents a decisive challenge to the androcentric presumption that male experience, perception, and patterns of development can be treated as normative for human psychology as a whole. It throws into relief not only an error of incompleteness but also a systematic, characteristically androcentric bias in how moral maturity had been conceptualized. The circle is closed when the results of studies based on male samples and normatively masculinist conceptions of moral reasoning are taken to affirm (sexist) stereotypic ascriptions of deficit—moral immaturity or amorality (e.g., from Freud)—to women and normatively “feminine” forms of reasoning.
Where Gilligan challenged Kohlberg's erasure of gender difference—his assumption that there must be a single, universal trajectory of moral development in the face of recalcitrant counter-evidence—in other contexts feminist content critiques focus on gender stereotypes reflected in the converse assumption: that men and women are categorically different. In such cases similar and overlapping traits are either ignored or are characterized in different terms when associated with men rather than women; Eichler refers to these as errors that arise from imposing a “double standard” and from “sexual dichotomism” (1988). Examples of this practice are widespread in sex difference research (Fausto-Sterling 1985), a field that continues to reproduce gender-normative stereotypes despite trenchant and sustained critique (Young and Balaban 2006). One consequential example of research undertaken to counteract interconnected errors of erasure and distortion is the ethnographic work with groups long identified as “hunter-gatherers.” Ethnographers who focused on the roles and activities of women in these groups discovered that, among temperate, desert dwelling and subtropical foragers, the small game and plant resources provided by women gatherers may account for as much as 70% of the group's total dietary intake. Ironically, they found that when small game was “collected” by women it was described as gathering, whereas it counted as hunting when the same activities were attributed to men. They learned, as well, that women gatherers are highly mobile, like the men of their social groups (they are not limited to a home base); they control their own fertility to an extent not previously acknowledged; and they play leadership roles, presumed to be the exclusive domain of men, particularly when decisions concern group movement and subsistence strategies (e.g., Slocum 1975; see also contributions to Lee and Devore 1968, and overviews by Dahlberg 1981, and Fedigan and Fedigan 1989).
These findings were, in part, the impetus for rethinking models of human evolution that depended on ethnographic models of the subsistence patterns and social organization of foragers defined in terms of the role of male hunters. In the first instance, they inspired corrective “woman the gatherer” models of human evolution that challenged the assumption that “the demands of the hunt shaped the characteristics that make us human” (e.g., Dahlberg 1981, 1). The reorientation of primate studies, mentioned above, was another source of corrective pressure on male-centered models of human evolution, in this case, in a field where the subject of inquiry is projectively gendered. But as research has taken shape in these fields, predicated on skepticism that ethnocentric gender stereotypes can be assumed to hold for contemporary foragers, much less for diverse species of primates and early hominids, it has become increasingly clear that the female-centered antithesis is just as problematic as the sexist and androcentric models of human evolution they are intended to displace. Fedigan argues that feminists should resist the tendency to invert and revalue the gender-dichotomous categories central to our own sex/gender system; it seems likely that our hominid ancestors lived in social groups and utilized subsistence strategies that were unlike any that are familiar from contemporary ethnographic or primatological research (Fedigan 1986). With reference to primate models, Sperling argues that anthropomorphized “langurs with lipstick are no improvement over baboons with briefcases” (1991, 27); contemporary gender stereotypes—“the new female primate is dressed for success and lives in a troop that resembles the modern corporation” (1991, 4)—are no more adequate a framework for understanding primates than the stereotypes of an earlier era, which represented females as passive coquettes and males as aggressive strategists. She urges a thorough-going reassessment of functionalist (sociobiological) assumptions about the naturalness of sex/gender roles and identities that make anthropomorphic projections of gender stereotypes seem plausible. If we are to come to terms with the complexity and flexibility of primate behavior, we must be prepared to set aside simplifying assumptions about its species-specificity and sex-dimorphism, especially where characteristics like aggression are concerned (Sperling 1991, 20–22). But despite sustained critique, the conventions of sex/gender common sense continue to inform evolutionary theorizing. Lloyd describes pervasive androcentric and sexist biases in evolutionary explanations of human female orgasm that reflect not only an uncritical acceptance of entrenched assumptions about women's sexuality (even by authors who invoke the results of sexology research that decisively disproves these assumptions), but also a deep-seated conviction that this trait must be explicable in adaptationist terms, often construed in terms of transparently ethnocentric and sexist assumptions about the function(s) that the capacity for female orgasm fulfills and for which it must have been selected (1993, 2005).
As these examples illustrate, critiques of erasure and of distortion have implications for the framework assumptions—ontological commitments, explanatory repertoire, conventional categories of description and analysis—that have structured research in many fields; they throw into relief aspects of these various subject domains that are left out of account, or prove to be inexplicable when they are conceived in terms of gender categories and norms of behavior that are specific to a relatively narrow selection of contemporary human social experience. For example, Lloyd's critique of evolutionary theorizing about female orgasm poses a challenge, not just to the specifics of the explanatory theories she considers but to the broader, culturally conventional assumptions about distinctively male and female roles, sexual response, and behavioral predispositions that underpin adaptationist research programs in a wide range of areas; the aggressive, promiscuous male and the coy, passive female of sociobiological theorizing populate not only explanations of human sex/gender traits (ranging from the physical capacity for orgasm to the psychology of mate preference and social patterns of investment in offspring), but also accounts of the behavior of primates and ducks and, projectively, the reproductive functions of biological phenomena like slime molds. As Novick observes with reference to women's history, “feminist perspectives in history were as relevant to such male activities as war and diplomacy as they were to realms in which women dominated” (1988, 496). One influential example in the domain of history is Kelly-Gadol's argument that the Renaissance was anything but a period of cultural ‘rebirth’ if viewed from the vantage point of women: “There was no ‘renaissance’ for women—at least not during the Renaissance. There was, on the contrary, a marked restriction of the scope and powers of women. Moreover, this restriction is a consequence of the very developments for which this age is noted” (1976, 811). Indeed, Kelly-Gadol observes “a fairly regular pattern of relative loss for women precisely in those periods of so-called progressive change” (1976, 810) and argues for a thorough-going reassessment of the canonical periodization in terms of which history has been written, not just a reassessment of the ways in which particular historical periods have been characterized (1977).
Reflection on these critiques of framework assumptions led feminist social scientists working in a number of different disciplinary contexts to the conclusion (often independently) that research in their fields was compromised by a deeper androcentrism. The problem was not just a preoccupation with male-identified activities and aspects of society—e.g., “public” as opposed to “private” spheres of action—or the projection onto women of gender-normative assumptions but, more generally, the assumption that male-specific roles, interests, and values define what counts as cultural or social accomplishment for society as a whole. When historians turned their attention to the neglected private, domestic spheres in which women were to be found, the accounts they offered of the distinctive kinds of work women do, the symbolic universes they construct, and the forms of power they exercise, put pressure on conventional assumptions about what counts as work or as power, and about the salience of familiar distinctions like that between the public and the private. Often these insights were articulated by feminists in the form of probing auto-critiques of their own early work on grounds that it was predicated on assumptions they had taken over, uncritically, from the established traditions of research they hoped to reform. For example, Rosaldo reflexively questioned the assumption that a gendered segregation of public from private could be assumed to hold for the non-industrialized societies she studied; the errors of androcentric ethnographies could not be corrected, she argued, by simply refocusing attention on the neglected private, domestic domain of women (Rosaldo 1980). The distinction itself—the assumption of separate and gendered public vs private spheres—is specifically Euro-American, a product of the formation of a middle class in the late 19th century. Rather than simply invert and revalue these categories, Rosaldo argued, feminists should undertake a much more fundamental reassessment of the categories that structure social anthropological research generally.
In the context of medical research, activism on women's health issues similarly moved from a demand for the inclusion of women in clinical trials and for attention to medical conditions that especially affect women to more probing critiques of the presuppositions of conventional medicine. Breast cancer activism of the 1990s fundamentally changed the landscape of cancer research, putting pressure on a reductively biomedical perspective; it shifted the emphasis from detection and treatment to prevention, drawing attention to a range of environmental and behavioral factors that are typically excluded from consideration when medical protocols focus narrowly on biophysical risk factors. Like AIDS/HIV activists (Epstein 1996, 2007), feminists now challenge the reliance on clinical trial methodologies that turned the tide against radical surgery in the 1970s. While these methodologies are highly effective for isolating single factor causes when these are operative (e.g., infectious agents, nutritional deficiencies), they are not well suited to the inherent complexity of a disease like breast cancer and of patterns of response to adjuvant drug therapies like tamoxifen and raloxifene; these auxiliary treatments may substantially reduce the risk of recurrence of breast cancer (e.g., by as much as 50%) but standard clinical trial reports of effectiveness mask complex side effects and the impact of poorly understood baseline differences in risk. Feminists increasingly call for systematic investigation of “more basic social and environmental problems that may predispose women to breast cancer in the first place” (Learner 2001, 268).
