# Game Theory

*First published Sat Jan 25, 1997; substantive revision Wed May 5, 2010*

Game theory is the study of the ways in which *strategic
interactions* among *economic agents* produce
*outcomes* with respect to the *preferences* (or
*utilities*) of those agents, where the outcomes in question
might have been intended by none of the agents. The meaning of this
statement will not be clear to the non-expert until each of the
italicized words and phrases has been explained and featured in some
examples. Doing this will be the main business of this article. First,
however, we provide some historical and philosophical context in order
to motivate the reader for the technical work ahead.

- 1. Philosophical and Historical Motivation
- 2. Basic Elements and Assumptions of Game Theory
- 3. Uncertainty, Risk and Sequential Equilibria
- 4. Repeated Games and Coordination
- 5. Commitment
- 6. Evolutionary Game Theory
- 7. Game Theory and Behavioral Evidence
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Philosophical and Historical Motivation

The mathematical theory of games was invented by John von Neumann and Oskar Morgenstern (1944). For reasons to be discussed later, limitations in their mathematical framework initially made the theory applicable only under special and limited conditions. This situation has dramatically changed, in ways we will examine as we go along, over the past six decades, as the framework has been deepened and generalized. Refinements are still being made, and we will review a few outstanding problems that lie along the advancing front edge of these developments towards the end of the article. However, since at least the late 1970s it has been possible to say with confidence that game theory is the most important and useful tool in the analyst's kit whenever she confronts situations in which what counts as one agent's best action (for her) depends on expectations about what one or more other agents will do, and what counts as their best actions (for them) similarly depend on expectations about her.

Despite the fact that game theory has been rendered mathematically and
logically systematic only since 1944, game-theoretic insights
can be found among commentators going back
to ancient times. For example, in two of Plato's texts, the
*Laches* and the *Symposium*, Socrates recalls an
episode from the Battle of Delium that some commentators have
interpreted (probably anachronistically) as involving the following
situation. Consider a soldier at the front, waiting with his comrades
to repulse an enemy attack. It may occur to him that if the defense is
likely to be successful, then it isn't very probable that his own
personal contribution will be essential. But if he stays, he runs the
risk of being killed or wounded—apparently for no point. On the
other hand, if the enemy is going to win the battle, then his chances
of death or injury are higher still, and now quite clearly to no
point, since the line will be overwhelmed anyway. Based on this
reasoning, it would appear that the soldier is better off running away
regardless of who is going to win the battle. Of course, if all of the
soldiers reason this way—as they all apparently *should*,
since they're all in identical situations—then this will
certainly *bring about* the outcome in which the battle is
lost. Of course, this point, since it has occurred to us as analysts,
can occur to the soldiers too. Does this give them a reason for
staying at their posts? Just the contrary: the greater the soldiers'
fear that the battle will be lost, the greater their incentive to get
themselves out of harm's way. And the greater the soldiers' belief
that the battle will be won, without the need of any particular
individual's contributions, the less reason they have to stay and
fight. If each soldier *anticipates* this sort of reasoning on
the part of the others, all will quickly reason themselves into a
panic, and their horrified commander will have a rout on his hands
before the enemy has even fired a shot.

Long before game theory had come along to show analysts how to think about this sort of problem systematically, it had occurred to some actual military leaders and influenced their strategies. Thus the Spanish conqueror Cortez, when landing in Mexico with a small force who had good reason to fear their capacity to repel attack from the far more numerous Aztecs, removed the risk that his troops might think their way into a retreat by burning the ships on which they had landed. With retreat having thus been rendered physically impossible, the Spanish soldiers had no better course of action but to stand and fight—and, furthermore, to fight with as much determination as they could muster. Better still, from Cortez's point of view, his action had a discouraging effect on the motivation of the Aztecs. He took care to burn his ships very visibly, so that the Aztecs would be sure to see what he had done. They then reasoned as follows: Any commander who could be so confident as to willfully destroy his own option to be prudent if the battle went badly for him must have good reasons for such extreme optimism. It cannot be wise to attack an opponent who has a good reason (whatever, exactly, it might be) for being sure that he can't lose. The Aztecs therefore retreated into the surrounding hills, and Cortez had his victory bloodlessly.

These situations as recalled by Plato and as vividly acted upon by
Cortez have a common and interesting underlying logic. Notice that the
soldiers are not motivated to retreat *just*, or even mainly,
by their rational assessment of the dangers of battle and by their
self-interest. Rather, they discover a sound reason to run away by
realizing that what it makes sense for them to do depends on what it
will make sense for others to do, and that all of the others can
notice this too. Even a quite brave soldier may prefer to run rather
than heroically, but pointlessly, die trying to stem the oncoming tide
all by himself. Thus we could imagine, without contradiction, a
circumstance in which an army, all of whose members are brave, flees
at top speed before the enemy makes a move. If the soldiers really
*are* brave, then this surely isn't the outcome any of them
wanted; each would have preferred that all stand and fight. What we
have here, then, is a case in which the *interaction* of many
individually rational decision-making processes—one process per
soldier—produces an outcome intended by no one. (Most armies try
to avoid this problem just as Cortez did. Since they can't usually
make retreat *physically* impossible, they make it
*economically* impossible: they shoot deserters. Then standing
and fighting is each soldier's individually rational course of action
after all, because the cost of running is sure to be at least as high
as the cost of staying.)

Another classic source that invites this sequence of reasoning is
found in Shakespeare's *Henry V*. During the Battle of
Agincourt Henry decided to slaughter his French prisoners, in full
view of the enemy and to the surprise of his subordinates, who
describe the action as being out of moral character. The reasons Henry
gives allude to parametric considerations: he is afraid that the
prisoners may free themselves and threaten his position. However, a
game theorist might have furnished him with supplementary strategic
(and similarly prudential, though perhaps not moral)
justification. His own troops observe that the prisoners have been
killed, and observe that the enemy has observed this. Therefore, they
know what fate will await them at the enemy's hand if they don't
win. Metaphorically, but very effectively, their boats have been
burnt. The slaughter of the prisoners plausibly sent a signal to the
soldiers of both sides, thereby changing their incentives in ways that
favoured English prospects for victory.

These examples might seem to be relevant only for those who find
themselves in sordid situations of cut-throat competition. Perhaps,
one might think, it is important for generals, politicians,
businesspeople and others whose jobs involve manipulation of others,
but the philosopher should only deplore its amorality. Such a
conclusion would be highly premature, however. The study of
the *logic* that governs the interrelationships amongst
incentives, strategic interactions and outcomes has been fundamental
in modern political philosophy, since centuries before anyone had an
explicit name for this sort of logic. Philosophers share with social
scientists the need to be able to represent and systematically model
not only what they think people normatively *ought to* do, but
what they often *actually* do in interactive situations.

Hobbes's *Leviathan* is often regarded as the founding work in
modern political philosophy, the text that began the continuing round
of analyses of the function and justification of the state and its
restrictions on individual liberties. The core of Hobbes's reasoning
can be given quite straightforwardly as follows. The best situation
for all people is one in which each is free to do as she pleases. (One
may or may not agree with this as a matter of psychology, but it is
Hobbes's assumption.) Often, such free people will wish to cooperate
with one another in order to carry out projects that would be
impossible for an individual acting alone. But if there are any
immoral or amoral agents around, they will notice that their interests
might at least sometimes be best served by getting the benefits from
cooperation and not returning them. Suppose, for example, that you
agree to help me build my house in return for my promise to help you
build yours. After my house is finished, I can make your labour free
to me simply by reneging on my promise. I then realize, however, that
if this leaves you with no house, you will have an incentive to take
mine. This will put me in constant fear of you, and force me to spend
valuable time and resources guarding myself against you. I can best
minimize these costs by striking first and killing you at the first
opportunity. Of course, you can anticipate all of this reasoning by
me, and so have good reason to try to beat me to the punch. Since I
can anticipate *this* reasoning by
*you*, my original fear of you was not paranoid; nor was yours
of me. In fact, neither of us actually needs to be immoral to get this
chain of mutual reasoning going; we need only think that there is some
*possibility* that the other might try to cheat on bargains.
Once a small wedge of doubt enters any one mind, the incentive induced
by fear of the consequences of being *preempted*—hit
before hitting first—quickly becomes overwhelming on both
sides. If either of us has any resources of our own that the other
might want, this murderous logic will take hold long before we are so
silly as to imagine that we could ever actually get as far as making
deals to help one another build houses in the first place. Left to
their own devices, agents who are at least sometimes narrowly
self-interested will repeatedly fail to derive the benefits of
cooperation, and will instead live in a state of ‘war of all
against all’, in Hobbes's words. In these circumstances, human
life, as he vividly and famously put it, will be “solitary, poor,
nasty, brutish and short.”