As this example from medical science and those drawn from primatology suggest, feminist content critiques are by no means limited to research in the social and historical sciences. Even when the subject domain of a science is not intrinsically gendered, as in the case of most natural and life sciences, it may be projectively or symbolically gendered; gendered language and concepts may figure as heuristic resources in the description of bio-physical phenomena (Spanier 1995), and scientific categories that are not overtly gendered may have gendered social meanings in the contexts of their formation (Potter 1988). To take the latter case first, Potter develops an account of the role of 17th century gender politics in shaping Boyle's commitment to the mechanistic orientation that ultimately yielded his theory of gases (2001). His opposition to the radical politics associated with the animism of the alternative hylozoic theory informed not only his choice of orienting metaphysics but also the emerging norms of experimental, methodological practice—for example, norms of simplicity—in terms of which his theory was assessed and debated. Potter's point is not that Boyle's gas laws are themselves in some sense gendered, but that their formation and ratification as scientific was deeply shaped by the articulation of gender politics and theological commitments specific to 17th century England.
In analyses of the life sciences feminists show how research in reproductive physiology has been structured by the attribution of stereotypically masculine traits to sperm (as active agents) and feminine traits to eggs (as passive), sometimes at considerable cost to empirical adequacy and explanatory power (Martin 1991; Spanier 1995). Spanier traces the influence of these metaphors in molecular biology even when the subject is not human reproduction, in the attribution of sex difference to E. coli, for example. Here the transfer of genetic material from one single-cell organism to another is characterized in gendered terms: the donor and recipient cells are labeled “male” and “female,” respectively, and the transfer process is described as mediated by “conjugal unions between male and female cells” (1995, 56). This hetero/sexualizing and gendering at the level of molecular phenomena is evident, as well, in competing models of the factors that control the aggregation of slime molds, a case analyzed by Keller in connection with a more general critique of the “force of the concept of predetermined centralized control as a ‘natural’ model of relationship among components of living systems or populations” (Spanier 1995, 26; Keller 1985, 150–157). Keller characterized this cluster of assumptions as “pacemaker” concepts, manifest in the conviction that “the chemical system ‘governs’ the cellular system,” (reflecting the patriarchal, bourgeois assumption that in nature, as in society, there must be rulers and the ruled) and argued that the lesson to be drawn from her feminist critique of the influence of gender metaphors is “to be wary of imposing causal relations on all systems that seem by their very nature to be more complexly interactive.” By projecting causally familiar models “we risk imposing on nature the very stories we like to hear,” and these very often have a gender dimension (1985, 187).
In short, although the specifics of feminist content critiques are necessarily quite different in the biological and physical, as opposed to the social and historical sciences, they follow a similar trajectory. Even narrowly circumscribed, gap-filling and corrective interventions often expose patterns of omission or gender-normative distortion that compromise not just the details but the framework assumptions of the sciences examined. Discovery of these omissions and distortions leads to critical questions about the methodological standards and epistemic ideals that inform scientific practice. By the mid-1980s feminist research had exposed such pervasive androcentric and sexist bias that it called into question not just “bad science,” but much that passes for “good science,” even exemplary science (see Longino and Doell 1983, 207–208; Harding 1986, 22–23; Wylie 1997). Feminist content critiques thus pose two related challenges. If established scientific methodologies routinely (although not always) reproduce androcentric and sexist bias or themselves generate these biases, then the question arises whether and how feminists could do better; the feminist method debate took shape, chiefly in the social sciences, in response to this question (see section The Feminist Method Debate below). By extension, feminist contributions to the sciences, as well as their critiques, suggest the need to reassess the sharp distinction of “contextual” values (non-cognitive, socio-political interests and considerations) from the cognitive factors (good reasons, evidence) and epistemic ideals (truth, objectivity) understood to be “constitutive” of the sciences. One defining challenge for feminist philosophers of science is to articulate norms of epistemic credibility and justification—conceptions of objectivity—that capture the successes of well-functioning science but do not assume that these can be attributed to, or characterized in terms of, the simple absence of contaminating “contextual” influences (Philosophical Implications).
When feminists ask how it is possible that sexist and androcentric bias could be as deeply rooted and persistent as they have proven to be, suspicion falls on the methods of inquiry typical of the sciences. Feminists are sceptical about the capacity of conventional research methods to expose systematic bias. Some argue that these may be powerful tools for making comparative assessments of the empirical adequacy, reliability, and scope of a delimited set of explanatory hypotheses but are liable to reproduce gender biases if these are rooted in presuppositions shared by all the options under consideration (Okruhlik 1994). Still others suggest that some conventional methods may be a source of androcentric and sexist bias. For example, some scholars reject the conviction that social research must conform to models of natural scientific practice on grounds that, when formulated in terms of positivist theories of science, these models entrench “ruling practices” in the form of quasi-experimental and quantitative methodologies that reproduce the categories of dominant ideology and obscure devalued or subordinate perspectives (Mies 1983; Smith 1974; Stanley and Wise 1983). Although few maintain that research methods are intrinsically sexist or androcentric, feminist social scientists have often found that, if they are to recover dimensions of social life ignored by mainstream research, they must use forms of evidence considered ephemeral (e.g., diaries, private papers, material culture, as opposed to archives of public record) and rely on methodologies that are non-standard or marginal by the conventions of their fields (e.g., qualitative methodologies in fields dominated by experimental and quantitative modes of inquiry inspired by the natural sciences).
The long-running “feminist method debate” is animated by a concern to articulate guidelines for research which will ensure that feminist research avoids the pitfalls of sexist and androcentric practice exposed by feminist critique, and is appropriate to the questions that concern women and feminists (Wylie 2007). By the late 1980s consensus emerged that it is misguided to canonize any method as uniquely feminist or to seek a distinctively “feminist science”; feminist practitioners expressed a robust scepticism of simple (one-size-fits-all) methodological solutions, particularly given the diversity of feminist questions to which the tools of scientific inquiry might fruitfully be applied. By the early 1990s, Reinharz's review of feminist social research methods (1991) identified productive feminist applications of virtually every research methodology available in the social sciences, and by the end of the 1990s, Gottfried concluded that feminist practitioners had made a decisive “move from singularity to plurality”(1996, 12). Epistemic arguments reinforced this impulse toward methodological pluralism. Harding (1987) and Longino (1987) argued that there is no justification for positing “a distinctive female way of knowing”; why should feminists allow methodological commitments to define in advance the scope of their research agenda? It is more fruitful to ask what it means to “do science as a feminist” (Longino 1987, 53), and to recognize that feminist research practice will be as diverse as are the commitments that generate the questions it addresses and the fields in which feminists work.
Consistent with this methodological pluralism, feminist practitioners have formulated guidelines for research that is non-sexist and otherwise consistent with feminist ideals (Eichler 1988, Fonow and Cook 1991, Hesse-Biber and Yaiser 2004, Hesse-Biber 2007). These converge on four sets of widely shared commitments captured by requirements of relevance, experiential grounding, accountability, and reflexivity (Wylie 2007). The first of these commitments is captured by guidelines that specify the goals of feminist research; to do research as a feminist means to address questions that are relevant to women and, more generally, to those oppressed by gender-structured systems of inequality. Sometimes this principle is more specifically formulated in activist terms; feminist research should be “movement-generated” in the sense that it should not only provide an understanding of sexist and hetero-normative institutions, but should also generate strategies for changing these institutions (Ehrlich 1975, 10, 13).
A second set of commitments is embodied in the directive, variously formulated, that feminists should ground their research in the situated experience of women and those marginalized by conventional sex/gender structures. As articulated by Smith in the early 1970s and subsequently elaborated by Harding (1991), this is a recommendation to take women's everyday lives as a “starting point” point for research: focus on those aspects of social life and forms of understanding that typically remain “off-stage,” “eclipsed” by the normatively masculine focus of conventional social sciences (Smith 1974; 1987, 85). The feminist research that most straightforwardly exemplifies these ideals are community self-study projects: research undertaken by women, on women, for women (Gorelick 1991, 459), in which women's experience and concerns give rise directly to the questions asked. Examples include the grass-roots “chilly climate” (workplace environment) research discussed above (Feminist Equity Critiques), studies of the needs of homeless and poor women of the kind supported by the Vancouver Women's Research Center in the 1970s (Jacobson 1977) and undertaken by “Roofless Women” twenty years later (1997). The principles that inform these projects—that inquiry should be motivated by explicitly activist objectives and designed with the aim of leveling the hierarchy of authority inherent in traditional “expert” forms of social scientific research—have also inspired the robust traditions of participatory research associated with the women's shelter movement, described by Maguire in her classic account, Doing Participatory Research: A Feminist Approach (Maguire 1987) and by Naples in connection with studies of women's “invisible” work, and research with adult survivors of childhood sexual abuse (Naples 2003). In the context of ongoing debate about the status and authority of the “evidence of experience” (Scott 1991), the second principle—that feminist research “start from,” and be grounded in, women's experience—has been reframed as a commitment to treat gendered experience and self-understanding as a critical resource at all stages of research, but not as epistemically foundational (Wylie 1992).