Hobbes's proposed solution to this problem was tyranny. The people can hire an agent—a government—whose job is to punish anyone who breaks any promise. So long as the threatened punishment is sufficiently dire—Hobbes thought decapitation generally appropriate—then the cost of reneging on promises will exceed the cost of keeping them. The logic here is identical to that used by an army when it threatens to shoot deserters. If all people know that these incentives hold for most others, then cooperation will not only be possible, but will be the expected norm, and the war of all against all becomes a general peace.

Hobbes pushes the logic of this argument to a very strong
conclusion, arguing that it implies not only a government with the
right and the power to enforce cooperation, but an
‘undivided’ government in which the arbitrary will of a
single ruler must impose absolute obligation on all. Few contemporary
political theorists think that the particular steps by which Hobbes
reasons his way to this conclusion are both sound and valid. Working
through these issues here, however, would carry us away from our topic
into complex details of contractarian political philosophy. What is
important in the present context is that these details, as they are in
fact pursued in the contemporary debates, all involve sophisticated
interpretation of the issues using the resources of modern game theory.
Furthermore, Hobbes's most basic point, that the fundamental
justification for the coercive authority and practices of governments
is peoples' own need to protect themselves from what game theorists
call ‘social dilemmas’, is accepted by many, if not most,
political theorists. Notice that Hobbes has *not* argued that
tyranny is a desirable thing in itself. The structure of his argument
is that the logic of strategic interaction leaves only two general
political outcomes possible: tyranny and anarchy. Sensible agents then
choose tyranny as the lesser of two evils.

The reasoning of the Athenian soldiers, of Cortez, and of Hobbes's
political agents has a common logic, one derived from their
situations. In each case, the aspect of the environment that is most
important to the agents' achievement of their preferred outcomes is
the set of expectations and possible reactions to their strategies by
other agents. The distinction between acting *parametrically*
on a passive world and acting
*non-parametrically* on a world that tries to act in
anticipation of these actions is fundamental. If you wish to kick a
rock down a hill, you need only concern yourself with the rock's mass
relative to the force of your blow, the extent to which it is bonded
with its supporting surface, the slope of the ground on the other side
of the rock, and the expected impact of the collision on your
foot. The values of all of these variables are independent of your
plans and intentions, since the rock has no interests of its own and
takes no actions to attempt to assist or thwart you. By contrast, if
you wish to kick a person down the hill, then unless that person is
unconscious, bound or otherwise incapacitated, you will likely not
succeed unless you can disguise your plans until it's too late for him
to take either evasive or forestalling action. Furthermore, his
probable responses should be expected to visit costs upon you, which
you would be wise to consider. Finally, the relative probabilities of
his responses will depend on his expectations about your probable
responses to his responses. (Consider the difference it will make to
both of your reasoning if one or both of you are armed, or one of you
is bigger than the other, or one of you is the other's boss.) The
logical issues associated with the second sort of situation (kicking
the person as opposed to the rock) are typically much more
complicated, as a simple hypothetical example will illustrate.

Suppose first that you wish to cross a river that is spanned by three bridges. (Assume that swimming, wading or boating across are impossible.) The first bridge is known to be safe and free of obstacles; if you try to cross there, you will succeed. The second bridge lies beneath a cliff from which large rocks sometimes fall. The third is inhabited by deadly cobras. Now suppose you wish to rank-order the three bridges with respect to their preferability as crossing-points. Your task here is quite straightforward. The first bridge is obviously best, since it is safest. To rank-order the other two bridges, you require information about their relative levels of danger. If you can study the frequency of rock-falls and the movements of the cobras for awhile, you might be able to calculate that the probability of your being crushed by a rock at the second bridge is 10% and of being struck by a cobra at the third bridge is 20%. Your reasoning here is strictly parametric because neither the rocks nor the cobras are trying to influence your actions, by, for example, concealing their typical patterns of behaviour because they know you are studying them. It is quite obvious what you should do here: cross at the safe bridge. Now let us complicate the situation a bit. Suppose that the bridge with the rocks was immediately before you, while the safe bridge was a day's difficult hike upstream. Your decision-making situation here is slightly more complicated, but it is still strictly parametric. You would have to decide whether the cost of the long hike was worth exchanging for the penalty of a 10% chance of being hit by a rock. However, this is all you must decide, and your probability of a successful crossing is entirely up to you; the environment is not interested in your plans.

However, if we now complicate the situation by adding a non-parametric element, it becomes much more puzzling. Suppose that you are a fugitive of some sort, and waiting on the other side of the river with a gun is your pursuer. She will catch and shoot you, let us suppose, only if she waits at the bridge you try to cross; otherwise, you will escape. As you reason through your choice of bridge, it occurs to you that she is over there trying to anticipate your reasoning. It will seem that, surely, choosing the safe bridge straight away would be a mistake, since that is just where she will expect you, and your chances of death rise to certainty. So perhaps you should risk the rocks, since these odds are much better. But wait … if you can reach this conclusion, your pursuer, who is just as rational and well-informed as you are, can anticipate that you will reach it, and will be waiting for you if you evade the rocks. So perhaps you must take your chances with the cobras; that is what she must least expect. But, then, no … if she expects that you will expect that she will least expect this, then she will most expect it. This dilemma, you realize with dread, is general: you must do what your pursuer least expects; but whatever you most expect her to least expect is automatically what she will most expect. You appear to be trapped in indecision. All that might console you a bit here is that, on the other side of the river, your pursuer is trapped in exactly the same quandary, unable to decide which bridge to wait at because as soon as she imagines committing to one, she will notice that if she can find a best reason to pick a bridge, you can anticipate that same reason and then avoid her.

We know from experience that, in situations such as this, people do
not usually stand and dither in circles forever. As we'll see later,
there *is* a rational solution—that is, a best rational
action—available to both players. However, until the 1940s
neither philosophers nor economists knew how to find it
mathematically. As a result, economists were forced to treat
non-parametric influences as if they were complications on parametric
ones. This is likely to strike the reader as odd, since, as our
example of the bridge-crossing problem was meant to show,
non-parametric features are often fundamental features of
decision-making problems. Part of the explanation for game theory's
relatively late entry into the field lies in the problems with which
economists had historically been concerned. Classical economists, such
as Adam Smith and David Ricardo, were mainly interested in the
question of how agents in very large markets—whole
nations—could interact so as to bring about maximum monetary
wealth for themselves. Smith's basic insight, that efficiency is best
maximized by agents freely seeking mutually advantageous bargains, was
mathematically verified in the twentieth century. However, the
demonstration of this fact applies only in conditions of
‘perfect competition,’ that is, when firms face no costs
of entry or exit into markets, when there are no economies of scale,
and when no agents' actions have unintended side-effects on other
agents' well-being. Economists always recognized that this set of
assumptions is purely an idealization for purposes of analysis, not a
possible state of affairs anyone could try (or should want to try) to
attain. But until the mathematics of game theory matured near the end
of the 1970s, economists had to hope that the more closely a market
*approximates* perfect competition, the more efficient it will
be. No such hope, however, can be mathematically or logically
justified in general; indeed, as a strict generalization the
assumption was shown to be false as far back as the 1950s.

This article is not about the foundations of economics, but it is important for understanding the origins and scope of game theory to know that perfectly competitive markets have built into them a feature that renders them susceptible to parametric analysis. Because agents face no entry costs to markets, they will open shop in any given market until competition drives all profits to zero. This implies that if production costs are fixed and demand is exogenous, then agents have no options about how much to produce if they are trying to maximize the differences between their costs and their revenues. These production levels can be determined separately for each agent, so none need pay attention to what the others are doing; each agent treats her counterparts as passive features of the environment. The other kind of situation to which classical economic analysis can be applied without recourse to game theory is that of monopoly. Here, quite obviously, non-parametric considerations drop out, since there is only one agent under study. However, both perfect and monopolistic competition are very special and unusual market arrangements. Prior to the advent of game theory, therefore, economists were severely limited in the class of circumstances to which they could neatly apply their models.

Philosophers share with economists a professional interest in the
conditions and techniques for the maximization of human welfare. In
addition, philosophers have a special concern with the logical
justification of actions, and often actions must be justified by
reference to their expected outcomes. (One tradition in philosophy,
utilitarianism, is based on the idea that all justifiable actions must
be justified in this way.) Without game theory, both of these problems
resist analysis wherever non-parametric aspects are relevant. We will
demonstrate this shortly by reference to the most famous (though not
the most typical) game, the so-called *Prisoner's Dilemma*, and
to other, more typical, games. In doing this, we will need to
introduce, define and illustrate the basic elements and techniques of
game theory. To this job we therefore now turn.