A third cluster of principles specify ethical and pragmatic norms for feminist research; they require feminists to be accountable to research subjects in various senses. Minimally the research process should not, itself, exploit or demean research subjects who are oppressed by sex/gender systems; ideally, it should empower them. Often feminists hold themselves to a higher standard, arguing that research practice should be a site for instituting feminist social and political values: in designing research projects they should do all they can to counteract the hierarchical structures that make social science a “ruling practice,” implementing egalitarian, participatory forms of knowledge production. Here feminist principles converge on ideals that inform a number of research traditions that emphasize participatory modes of inquiry but are not explicitly or primarily feminist in orientation, and on a set of general arguments for inclusive norms of research practice that Longino has developed in her most recent work (2002). For example, practitioners of participatory action research (PAR) and community based collaborative research (CBPR) in fields as diverse as forestry (Fortmann 2008, Wilmsen et. al 2008), development (Hickey and Mohan 2004), and community health (Minkler and Wallerstein 2003), make the case that a commitment to emancipatory goals requires, not just that research address relevant questions, but that it be non-exploitative and subject-driven. In addition, like many feminists, they argue that a commitment to accountability and reciprocity requires, in the ideal, that research subjects should be involved at all stages of research design, data collection, analysis, and authorship. The rationale here is not only moral and political—that fully collaborative practice exemplifies a thoroughgoing “diffusion or decentralization of power,” as Longino describes the feminist “community value” at work here (1994, 476)—but that social norms which reinforce a “tempered equality of intellectual authority” and inclusive modes of critical engagement in scientific communities are instrumental to epistemic ends (Longino 2002, 131). Although her point of departure was the delineation of commitments characteristic of feminist research, Longino has developed a set of entirely general arguments for such norms; they ensure that the epistemic resources of diverse perspectives are brought to bear in the critical assessment of research methods, evidence, and inference, as well as the claims based on them (2002, 128–135; 1995). Given that the unconditioned subjectivity of a “view from nowhere” is unattainable, she argues, the basis for ratifying knowledge claims can only be the integrity of the processes of knowledge production as assessed against jointly social and cognitive norms such as these (1993, 113).
Finally, virtually all the guidelines articulated for doing social research as a feminist make a central virtue of reflexivity. At the very least, this requires feminist social scientists to contextualize their research. They should “state their premises rather than hide them” (Reinharz, 1992b, p. 426), making explicit the interests that motivate their choice of questions, the assumptions that underpin the hypotheses they consider, and the reasons for adopting particular methods of inquiry and categories of description and analysis. On stronger formulations, this commitment to cultivate a stance of critical reflexivity requires that feminists take into account the various ways in which their own socially defined angle of vision, interests, and values are constitutive of the research process and of the understanding it produces (e.g., Fonow and Cook, 1991; Mies, 1983). Harding has elaborated this in terms of a requirement for “strong objectivity”: the tools of jointly empirical and conceptual inquiry should be applied (reflexively) to the research process itself (Harding 1987, 1993a). At a meta-level, Longino has argued the case for a governing principle of “methodological provisionalism”: feminists should be prepared to revise any of their norms in light of what they learn from practice (1994, 483). While principles of critical reflexivity and “provisionalism” are not, in themselves, feminist, Longino suggests a “bottom line” proviso that should inform their application by feminists: the basis for adopting, and for assessing and revising, any methodological norms that inform feminist research should be a commitment to “prevent gender from being disappeared” (1994, 481).
In articulating these principles, feminist practitioners often work as insiders to the disciplines whose methods and results they critique; far from being cynically dismissive of scientific inquiry, they are committed to improving the epistemic credibility and integrity of research practice in these fields. The challenge they engage, in practical and methodological terms, is that of showing how the play of ineliminable contextual values can be a resource for doing better science (see the subsection on A Cooperative Model of Theory Justification).
Science Studies is an interdisciplinary field that draws upon anthropology, cultural studies, economics, feminism, history, philosophy, political science, and sociology in order to study science. Historian Mario Biagioli (1999, xii) defines science studies as a field that asks how science works rather than what science is and he describes science studies as using a variety of methodologies and research questions to find out how science works. For example, anthropologist, Sharon Traweek (1988) compared two communities of high energy physicists by asking “how they have forged a research community for themselves, how they turn novices into physicists and how their community works to produce knowledge.” David Hess characterizes science studies as tracking “the history of disciplines, the dynamics of science as a social institution, and the philosophical basis for scientific knowledge” (1997, 1). And sociologist Emma Whelan characterizes science studies as focusing on “how social factors intrude upon science,” “the products of science” and “the process of doing scientific work itself” (Whelan 2001, 544; italics in original). Though definitions offered by science scholars differ, they nevertheless agree that the focus of science studies is on the interactions of science with society, including both micro and macro interactions. A fundamental aim of science studies is to critique narrow understandings of science as a rational activity, (e.g., as instantiating a logic of science) and to show, from a variety of perspectives, that science is a social activity.
Sue Rosser (1989) notes the impact of feminism on science and science studies in six areas: pedagogical and curricular transformation in science, attention to the history of women in science as well as to the current status of women in science, feminist critique of science, feminist theory of science and feminine science (See Rosser 1989, Harding 1991 and 1986, and Rose 1994.) When science was first identified as having a masculine basis, many asked whether this implies that there is a feminine science or that women would do science differently than men. The idea of a feminine science helped to challenge the idea of science as only a masculine endeavor and focused the analytical gaze on its “feminine” aspects such as intuition, collaboration, and social networks. In general feminist science studies scholars have contributed gender analyses that address “issues of power and inequality, varieties of knowing and knowers, discourse and materiality, subjectivity and objectivity, embodiment, representation, work, resistance, and the lay/expert divide” (Whelan 2001, 538). In addition, most feminist science studies scholars try to understand the relationships among science, gender, race, class, sexuality, disability and colonialism and how science constructs and applies these differences. Among the most frequently cited feminist science scholars are: Ruth Bleier, Adele Clarke, Anne Fausto Sterling, Joan Fujimura, Donna Haraway, Sandra Harding, Evelynn Hammond, David Hess, Ruth Hubbard, Evelyn Fox Keller, Emily Martin, Sue Rosser, Margaret Rossiter, Linda Layne, Richard Levins, Richard Lewontin, Helen Longino, Carolyn Merchant, Rayna Rapp, Hilary Rose, Londa Schiebinger, Bonnie Spanier, S. Leigh Star, Sharon Traweek, and Nancy Tuana. (See Bibliography for sample work by these scholars.)
Hilary Rose (1983, 82) noted that as critical work becomes “more theoretical, more fully elaborated, so women and women's interests recede from the forefront.” For example, Evelyn Fox Keller (1995) observes that feminist scholars first questioned the objectivity of science, a question later appropriated by mainstream historians of science. This could explain the impact of feminist science studies scholars on the field of science studies at the inception of the field in the late 1970s and the decrease in obviously feminist science scholarship in the two main journals of science studies: Science, Technology and Human Values and The Social Studies of Science in the 1990s and 2000s. Eulalia Pérez Sedeño (2001) critiques science studies for not employing a serious gender analysis in its skeptical, constructively critical account of science and challenges mainstream science studies to include the private sphere as well as the high profile public sphere as locations of research. In the same way, scholars have called for closer engagement between feminist theory and feminist science studies. For example, a special issue of Feminist Theory, edited by Susan Squier and Melissa Littlefield (2004) suggests that a closer examination of materiality, agency, and performance in feminist science studies could create a point of mutual interest for feminist theory and feminist science studies.
Since its inception, feminist science studies has not been a unified field. The category, “feminist science studies” includes feminist critiques of science, history of women in science, attention to equity issues for women in science, the experience of women in science, the effects of science on women, cultural constructions of gender and feminist theories of scientific knowledge. Under the rubric of gender, science and culture we find scholars discussing the marginalization of women in science, raising questions of equity in science, analyzing the gendered nature of science and questioning the construction of scientific knowledge. These various dialogues from multiple directions create disparate subspecialties and give the appearance of a feminist science studies diaspora. Research in feminist science studies is found in anthropology, biology, cultural studies, ethnic studies, history of science, literary studies, philosophy of science, philosophy, postcolonial studies, sociology, and women's studies among other disciplines. Thus, the field is diverse in its methodologies and approaches to research. This is both its strength and its weakness. Most feminist science studies scholars identify themselves primarily with a traditional discipline and secondarily with feminist science studies, which can make it difficult to distinguish work in the field. But its diverse methods and approaches also give the field flexibility, diversity, breadth and depth. Thus, Banu Subramaniam (Hammonds and Subramaniam 2003, 929) celebrates the field of feminist science studies because it allows for the possibility of construction and collaboration in addition to critique. Finally, despite the diversity of methods and approaches, most scholars address not only the relationship of science and gender, but also the relationship of science, race, class, sexuality, disability and colonialism and ask how science has been used to construct and apply these differences.