## 2. Basic Elements and Assumptions of Game Theory

### 2.1 Utility

An economic agent is, by definition, an entity with *preferences*. Game
theorists, like economists and philosophers studying rational
decision-making, describe these by means of an abstract concept called
*utility*. This refers to some ranking, on some specified
scale, of the subjective welfare or change in subjective welfare that
an agent derives from an object or an event. By ‘welfare’
we refer to some normative index of relative well-being, justified by
reference to some background framework. For example, we might evaluate
the relative welfare of countries (which we might model as agents for
some purposes) by reference to their per capita incomes, and we might
evaluate the relative welfare of an animal, in the context of
predicting and explaining its behavioral dispositions, by reference to
its expected evolutionary fitness. In the case of people, it is most
typical in economics and applications of game theory to evaluate their
relative welfare by reference to their own implicit or explicit
judgments of it. This is why we referred above to *subjective*
welfare. Consider a person who adores the taste of pickles but
dislikes onions. She might be said to associate higher utility with
states of the world in which, all else being equal, she consumes more
pickles and fewer onions than with states in which she consumes more
onions and fewer pickles. Examples of this kind suggest that
‘utility’ denotes a measure of subjective
*psychological* fulfillment, and this is indeed how the concept
was generally (though not always) interpreted prior to the 1930s.
During that decade, however, economists and philosophers under the
influence of behaviourism objected to the theoretical use of such
unobservable entities as ‘psychological fulfillment
quotients.’ The economist Paul Samuelson
(1938)
therefore set out to define utility in such a way that it becomes a
purely technical concept. Since Samuelson's re-definition became
standard in the 1950s, when we say that an agent acts so as to
maximize her utility, we mean by ‘utility’ simply whatever
it is that the agent's behavior suggests her to consistently act so as
to make more probable. If this looks circular to you, it should:
theorists who follow Samuelson *intend* the statement
‘agents act so as to maximize their utility’ as a
tautology, where an ‘(economic) agent’ is any entity that
can be accurately described as acting to maximize a utility function,
an ‘action’ is any utility-maximizing selection from a set
of possible alternatives, and a‘utility function’ is what
an economic agent maximizes. Like other tautologies occurring in the
foundations of scientific theories, this interlocking (recursive)
system of definitions is useful not in itself, but because it helps to
fix our contexts of inquiry.

Though we might no longer be moved by scruples derived from
*psychological* behaviorism, many theorists continue to follow
Samuelson's way of understanding utility because they think it
important that game theory apply to *any* kind of agent—a
person, a bear, a bee, a firm or a country—and not just to agents
with human minds. When such theorists say that agents act so as to
maximize their utility, they want this to be part of the
*definition* of what it is to be an agent, not an empirical
claim about possible inner states and motivations. Samuelson's
conception of utility, defined by way of *Revealed Preference
Theory* (RPT) introduced in his classic paper
(Samuelson (1938))
satisfies this demand.

Economists and others who interpret game theory in terms of revealed
preference theory should not think of game theory as in any way an
empirical account of the motivations of some flesh-and-blood actors
(such as actual people). Rather, they should regard game theory as
part of the body of mathematics that is used to model those entities
(which might or might not literally exist) who consistently select
elements from mutually exclusive action sets as if they were trying to
maximize a utility function. On this interpretation, game theory could
not be refuted by any empirical observations, since it is not an
empirical theory in the first place. Of course, observation and
experience could lead someone favoring this interpretation to conclude
that game theory is of little *help* in describing actual human
behavior.

Some other theorists understand the point of game theory
differently. They view game theory as providing an explanatory account
of strategic reasoning. For this idea to be applicable, we must
suppose that agents at least sometimes do what they do in
non-parametric settings *because* game-theoretic logic
recommends certain actions as the ‘rational’ ones. Such an
understanding of game theory incorporates a *normative* aspect,
since ‘rationality’ is taken to denote a property that an
agent should at least generally want to have. These two very general
ways of thinking about the possible uses of game theory are compatible
with the tautological interpretation of utility maximization. The
philosophical difference is not idle from the perspective of the
working game theorist, however. As we will see in a later section,
those who hope to use game theory to explain
strategic *reasoning*, as opposed to merely
strategic *behavior*, face some special philosophical and
practical problems.

Since game theory involves formal reasoning, we must have a device
for thinking of utility maximization in mathematical terms. Such a
device is called a *utility function*. The utility-map for an
agent is called a ‘function’ because it maps *ordered
preferences* onto the real numbers. Suppose that agent *x*
prefers bundle *a* to bundle *b* and bundle *b* to
bundle *c*. We then map these onto a list of numbers, where the
function maps the highest-ranked bundle onto the largest number in the
list, the second-highest-ranked bundle onto the next-largest number in
the list, and so on, thus:

bundlea≫ 3bundle

b≫ 2bundle

c≫ 1

The only property mapped by this function is *order*. The
magnitudes of the numbers are irrelevant; that is, it must not be
inferred that *x* gets 3 times as much utility from bundle
*a* as she gets from bundle *c*. Thus we could represent
*exactly the same* utility function as that above by

bundlea≫ 7,326bundle

b≫ 12.6bundle

c≫ −1,000,000

The numbers featuring in an ordinal utility function are thus not
measuring any *quantity* of anything. A utility-function in
which magnitudes *do* matter is called ‘cardinal’.
Whenever someone refers to a utility function without specifying which
kind is meant, you should assume that it's ordinal. These are the
sorts we'll need for the first set of games we'll examine. Later, when
we come to seeing how to solve games that involve
*randomization*—our river-crossing game from Part 1
above, for example—we'll need to build cardinal utility
functions. The technique for doing this was given by von Neumann & Morgenstern (1944), and was an
essential aspect of their invention of game theory. For the moment,
however, we will need only ordinal functions.

### 2.2 Games and Information

All situations in which at least one agent can only act to maximize
his utility through anticipating (either consciously, or just
implicitly in his behavior) the responses to his actions by one or
more other agents is called a *game*. Agents involved in games
are referred to as *players*. If all agents have optimal
actions regardless of what the others do, as in purely parametric
situations or conditions of monopoly or perfect competition (see
Section 1
above) we can model this without appeal to game theory; otherwise, we
need it.

We assume that players have capacities that are collectively referred to in the literature of economics as ‘rationality’. I have deliberately used this roundabout formulation instead of just saying ‘we assume that players are rational’. This reflects my strong skepticism about the idea that there is one coherent general body of norms, which philosophers could discover through analysis, which captures the intricate web of uses of the family of ideas that ‘rationality’ has represented in the Western cultural tradition. In any event, the economic rationality presupposed in deciding to apply game theory as a modeling tool is a vastly narrower and more specific set of restrictions. An economically rational player is one who can (i) assess outcomes, in the sense of rank-ordering them with respect to their contributions to her welfare; (ii) calculate paths to outcomes, in the sense of seeing which sequences of actions would lead to which outcomes; and (iii) select actions from sets of alternatives (which we'll describe as ‘choosing’ actions) that yield her most-preferred outcomes, given the actions of the other players. We might summarize the intuition behind all this as follows: an entity is usefully modeled as an economically rational agent to the extent that it has alternatives, and chooses from amongst these in a way that is reliably motivated by what seems best for its purposes. (The philosopher Daniel Dennett would say: we can usefully predict its behavior from ‘the intentional stance’.)

Economic rationality might in some cases be satisfied by internal computations performed by an agent, and she might or might not be aware of computing or having computed its conditions and implications. In other cases, economic rationality might simply be embodied in behavioral dispositions built by natural, cultural or market selection. In particular, in calling an action ‘chosen’ we imply no necessary deliberation, conscious or otherwise. We mean merely that the action was taken when an alternative action was available, in some sense of ‘available’ normally established by the context of the particular analysis. (‘Available’, as used by game theorists and economists, should never be read as if it meant ‘metaphysically’ or ‘logically’ available; it is almost always pragmatic, contextual and endlessly revisable by more refined modeling.)

Each player in a game faces a choice among two or more possible
*strategies*. A strategy is a predetermined ‘programme of
play’ that tells her what actions to take in response to
*every possible strategy other players might use*. The
significance of the italicized phrase here will become clear when we
take up some sample games below.