The early feminist science scholars addressed a number of binaries that were prevalent in scientific discourse: rational/irrational, objective/subjective, science/nature, pure/constructed, and sex/gender that reflected contemporary thinking and beliefs about science. Feminist science scholars were not alone in questioning the binaries of modernity but they were first to do it for science and their work contributed to a more critical analysis of scientific culture. Ruth Hubbard's (1990) work illustrated that science reflects the values of those who do science: privileged, educated white men who have defined what counts as rational/irrational, objective/subjective and pure/constructed. Susan Griffin (1979) and Carolyn Merchant (1980) explored the science/nature discourse through historical and cultural analysis to illustrate the values of nature as feminine and science as masculine that permeated modern science. Donna Haraway (1989) explored assumptions concerning the binaries, objective/subjective and science/nature, through an analysis of gender and racial bias in primatology. Sandra Harding's (1991) work illustrated that science produces meanings that are constructed not simply pure knowledge. Helen Longino and Ruth Doell (1987) documented masculine bias within evolutionary and endocrinological research. Luce Irigaray (1989) showed how scientific language was not neutral and needed to be interpreted as sexed logic. These same binaries are no longer the major focus of feminist science studies because they have been mainstreamed into theories on the social construction of science. However, the science/nature distinction is still being actively explored (Suchman 2008, Barad 2003, Hammond 2003, Goodman 2003) because it speaks to the boundary between human and machine and addresses the question of difference that has engaged feminist scholarship since its inception.
Scholarship that explores how scientific knowledge is constructed both inside and outside the laboratory and the application of this knowledge to the lives and bodies of women is a central focus of feminist science studies. Turning first to the production of knowledge, based on accounts of Rosalind Franklin (Maddox 2002) and Barbara McClintock (Keller 1983), Ruth Hubbard (2003) has concluded that the relationship between science and gender is not to be found in the simple claim that women do science differently than men. As she puts the point, “ovaries or testes do not directly affect what science we do and how we do it.” Other feminist science studies scholars argue for the social construction of science and aim to show that how we do science and how the science we do are both constructed through lenses that are culturally and socially created and that are gendered. Hence, science is not separate from the person who does science or from the culture in which science is embedded (Tuana 1989). Although social constructivism has been the prevailing theoretical framework for feminist work, Donna Haraway (1991) has cautioned that it may not be the most powerful tool for deconstructing science and its objects since it may help maintain the ideological doctrines of science through its focus on rhetoric. Karen Barad challenges feminist science studies to take up “onto-epistem-ology—the study of practices of knowing in being” [italics in the original, 2003: 829] that would acknowledge that we “are part of the world in its differential becoming.” This echoes an earlier challenge expressed by Rose (1983) about the importance of the personal within our theories and the need for theories that integrate and interpret lived experiences.
Turning to applications of scientific knowledge, the medicalization of women's lives and bodies provides excellent examples of feminist questions and approaches. Rayna Rapp's (1999) work on amniocentesis illustrates the convergence of feminist theory with science studies that allows Rapp to analyze gender, power and culture in this area of medicine. By analogy with a Venn diagram Rapp explores the “intersecting and juxtaposing” perspectives of scientific literacy, disability rights, reproductive rights and the technological transformations of bodies/pregnancy into a woman-centered research project. In her study of immunity in American culture, Emily Martin emphasizes “the commonalities and the differences among people who have various kinds of experience and expertise” in scientific knowledge (Martin 1994, 14). Martin begins with the premise that science is “an active agent in a culture that passively acquiesces” and that society fails to “provide an adequately complex view of how scientific knowledge operates” (1994, 7) and it is part of her methodology to “deliberately cross” the borders that have historically separated the scientists producing knowledge and the society applying it. And finally, Deborah Blizzard's (2007) ethnography of the sociocultural development of fetoscopy applies a constructivist framework to show how “patient-mothers,” physicians, clergy and others in a social network actively affect the process of development and acceptance of fetoscopy. These studies move beyond science texts to situate scientific knowledge on the bodies and lives of women.
One early area of study for feminist science studies was investigation of the location of women in science and their absence from science. (See Rossiter 1982, 1995, Wertheim 1995 and Feminist Equity Critiques above.) Having documented and challenged women's and other minorities' absence from science, scholars have, by asking why specific individuals both male and female leave science, aimed to improve the number of minorities in science (Seymour and Hewitt 1997). Feminist scholars have suggested and encouraged several strategies for improvement. Modest curricular reform in the sciences has included a more community-based education that includes peer instruction, “real world” problem solving activities, active learning, inquiry based learning, and team structured activities that reflect the realities of doing science while challenging common stereotypes of science. Second, feminist scientists and scholars of science encouraged the education and training of scientists “to conduct their investigations in accordance with feminist principles, to resist androcentric currents of mainstream research communities and in some cases to organize their intellectual production along theoretical lines identified with feminism” (Kohlstedt and Longino 1997, 6). This may be the fastest growing area of feminist science studies (broadly construed) as scientists begin to take up feminist concerns (see, for example, Mayberry 2001 and Wyer 2001). Recently, scholars have asked, “has feminism changed science?” and have begun to answer it in the affirmative. (See the special issue of Signs (2003) edited by Londa Schiebinger, especially articles by physicist, Amy Bug; archaeologist, Margaret W. Conkey; and evolutionary biologist, Patty Gowaty. See also Schiebinger 1999b). Feminism has been most successful in influencing/changing the use of metaphors in biology (see Spanier 1995) and scientists are beginning to be more explicit about their methods, values and beliefs and how these might influence their work. Medicine, primatology, biology and archaeology are most frequently cited for having incorporated gender analyses into their science (Schiebinger 1999.) It is not surprising that mathematics and physics are identified as resistant to the insights of feminist theory (Bug 2003).
The presence of women in the sciences, feminist critiques and feminist theories have contributed to changes in modern science as well as in studies of science. But an important goal of feminist science studies is to encourage the presence of women and men who differ by race, class, nation, sexuality, disability, etc. and who can bring to science and science studies a multifaceted awareness of difference, power relations, domination, language and of the need for innovative methodologies. Having documented the absence and reasons for the absence of women in science in the industrialized nations, scholars have begun to examine the role of gender and science in developing nations and in the processes of development (Campion & Shrum 2004); however, more analysis of gender, science and culture outside of western cultures is needed. Although race is more likely to be addressed within feminist than in mainstream science studies, even there it is a nascent area of study. Scholars addressing race and science include: Evelynn Hammond, Banu Subramaniam, Jenny Reardon, Alondra Nelson, and researchers in Sandra Harding's 1993b anthology, The “Racial” Economy of Science. Disabilities studies is also a new field that promises to trouble the space between science, able bodies and feminist theory (see Kafer 2003, Hall 2002, Kittay et al 2001 and the Bibliography for work by these scholars). Feminist science scholars continue to respond to Hilary Rose's challenge to create a “practice of feeling, thinking and writing that opposes the abstraction of male and bourgeois scientific thought” (Rose 1983, 87).
Feminist science studies, feminist activist research such as equity studies, and feminist appropriation of science often pose a challenge to conventional views about what makes science scientific. Science is conventionally held to be marked off by its epistemic ideals of objectivity and these ideals are framed in terms of the value neutrality or the freedom of science from moral, social or political values. Feminist perspectives on science often expose instances in which such contextual values compromise scientific results. But often, feminist science studies reveal that contextual values can improve science. It follows that a key task for philosophers is reframing philosophical accounts of justification and of objectivity to take account of these cases.
Feminist philosophies of science are distinguished by the common goal of making it possible to determine whether and how social values and interests enter “the context of justification.” These philosophers of science have offered analyses of scientific justification and of objectivity that aim to be empirically adequate to the case studies as they stand, without excessive rational reconstruction. Philosophies of science may be set along a spectrum from more naturalizing to more normativist and, as we shall see, feminist philosophies of science tend to lie on the naturalizing end of the spectrum.
One reason that many philosophers have found it difficult to accept such case studies and have sought to rationally reconstruct them is their acceptance of The Ontological Tyranny. Elisabeth Lloyd points out that contemporary analytic philosophers have recognized the meaning of “objectivity” and of “objective” to be complex, unstable and far from clear. Philosophers have, therefore, offered various accounts of it in which we find four distinct meanings of “objective.” All four definitions are at work in a philosophical picture supporting a view of objectivity that Lloyd has dubbed “the ontological tyranny.” “Objective” sometimes means: 1. detached, disinterested, unbiased, impersonal, invested in no particular point of view (or not having a point of view) and is predicated of knowers; knowers are detached, disinterested, etc.; 2. public, publicly available, observable, or accessible (at least in principle); 3. existing independently or separately from us. Being public and existing independently denote a relationship between reality and knowers; reality is observable, publicly available, etc. and reality exists independently of knowers; and finally “objective” sometimes means 4. really existing, Really Real, the way things really are; in this sense “objective” denotes a status of what is regardless of any relationship it has to knowers (1995, 553).
In one philosophical picture, “objective” characterizes a relationship between knowers and reality-as-independently-existing; methodologically, the knower must be detached, because investment in a particular belief or attachment to a point of view (“bias”) “could impede the free acquisition of knowledge and correct representation of (independent) reality…”. The ontological tyranny begins with the claim that ‘objective’ reality “equals all of the Really Real” and is “converged upon through the application of objective methods.” The Really Real can be known since it is publicly accessible to those who use these objective methods and who are properly detached or disinterested. As Lloyd points out, this view assumes (a) that the Really Real is completely independent of us; thus, (b) objective knowledge of this Reality requires an “objective method” characterized by detachment, because (c) attachment or point of view might interfere with our independence from the reality we wish to know, and (d) this reality is publicly accessible, if it is accessible at all (1995, 354–356).
One currently popular form of the ontological tyranny Lloyd dubs “Type/Law Convergent Realism.” In this view, objectivity will result in a convergence on One True Description of reality. Thus, real knowledge “carves Nature at its joints.” This epistemological criterion for knowledge presupposes the metaphysical view that “Nature has joints, i.e., ‘natural’ objects and/or events, and kinds, and laws, which could serve (ideally) to guide inquirers” to discover them. Lloyd argues that once philosophers abandon Type/Law Convergent Realism, they must recognize that in addition to “resistances by reality,” sociocultural factors are “necessarily involved in the development of knowledge and concept-formation.” Anthropologists are virtually unanimous in holding that “sex and gender roles lay the foundations of every human society's other social practices,” therefore, any epistemology and philosophy of science that includes social interests and values as integral to the acquisition of knowledge should include sex and gender related values and interests (Lloyd 1995, 373 and 367–368).
Feminist philosophers of science offer different ways to understand empirical case studies, along with alternative accounts of objectivity and a variety of remedies for uncovering widely held and so unnoticed gender (and other such) values and interests. The remedies are congruent with the particular complex of arguments put forward by each philosopher. (See the entry Feminist Epistemology and Philosophy of Science for an exposition of Helen Longino's Contextual Empiricism and of (Longino 1990; 2002); and see the entry Feminist Social Epistemology for a discussion of feminist accounts of objectivity). The work of feminist philosophers Lynn Hankinson Nelson, Alison Wylie, Sandra Harding, and Elizabeth Anderson will provide our examples.
In response to the challenges raised by feminist research as well as by philosophical arguments, Lynn Hankinson Nelson offers a naturalized, holistic, feminist empiricist understanding of the sciences. For Nelson, a philosophy is naturalized when it is commensurable with the actual history and contemporary practice of science, grounded in sciences relevant to theories of theorizing, e.g., psychology, cognitive science, biology, and/or sociology, and it explains consensus and dissent, progressive and less than progressive episodes, in the same terms. Thus, a good philosophy of science must, like good science, achieve a balance among empirical success, predictive success and explanatory power and must, as a good epistemology of science, describe and explain how scientific knowledge is acquired. Nelson holds that a naturalized philosophy of science does not justify knowledge in general or our particular knowledge claims; instead it must give an empirically adequate description of the production of scientific knowledge, i.e., it is held accountable to case studies which have not been rationally reconstructed to fit its own (or any other) philosophy of science. Its only normative job is to ask whether the social processes currently characterizing scientific practices, recruitment, education, etc. are likely to produce the best theories and if not, suggest changes to insure that they do. Feminist naturalized philosophy of science, then, attends to processes, including especially methodological processes, reflecting gender considerations. And since gender is never in fact separated from race, class and other socio-political categories, feminist philosophy of science attends to these, also.
In Nelson's empiricist holism, hypotheses, models and theories put forward in the sciences must be tested against relevant evidence where evidence includes the observational consequences of the hypothesis and a large set of theories within which the hypothesis is embedded, including common-sense theories. Thus, a hypothesis or model in any branch of science is related to many, but not all, of our current theories. These are all part of the evidence. Nelson's account of evidence reflects feminist considerations as well as empiricist holism: the evidence supporting a specific theory, hypothesis, or research program is constituted by observation, itself largely structured as current theories would have it, and other theories that together constitute a current theory of nature, inclusive of those informed by social beliefs and values (1996, 100). This principle is empiricist and holist inasmuch as it states that evidence is constituted by observation and by theories which themselves are supported by evidence and by other theories. Yet the holism here is relatively modest in that evidence for a hypothesis includes the observational consequences of many, but not all, current theories, metaphysical assumptions, methods, standards and practices (1996, 101). Moreover, the social beliefs and values that can inform our theories might include beliefs and values related to women and gender.
The principle is also naturalized, for Nelson notes that observation is largely structured as current theories would have it, meaning that observational experience is explained by scientific accounts such as those given in neurobiology, developmental biology, neuropsychology and evolutionary biology, not by a philosophical account. And the principle reflects feminist concerns inasmuch as the set of theories constituting evidence for a hypothesis or theory includes social values and socio-political theories. Nelson points to feminist and other case studies of good scientific work which show that socio-political values influence scientific justification. (See 1990, 205–212 and passim for a discussion of the “man, the hunter” theory of human evolution; 1995, 410–413 and 414 for a discussion of work in neuroendocrinology showing that hemispheric lateralization is sex-differentiated; and 415ff for a discussion of the centrality of sex differences in sociobiology.) She concludes from these case studies that lack of empirical success makes scientific work bad; socio-political values do not necessarily do so. Her holistic view of evidence allows us to see that the androcentric assumptions made by scientists and revealed by feminist science studies are not baseless; they rest upon evidence which includes commonly held social assumptions about relations between the sexes (1993, 147). That feminists do not hold them is due in large part to their perspective, a perspective arising from their shared response to current “social experiences, relations, traditions, and historically and culturally specific ways of organizing social life” (1993, 147). For Nelson, the distinction between good and bad science is still based on traditional constitutive virtues including (though not limited to) empirical adequacy, explanatory power and predictive power.
Moreover Nelson argues, case studies also reveal that socio-political and other contextual values sometimes help constitute evidence in good science, i.e., science which scientists themselves say is good science. Thus, the theories that, along with our experiences, constitute evidence include social values and socio-political theories. We must, she says, “reconsider the assumption that political beliefs and theories, and values, are not subject to empirical control, that there is no way to judge between them” (1990, 297; see also Anderson, 1995b and 2004 and A Cooperative Model of Theory Justification below for an account of contextual values that reveals their cognitive components). Finally, on the basis of her case studies, Nelson also argues that knowledge is produced and maintained by communities. While individual scientists put forward candidates for knowledge, they do not know their hypotheses autonomously, before the relevant community has deemed the hypotheses confirmed.
A standard challenge to holistic accounts of the confirmation of hypotheses (or laws) is that in such accounts of science, confirmation is made out to be circular, i.e., our scientific beliefs merely confirm one another. Archaeology provides us with a particularly salient example of this challenge, for archaeologists must use analytical theories drawn from familiar sources to make hypotheses about past cultures and lifeways and to interpret archaeological data as evidence to test these hypotheses. Clearly their observations and hence their observational evidence is “theory-laden.” Given that the evidence used to support hypotheses and theories about the cultural past is laden with theories based on the cultural present, how can archaeologists avoid begging the question in favor of their own understanding of past cultures?
Alison Wylie has developed a model of confirmation through analysis of many cases showing how archaeologists in fact judge the relative credibility of evidential and explanatory claims. Thus, the Consilience Model of Confirmation is naturalizing in the sense set out by Nelson (see Feminist Empiricist Holism above). Too, the model makes clear a version of holism compatible with Nelson's: it shows how hypotheses from different domains bear on (1) the interpretation of data so that the data function as evidence for a hypothesis, h, on (2) hypotheses taken as background assumptions supporting an argument from the evidence to the hypothesis (h) under test, on (3) the interpretation of the hypothesis (h) , and ultimately, on (4) how hypotheses and principles from different domains bear on the theory giving rise to, and in turn supported by, the hypothesis (h) being tested.
Questions about the adequacy of an interpretive hypothesis are usually settled, Wiley notes, when independently constituted lines of evidence converge. Archaeologists recognize that evidence is not a stable, foundational given; it is always “theory-laden,” but mitigated objectivity is achieved when the ladening theories–middle-range, linking principles–used to construe/interpret data as evidence are secure and independent.
Evidence must be secure in two senses: first, the background knowledge used to link the present record (data) with antecedent causes (conditions that produced it) or past events must be credible in its home context (e.g., paleobotanical claims used in an argument must be well established in paleobotany), and second, the inferences supported by this background knowledge are secure to the degree to which the links between the present record (data) and antecedent causes or past events (background assumptions) are unique or deterministic, and to the degree to which the argument chains are relatively short and simple. The evidence must also exhibit epistemic independence in two senses: (1) background assumptions used to establish the evidence must be independent of the hypothesis being tested; and (2) background assumptions (linking principles or sets of linking principles) derived from one or more different sources used to establish the evidential import of archaeological data must be confirmed independently of one another, i.e., if principle A is confirmed by principle B, A must also have independent confirmation. Too, background assumptions must be horizontally independent of one another, i.e., no one set of linking principles entails the others as a proper subset of itself or is confirmed by the same evidence. Once the evidence is secure and independent, then archaeologists can triangulate, set up a system of mutual constraint among different lines of evidence bearing on a hypothesis and ultimately on a theory. Thus, archaeological standards of reasoning yield mitigated objectivity–avoiding the extreme epistemological relativism that would arise were different archaeologists simply to read current assumptions onto the archaeological record. Although the method does not provide certainty, it is certainly not arbitrary. Wiley's model shows that archaeologists use an enormous diversity of evidence and the diversity insures that the evidence can sometimes function as a semi-autonomous constraint on claims about the cultural past, particularly when some of it depends on background knowledge from one or more different sources and when it enters interpretation at different points. Thus different lines of evidence can be mutually constraining when they converge or fail to converge on a coherent account of a particular past context.