A crucial aspect of the specification of a game involves the
information that players have when they choose strategies. The
simplest games (from the perspective of logical structure) are those
in which agents have *perfect information*, meaning that at
every point where each agent's strategy tells her to take an action,
she knows everything that has happened in the game up to that point. A
board-game of sequential moves in which both players watch
all the action (and know the rules in common), such as chess, is an
instance of such a game. By contrast, the example of the
bridge-crossing game from Section 1 above illustrates a game of
*imperfect information*, since the fugitive must choose a
bridge to cross without knowing the bridge at which the pursuer has
chosen to wait, and the pursuer similarly makes her decision in
ignorance of the choices of her quarry. Since game theory is about
rational action given the strategically significant actions of others,
it should not surprise you to be told that what agents in games believe,
or fail to believe, about each others' actions makes a considerable
difference to the logic of our analyses, as we will see.

### 2.3 Trees and Matrices

The difference between games of perfect and of imperfect information
is closely related to (though certainly not identical with!) a
distinction between *ways of representing* games that is based
on *order of play*. Let us begin by distinguishing between
sequential-move and simultaneous-move games in terms of
information. It is natural, as a first approximation, to think of
sequential-move games as being ones in which players choose their
strategies one after the other, and of simultaneous-move games as ones
in which players choose their strategies at the same time. This isn't
quite right, however, because what is of strategic importance is not
the temporal *order* of events per se, but whether and when
players *know about* other players' actions relative to having
to choose their own. For example, if two competing businesses are both
planning marketing campaigns, one might commit to its strategy months
before the other does; but if neither knows what the other has
committed to or will commit to when they make their decisions, this is
a simultaneous-move game. Chess, by contrast, is normally played as a
sequential-move game: you see what your opponent has done before
choosing your own next action. (Chess *can* be turned into a
simultaneous-move game if the players each call moves on a common
board while isolated from one another; but this is a very different
game from conventional chess.)

It was said above that the distinction between sequential-move and
simultaneous-move games is not identical to the distinction between
perfect-information and imperfect-information games. Explaining why
this is so is a good way of establishing full understanding of both
sets of concepts. As simultaneous-move games were characterized in the
previous paragraph, it must be true that all simultaneous-move games
are games of imperfect information. However, some games may contain
mixes of sequential and simultaneous moves. For example, two firms
might commit to their marketing strategies independently and in
secrecy from one another, but thereafter engage in pricing competition
in full view of one another. If the optimal marketing strategies were
partially or wholly dependent on what was expected to happen in the
subsequent pricing game, then the two stages would need to be analyzed
as a single game, in which a stage of sequential play followed a stage
of simultaneous play. Whole games that involve mixed stages of this
sort are games of imperfect information, however temporally staged
they might be. Games of perfect information (as the name implies)
denote cases where *no* moves are simultaneous (and where no
player ever forgets what has gone before).

It was said above that games of perfect information are the
(logically) simplest sorts of games. This is so because in such games
(as long as the games are finite, that is, terminate after a known
number of actions) players and analysts can use a straightforward
procedure for predicting outcomes. A player in such a game
chooses her first action by considering each series of responses and
counter-responses that will result from each action open to her. She
then asks herself which of the available final outcomes brings her the
highest utility, and chooses the action that starts the chain leading
to this outcome. This process is called *backward induction*
(because the reasoning works backwards from eventual outcomes to
present choice problems).

We will have much more to say about backward induction and its
properties in a later section (when we come to discuss equilibrium and
equilibrium selection). For now, we have described it just in order to
use it to introduce one of the two types of mathematical objects used
to represent games: *game trees*. A game tree is an example of
what mathematicians call a *directed graph*. That is, it is a
set of connected nodes in which the overall graph has a direction. We
can draw trees from the top of the page to the bottom, or from left to
right. In the first case, nodes at the top of the page are interpreted
as coming earlier in the sequence of actions. In the case of a tree
drawn from left to right, leftward nodes are prior in the sequence to
rightward ones. An unlabelled tree has a structure of the
following sort:

Figure 1

The point of representing games using trees can best be grasped by visualizing the use of them in supporting backward-induction reasoning. Just imagine the player (or analyst) beginning at the end of the tree, where outcomes are displayed, and then working backwards from these, looking for sets of strategies that describe paths leading to them. Since a player's utility function indicates which outcomes she prefers to which, we also know which paths she will prefer. Of course, not all paths will be possible because the other player has a role in selecting paths too, and won't take actions that lead to less preferred outcomes for him. We will present some examples of this interactive path selection, and detailed techniques for reasoning through these examples, after we have described a situation we can use a tree to model.