Wylie's model provides a good analysis of how gender considerations enter archaeological reasoning and it allows us to see when evidential considerations do meet standards of good practice in the field and when they do not, for example, when current assumptions about women and gender roles are uncritically taken up and used to support hypotheses about the cultural past in a particular context. Such middle-range, linking hypotheses about past women and gender roles fail to be independent of present assumptions and often fail to be fully secure. Some case studies reveal that gender assumptions are important components of archaeological reasoning. They provide examples of good reasoning, i.e., hypotheses well confirmed by collateral theories and linking principles; some cases reveal weaker arguments for a hypothesis, i.e., showing less consilience; and in the worst case, failing the requirement that collateral theories be independent because the argument uses a current gender theory in its attempt to justify a hypothesis purporting to be about past gender arrangements. (A number of feminist case studies in archaeology reveal instances in which conventional work fails the requirement that collateral theories be independent; see Watson and Kennedy 1991, who reveal pervasive androcentrism in explanations of the emergence of agriculture in the Eastern Woodlands of what is now the U.S; Hastorf 1991, whose study of pre-Hispanic sites in the central Andes shows that gender roles and household structures are not the same everywhere at all times, but change as societal structures or dominant ideas change; and Brumfiel 1991 whose work in the Valley of Mexico shows that the Aztec state depended on tribute to maintain its political and economic hegemony, and this depended on changes in the organization and deployment of predominantly female domestic labor.)
Sandra Harding's feminist standpoint theory has been very useful for feminists and critical race scholars working in science studies. (For an introduction to critical race theory, see Crenshaw 1995 and Delgado 2001.) The notion of an epistemic standpoint is directly opposed to a picture of the scientist qua scientist as objective in the sense that he is disinterested and has no point of view; he is the unitary, universal knower. (The Ontological Tyranny offers us such a picture.) The unitary scientist knows in the same way that anyone having no point of view and trained in the same way would know. Any cultural, gender, racial or other social differences among scientists are epistemically irrelevant; hence, the scientist qua scientist is homogeneous and unitary. Scientific knowledge is uncovered by internally homogeneous individuals and groups of individuals who are supposedly homogeneous in this way, “not by culturally specific societies or subgroups in a society such as a certain class or gender or race” (1993, 63–65). To the contrary, feminist standpoint theory argues (and most feminist philosophers of science agree) that scientists and other epistemic agents are local and heterogeneous; that is, agents as knowers are “embodied,” having specific gender, racial, class, historical and cultural locations which shape the content of their thought. Thus Harding argues not only that “the ‘scientific world view’ is, in fact, a view of (dominant groups in) modern Western societies, as the histories of science proudly point out,” but also that the content of scientific thought is shaped (but not determined) by its “historical location.”
Harding's Standpoint Theory rests on the recognition that the social/political organization of societies include gender relations, race and ethnic relations, class relations and many other relationships among people. And as a matter of fact, in most contemporary societies, these are hierarchical relations. Different groups of people can be located at the various intersections of two or more of these hierarchies, and we may refer to these intersections as “social locations.” Thus, we can “locate” white, middle-class men; upper-class, asian-american women; etc. Harding argues, on the basis of both case studies and arguments from Hegel and Marx, that the knowledge produced by epistemic agents, including scientific knowledge, is influenced by their social location (Harding 1997, 383–4; 1993, 54; 1998, 149).
A standpoint is not the same as a viewpoint or a perspective, since any group of people occupying a common social location (found at the intersection of categories used to stratify societies, e.g., gender, class, race, ethnicity, sexuality, religion, age, abilities, etc.) may unreflectively hold a point of view or perspective. Such a perspective may be typical of people occupying that location but the perspective is not a standpoint. A standpoint arises when people occupying a subordinate social location analyze the conditions of their lives and engage in political struggle to change these conditions. Thus, a standpoint is an achievement which is “struggled for.” Although the marxian proletarian was supposed to achieve a universal standpoint by escaping the ideological mystification brought about through living unreflectively in a world in which “the activities of those at the top both organize and set limits on what [subordinated] persons … can understand about themselves and the world around them,” the agents of knowledge, including scientists, as feminist standpoint theory understands them, do not escape their situations (1993, 54 and 63–65). Even feminist standpoints do not escape the influence of social forces–though they are less partial and less false than masculinist ones because they ask critical questions about received belief and about the beliefs constituting their own standpoint.
Harding also argues that communities, not individuals, produce knowledge. And these epistemic communities are heterogeneous as opposed to homogeneous since different epistemic communities–of which scientific communities are a good example–can differ in their social locations and standpoints. And although different epistemic communities might produce similar, compatible accounts of the same domain of the natural or social world, they can produce conflicting accounts. Second, all epistemic communities are, like scientific communities, internally heterogeneous inasmuch as they are made up of people who are significantly different from one another. The heterogeneity of scientific communities gives rise to two problems. (1) If scientists are not epistemically the same and are local in the sense that their thoughts are shaped, though not determined, by the material conditions of their lives, how can they be objective in the way that science demands? And, (2) if different scientific communities investigating the same domain produce conflicting theories accounting for the domain, how can scientists objectively decide among them? How can we avoid radical epistemological relativism in our accounts of scientific theory choice? Research groups reach consensus about their results in part by agreeing to particular methods and agreeing that these methods have been properly practiced. Among the methods are those for eliminating bias in the collection and interpretation of data. Using methods to eliminate bias is understood to make the research group objective and in this sense their results are objective. The methods are understood to insure that any individual scientist's interests, prejudices and personal values do not bias the results.
However, feminist and other science scholars have noted that traditional standards of objectivity are too weak to identify beliefs, interests and values widely shared by members of a community of scientists in a field of natural or social science. As Harding points out, “widely held beliefs function as evidence at every stage in scientific inquiry: in the selection of problems, formation of hypotheses, design of research … collection of data, interpretation and sorting of data, decisions about when to stop research, the way results of research are reported, etc.” Thus, the sciences need stronger standards of objectivity; in particular, the practices of the sciences need to be strongly reflexive, finding ways to reveal widespread sexist, racist, class biased, and eurocentric cultural beliefs, interests and values. And given that most scientists are socially dominant men, it is unlikely that they will recognize these unconscious beliefs, interests and values, but good science requires ways to reveal them (1993, 69). Harding has characterized traditional methods as providing “weak objectivity,” indicating that they are too weak to uncover widely held interests and values. To solve problem (1) above, she suggests that the sciences work to insure diversity among their epistemic agents. In particular, when women within marginalized groups as well as women within dominant groups struggle against their oppression and achieve their own standpoints, these standpoints can contribute to the strong objectivity of scientific accounts. If the standpoints are used to critique dominant accounts of nature and of the social world, they can reveal hidden androcentric, eurocentric or class-based assumptions. It is for this reason that Harding argues on behalf of a more inclusive, more democratic, science: the inclusion of women and men who have standpoints other than the dominant one(s) can help insure the strong objectivity of the sciences. Only the standpoints of those marginal to these scientific communities are strong enough to identify the culture-wide beliefs, interests and values of scientific communities. Thus, good science needs more democratic knowledge procedures (1993, 69).
The heterogeneity within and among research communities gives rise to problem (2) above: since different scientific communities investigating the same domain produce conflicting theories accounting for the domain, how can scientists objectively decide among them? In response, Harding rejects a central feature of “Type/Law Convergent Realism,” viz., that objectivity will result in a convergence on One True Description of reality. She holds that “science never gets us truth … . Scientific procedures are supposed to get us claims that are less false than those–and only those–against which they have been tested… . Thus, scientific claims are supposed to be held not as true but, only provisionally, as ‘least false’ until counterevidence or a new conceptual framework no longer provides them with the status of ‘less false’ …” (1997, 387). “Less false” is a category of epistemic assessment along with true, not-true and false (Hayles 1993). If “true” is reserved for hypotheses that, as Popper argued, pass all possible tests and “false” is reserved for hypotheses that fail important tests, then the best hypothesis science can find in any domain is one which is less-false than all the others against which it has been tested. Having argued that different scientific communities investigating the same domain can produce conflicting theories accounting for the domain, Harding avoids epistemological relativism by rejecting the incommensurability of conflicting theories through an appeal to Galison's (1996) notion of the sciences as having boundaries across which scientists from different communities can communicate using ‘pidgin languages.’ The ability to communicate in this way allows different scientific communities to argue rationally about which account is less-false.
Arguably the greatest challenge for feminist science scholars has been showing how feminist values can make epistemically better science. Elizabeth Anderson has made the argument using an illustrative case study from social science.
Anderson defends the view that contextual values and interests often constrain and are constrained by good scientific work, i.e., that the two often do and should influence one another. Critics argue, especially against feminist versions of the view, that feminists hold their values dogmatically. Indeed, everyone holds their values dogmatically because values cannot be influenced by facts. Moreover, critics argue, when social values and interests influence scientific work, they supplant reasoning from evidence and so interfere with the goal of science which is finding out the truth about nature and about humans and human life, or finding theories with a “good fit,” i.e., that fit the data reasonably well. Thus, when social values or interests influence scientific work they make it bad science. Against this view, Anderson argues that values are subject to critical scrutiny and revision in light of arguments and evidence; briefly, experiences such as disillusionment allow most people (those who are not dogmatic) to learn from experience that some of their values are mistaken. One of the primary reasons that most people can learn from experience that their values are mistaken is because we take our emotional experiences—which Anderson defines as “affectively colored experiences with people or things or events”—to provide evidence that these people or things or events have value. Many emotional experiences are reliable sources of evidence for valuing people and things because these emotional experiences have cognitive content (Deigh 1994). Like most experiences, these have cognitive, usually representative, content and we can find out that the representative content is erroneous, confused, etc. Thus, if we find out that the cognitive content of an emotional experience is defective in some way, we might discount the importance of the feeling, too. Such emotional experiences can function as evidence for values because these experiences are independent of our desires and ends. We can be persuaded by reasons and by facts that despite our emotional experience of something or someone, that thing or person is valuable (or not). This sort of persuasive argument is quite common and makes sense only because our emotions are responsive to facts. And usually our emotions are reliable, though certainly not infallible, evidence for our value judgments. The exceptions include emotions affected by drugs, depression, etc. (2004, 9–10).
Having shown that values are subject to critical scrutiny and revision in light of arguments and evidence, Anderson argues that values and interests can properly influence science and help produce better science. This is because merely collecting facts does not add up to good science. Scientists need facts that are relevant to the purposes or aims of their investigations. There are many goals of scientific inquiry other than finding truth and, Anderson points out, some of these goals are based on contextual values because modern science exists in large part to serve human interests. Scientific theories organize hypotheses through models that select important from unimportant phenomena. And what is deemed important “depends on practical needs and interests which may be gendered or staked in other socially constructed positions such as class or race” (1995b, 53; 1995a, 56; cf. also Tiles, 1987). Anderson notes two problems arising when moral and social values serve as the background for framing research questions and selecting significant facts: 1. when we morally assess these values, they may turn out to be pernicious; and 2. the research may not be impartial; it may fail to live up to the requirement that the researcher be genuinely open to the evidence and arguments, both those that favor a preferred conclusion and those that undermine it. But the solution to these problems is not “value-neutrality”; value-neutrality would leave research without any direction because without values and valued interests, researchers cannot distinguish a significant from an insignificant fact and a biased account from one that is impartial. Thus, the proper ideal for research is impartiality, not value-neutrality. Impartiality is not achieved by disregarding evaluative standards; instead, it is achieved by “a commitment to pass judgment in relation to a set of evaluative standards that transcends the competing interests of those who advocate rival answers to a question” (1995b, 41–42).
To show how contextual values can legitimately influence theory choice, Anderson (1995b) sets out her Cooperative Model of Theory Justification, modeling the interaction between normative and evidential considerations in theory choice and thereby revealing the use of contextual values in answering evaluative research questions and the use of evidence in evaluating contextual values. The model applies to any research in the natural or social sciences directed to evaluative questions.
According to the Cooperative Model of Theory Justification, all scientific work begins with a question which directs research by
- defining what counts as a significant fact, viz., one that bears on the answer to the question, and
- defining what counts as an adequate account of a phenomenon, viz., one that captures enough of the phenomena in question that the addition of further detail won't change the answer.
Contextually value-laden research questions yield theories subject to three criticisms:
- all the statements of T are true, but T is trivial, insignificant, does not address the interests motivating the question;
- all the statements of T are true but T is biased, incomplete or distorted, viz., it pays disproportionate attention to pieces of significant evidence that incline toward one answer, ignoring significant facts supporting rival answers. If the question has moral import, whether T is biased depends on the moral relevance of the evidence cited. This assessment depends on moral and political value judgments.
- T may be addressed to a question that has illegitimate normative presuppositions.
When the questions are based on contextual interests, answers must address the interests; thus, these contextual values direct research by shaping the description/classification of research objects, viz., grouping together phenomena that bear a common relation to these interests. This is because purely epistemic criteria of significance are not sufficient to define theoretical classifications.
Theories using such classifications are subject to the epistemic requirements that
- there are clear empirical criteria for deciding when phenomena fall under a classification
- some phenomena do fall under the classification, and
- the classification must figure in some explanation or causal or empirical regularity.
Theories using such classifications are subject to the normative requirements that
- classifications track the underlying contextual values accurately, i.e., group phenomena together that share a common relation to these values or interests. (T may misconceive relevant, legitimate interests and classify together phenomena that should be separated or exclude phenomena that should be included in a class.)
- the contextual values themselves are ethically justified. (T's classifications may be based on illegitimate contextual values and should be rejected altogether, e.g., sexist and androcentric values.)
Contextual values also direct research by shaping the methods used to answer them, i.e., methods must be adequate to reveal the phenomena deemed significant by those interests.
Theories using such methods are subject to the criticism that they use methods that foreclose the possibility of discovering valuable potentialities or important differences or similarities among the objects of inquiry.
This model pictures the cooperative relationship between the normative and evidential considerations underlying theory choice in the following ways: (a) contextual values set standards of significance and adequacy (and thus, of impartiality, lack of bias) for a theory, and evidence determines whether the theory meets the standards; (b) contextual values help define what counts as a meaningful classification and the empirical criteria for identifying things falling under it, and evidence determines what if anything meets these criteria; and (c) contextual values help determine the methods needed to answer a question, and the evidence gathered using those methods helps answer it (1995b, 53–54).
Anderson provides a case study of the way in which explicitly feminist values can help produce science which is better by standard scientific criteria. Abigail Stewart et al. (1997) did a longitudinal study of consequences of divorce for the people involved. Anderson's analysis highlights eight points at which Stewart et al's feminist values influenced their research and made the research better science than its rivals (e.g., Wallerstein and Kelly 1980 and Wallerstein et al. 2000). To give the reader a general idea of how feminist values influenced research decisions, we briefly discuss only (b), (d), (e) and (f):
- orientation to the background interests animating the field
- framing the question informed by those interests
As Anderson notes, the traditionalist question is, “Does divorce have negative effects on children and their parents?” To answer this question, researchers are likely to compare members of divorced and non-divorced families on measures of well-being, especially negative ones, e.g., sickness, poverty and behavior problems. The feminist researchers thought that 1. focusing on negative outcomes makes it hard to find positive outcomes; 2. focusing on aggregate differences between divorced and non-divorced groups assumes that the findings, and evaluations based on them, apply to each person in the group; and 3. focusing on divorce as an event assumes that it has a fixed, enduring meaning, and misses whether its meaning changes over time–positively or negatively, but especially positively. Thus, the feminists asked, “How do individuals differ from one another and over time regarding the effects of divorce on them and the meanings they ascribe to it?”
- articulating a conception of the object of inquiry
- deciding what types of data to collect
Some standard measures of well-being relevant to the value of divorce include financial security, children's behavioral problems, physical illness, etc. “Traditionalists” gather data using these measures. Feminists include, in addition to these traditional measures, individuals' feelings about their situation and their emotionally colored interpretations of their situations as evidence of the individuals' well-being and the value of divorce. The feminist background assumption here is that individuals have privileged, though not infallible, normative authority to assess their own well-being. (See the discussion of feminist assumptions in Section 4 above.) Thus, the feminist team gathered data including subjects' self-assessments.
- establishing and carrying out data sampling or data generation procedures
Data sampling can also be influenced by background values. Unfortunately, when Wallerstein drew her sample from among people who attended a psychological treatment clinic, she drew a sample that was biased toward people who were having problems with divorce. By drawing its sample from divorce dockets, the feminist team drew a less biased (though not perfect) sample.
- analyzing data in accordance with chosen techniques
Researchers must decide which among all their variables are significant and which relationships among the variables are significant. Background values influence such decisions, for example, whether to use a main effects analysis or to look for interaction effects. Thus, researchers who hold that there is a single best way of life for everyone, such as the “traditional” family life, will employ a main effects analysis, suggesting that their findings represent all members of families. But researchers who hold that different ways of life, e.g., different forms of “family,” are better for different people, will want to pay attention to “within-group heterogeneity” and so will employ an interaction effects analysis. Stewart et al. chose the latter methods.
- deciding when to stop analyzing the data, and
- drawing conclusions from the analyses (Anderson 2004, 11).
The conclusions of divorce research make normative assessments, e.g., positive and/or negative evaluations of divorce, and so can be used to make normative suggestions, e.g. about how best to cope with divorce and its effects.
The research is carried out to answer evaluative questions on the basis of empirical evidence and, as Anderson points out, would be senseless if science could not support values, i.e., if “ethics were science-free.” Anderson's case is one in which an evaluative presuppositions, individuals have privileged–not infallible–normative authority to assess their own well-being, was used to guide researchers to collect and analyze data that included individuals' self-assessments. And she notes that it is the normative validity of this value presupposition that explains its epistemic value. “It is precisely because subjective emotional responses and emotion-laden interpretations are normatively relevant to judgments of well-being that [including such subjective measures made the feminists'] research more fruitful than research programs that focus only on objective measures” such as finances and behavior problems (2004, 21). Using traditional measures uncovered interesting facts about the negative outcomes of divorce on women and children, but using subjects' feelings and interpretations uncovered significant findings that establish Stewart et al's research as epistemically better, e.g., more fruitful and more empirically adequate, than Wallerstein's.
Thus, contextual values legitimately influence science if (1) and (2) hold:
- Precautions are taken to avoid three biases in research
- in relation to the object of inquiry so that research (truthfully) reveals only some of its aspects, leaving us ignorant of others.
- in relation to its hypotheses so that the research is rigged (wittingly or not) to confirm them. A good research design must allow its hypothesis to be disconfirmed by evidence. Anderson points out that it is not the values guiding the research that cause bias in relation to its hypothesis; instead, it is the failure to use proper methods, the precautions regularly taken in research such as drawing fair samples of evidence or treating controversial results symmetrically, i.e., not stopping research when one makes findings that support one's hypothesis, but putting the hypothesis through further tests.
- in relation to a controversy so that the research is more likely to (truthfully) uncover evidence that supports one side rather than all sides. On the other hand, one “research design is more fruitful than another, with respect to a controversy, if it is more likely to uncover evidence supporting (or undermining) all, or a wider range of sides of the controversy.” (2004, 18–20)
- The values are epistemically fruitful, i.e., they guide research “toward discovering a wider range of evidence that could potentially support any (or more) sides of a controversy.” Thus, a contextual value is more epistemically fruitful than others if it has more power to uncover significant phenomena. When a less fruitful value guides research, important evidence can still be uncovered, but we must remember that such research is limited to answering only certain questions or giving only a partial answer to a controversial question. (2004, 20)
This brief sample of work in feminist philosophy of science, Nelson's empiricist holism, Wylie's Consilience Model of Confirmation, Harding's Standpoint Theory and Anderson's Cooperative Model of Theory Justification, reveals that in its early period the research program has offered analyses of objectivity, evidence, confirmation, the nature of the epistemic agent and the role of values in science. Our brief overview allows us to see how feminist perspectives intersect with issues in the philosophy of science.
Feminist perspectives on science reflect a broad spectrum of appraisals and epistemic attitudes toward science. These are motivated by recognition that the institutions of science have traditionally excluded women as practitioners; that issues of concern to women and sex/gender minorities are routinely marginalized in scientific inquiry, or are treated in ways that reproduce gender-normative stereotypes; and that scientific authority often rationalizes social roles and institutions that feminists call into question.
Feminists are skeptical of both the presumption that the sciences are an inherently masculine domain—that women are unfit for science, or science unfit for women—and the conviction that the institutions of science are a model of gender-neutral meritocracy. This skepticism has led to feminist equity critiques (discussed in Section 2). Feminist historians of science document entrenched historical patterns of exclusion of women but, at the same time, they recover evidence of women's active participation in the sciences. Although by mid-Nineteenth Century women were admitted to institutions of higher education and slowly gained access to scientific training, since the 1980's it has become clear that these gains in science training have not translated into comparable improvements in their representation in faculties of science and in “leadership positions” in the sciences.
Conventional explanations of these persistent inequalities typically invoke the talents, drive, and preferences of women. But other explanations note that while intentional discrimination still exists, gender discrimination also takes the form of diffuse but persistent differences in the recognition and reward of women's achievements. These differences in treatment arise in part from cognitive schemas and other heuristics that operate below the threshold of conscious awareness, generating patterns of evaluation bias that track not only gender but also race/ethnicity and a range of other markers by which social inequality is constituted. These complex explanations of the gender inequality in the sciences suggest that mitigating gender inequities in the sciences requires changing entrenched practices that are responsible for the continued loss of trained scientific talent.
Not all feminist scientists are women and, certainly, not all women scientists are feminists; nor do feminists agree about the best relationship between feminism and the sciences. But despite differences of perspective, feminists share a concern to understand and to change conditions of oppression that operate along lines of gender difference. These goals require an accurate understanding of the nature and sources of oppression, and the sciences offer powerful tools for providing this understanding. As we saw in Section 3, some feminist scientists call for attention to neglected questions with the aim of improving the sciences in their own terms; those who are more methodologically and epistemically conservative do not challenge the background assumptions, methodological commitments, standards and practices of existing programs of scientific research. We can think of this approach as the selective appropriation of the tools of scientific inquiry for application in feminist-directed research, for example, medical research on neglected conditions that are specific to women, social science research on violence against women, gendered voting patterns, the gendered nature of poverty and gender differences in the impact of development policies.
But even epistemically conservative feminist interventions–focused on correcting errors of omission and on investigating neglected problems–often generate more deeply challenging questions. Thus, many feminist scientists are more critical of the standards and practices of existing research programs and pursue constructive programs aimed at transforming the methodologies, ontological commitments, framework assumptions, and epistemic ideals that animate their fields. As we see from the many examples presented in Section 3, although the feminist critiques are necessarily quite different in the biological physical and social sciences, discovery of omissions and distortions raise questions about methodological standards. Interventions that intend to be remedial or corrective often expose patterns of omission or gender-normative distortion that compromise not just the details but the framework assumptions of the sciences examined and the epistemic ideals that inform scientific practice.
The recognition that established scientific methodologies frequently reproduce or generate androcentric and sexist biases has led feminists to ask how to improve their methods. The “feminist method debate” (discussed in Section 4) arose as feminists sought to articulate guidelines for research that would avoid the pitfalls of sexist and androcentric practice exposed by feminist critique, and that would be appropriate to the questions that concern women and feminists. Although in the current consensus there is no uniquely feminist method, feminist practitioners have formulated guidelines for research that is less sexist and more consistent with feminist ideals. These guidelines include addressing questions relevant to women and others oppressed by gendered systems; grounding research in the situated experience of women, i.e., insuring that women's experience gives rise directly to the questions asked and undertaking to treat gendered experience and self-understanding as a critical resource at all stages of research (though not as epistemically foundational); adhering to ethical and pragmatic norms specifying that practitioners be accountable to research subjects in various senses; and being reflexive. Thus, strong reflexivity means taking into account the ways in which their own socially defined angle of vision, interests, and values influence the research process (this sharply distinguishes feminists from other researchers who have not avoided these influences but are unaware of them). In short, feminist research aims to prevent gender from being “disappeared.”
All the issues discussed in this essay, from equity critiques to philosophical analysis, are among those included in the field known as “feminist sciences studies.” Generally, this interdisciplinary field, discussed in Section 5, encompasses feminist work in anthropology, cultural studies, economics, feminism, history, philosophy, political science, and sociology, and aims to show that and how science is a social activity. Across these disciplines, feminist science scholars contribute gender analyses that address such issues as power and inequality, differences among knowers, subjectivity and objectivity, embodiment, work, and the distinction between scientific experts and lay-people. And most feminist analyses pay attention to the relationships among science, gender, race, class, sexuality, disability and colonialism and how science constructs and applies these differences. Section 5 briefly summarizes past work in feminist science studies, but we note that recent work increasingly turns to the role of gender and science in developing nations and in the processes of development; too, the intersection of gender, science and culture outside of western cultures holds promise. Although race is more likely to be addressed within feminist than mainstream science studies, much work remains to be done; and finally, feminist disabilities studies now appear with increasing prominence.
Science is conventionally understood as objective in the sense that scientific work and the results of that work are free of or neutral among contextual values, i.e., moral, social or political values. And feminist science studies among others, often expose instances in which gendered social values compromise scientific results. But often, feminist science studies reveal that such contextual values can improve science. This recognition flies in the face of the traditional philosophical view that if contextual values enter the context of justification, the result is bad science. Thus, feminist philosophies of science, exemplified in Section 6 through discussion of Lloyd, Nelson, Wylie, Harding and Anderson, undertake to determine whether and how social values and interests enter the context of justification. They do so with close attention to the nature of scientific justification and of objectivity, providing analyses that aim to be empirically adequate to the case studies as they stand, without excessive rational reconstruction. Thus, we have found that we can usefully set them along a spectrum from more naturalizing to more normativist–where the naturalizing tends to be to the social sciences (the work of Richmond Campbell (2000) provides an exception to this general feminist preference.
Briefly, feminist perspectives on science arise from concerns to improve the lives of women and men by encouraging and using better understandings of the natural and social worlds. The work of feminist scholars recovering the history of women's contributions to science, exposing error, raising evidential standards, and generating innovative insights in the sciences arises from feminist values. This recognition challenges the assumption that contextual values always corrupt the capacity of science to generate credible knowledge and makes salient the work of feminist philosophers of science, exemplified by those discussed here, on important issues such as objectivity, the role of values in science, the nature of epistemic agency and the social nature of science.
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- ADVANCE (NSF-funded Program for the Advancement of Women in Academic Science and engineering Careers): a number of ADVANCE projects support websites that provide useful information on the issues faced by women in the sciences and on strategies for promoting “institutional transformation” developed with NSF support. Three of the most extensive are:
- FEMMSS: Association for Feminist Epistemologies, Methodologies, Metaphysics and Science Studies
- RaceSci (History of Race in Science): a website of links to websites concerned with race in science
- Society for Analytic Feminism: a forum for feminist philosophy in the analytic tradition which includes feminist philosophy of science
- Symposia on Gender, Race and Philosophy, Robert Gooding-Williams, Sally Haslanger, Ishani Maitra, Ronald Sundstrom, and Cynthia Willett (eds.): archives, book reviews, bibliography and links to related websites.
- Anderson, E., Extended critical notice of “How Not to Criticize Feminist Epistemology: a Review of Scrutinizing Feminist Epistemology”
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