Trees are used to represent *sequential* games, because they
show the order in which actions are taken by the players. However,
games are sometimes represented on *matrices* rather than trees.
This is the second type of mathematical object used to represent games.
Matrices, unlike trees, simply show the outcomes, represented in terms
of the players' utility functions, for every possible combination of
strategies the players might use. For example, it makes sense to
display the river-crossing game from
Section 1
on a matrix, since in that game both the fugitive and the hunter have
just one move each, and each chooses their move in ignorance of what
the other has decided to do. Here, then, is *part of* the
matrix:

Figure 2

The fugitive's three possible strategies—cross at the safe
bridge, risk the rocks, or risk the cobras—form the rows of the
matrix. Similarly, the hunter's three possible
strategies—waiting at the safe bridge, waiting at the rocky
bridge and waiting at the cobra bridge—form the columns of the
matrix. Each cell of the matrix shows—or, rather *would*
show if our matrix was complete—an *outcome* defined in
terms of the players' *payoffs*. A player's payoff is simply
the number assigned by her ordinal utility function to the state of
affairs corresponding to the outcome in question. For each outcome,
Row's payoff is always listed first, followed by Column's. Thus, for
example, the upper left-hand corner above shows that when the fugitive
crosses at the safe bridge and the hunter is waiting there, the
fugitive gets a payoff of 0 and the hunter gets a payoff of 1. We
interpret these by reference to the two players' utility functions, which in this
game are very simple. If the fugitive gets safely across the river he
receives a payoff of 1; if he doesn't he gets 0. If the fugitive
doesn't make it, either because he's shot by the hunter or hit by a
rock or bitten by a cobra, then the hunter gets a payoff of 1 and the
fugitive gets a payoff of 0.

We'll briefly explain the parts of the matrix that have been filled
in, and then say why we can't yet complete the rest. Whenever the
hunter waits at the bridge chosen by the fugitive, the fugitive is
shot. These outcomes all deliver the payoff vector (0, 1). You can find
them descending diagonally across the matrix above from the upper
left-hand corner. Whenever the fugitive chooses the safe bridge but
the hunter waits at another, the fugitive gets safely across, yielding
the payoff vector (1, 0). These two outcomes are shown in the second
two cells of the top row. All of the other cells are marked, *for
now*, with question marks. Why? The problem here is that if the
fugitive crosses at either the rocky bridge or the cobra bridge, he
introduces parametric factors into the game. In these cases, he takes
on some risk of getting killed, and so producing the payoff vector (0,
1), that is independent of anything the hunter does. We don't yet have
enough concepts introduced to be able to show how to represent these
outcomes in terms of utility functions—but by the time we're
finished we will, and this will provide the key to solving our puzzle
from
Section 1.

Matrix games are referred to as ‘normal-form’ or
‘strategic-form’ games, and games as trees are referred to
as ‘extensive-form’ games. The two sorts of games are not
equivalent, because extensive-form games contain
information—about sequences of play and players' levels of
information about the game structure—that strategic-form games
do not. In general, a strategic-form game could represent any one of
several extensive-form games, so a strategic-form game is best thought
of as being a *set* of extensive-form games. When order of play
is irrelevant to a game's outcome, then you should study its strategic
form, since it's the whole set you want to know about. Where order of
play *is* relevant, the extensive form *must* be
specified or your conclusions will be unreliable.

### 2.4 The Prisoner's Dilemma as an Example of Strategic-Form vs. Extensive-Form Representation

The distinctions described above are difficult to fully grasp if all
one has to go on are abstract descriptions. They're best illustrated by
means of an example. For this purpose, we'll use the most famous game:
the Prisoner's Dilemma. It in fact gives the logic of the problem faced
by Cortez's and Henry V's soldiers (see
Section 1 above),
and by Hobbes's agents before they empower the tyrant. However, for
reasons which will become clear a bit later, you should not take the
PD as a *typical* game; it isn't. We use it as an extended
example here only because it's particularly helpful for illustrating
the *relationship* between strategic-form and extensive-form
games (and later, for illustrating the relationships between one-shot
and repeated games; see
Section 4
below).

The name of the Prisoner's Dilemma game is derived from the following
situation typically used to exemplify it. Suppose that the police have
arrested two people whom they know have committed an armed robbery
together. Unfortunately, they lack enough admissible evidence to get a
jury to convict. They *do*, however, have enough evidence to
send each prisoner away for two years for theft of the getaway
car. The chief inspector now makes the following offer to each
prisoner: If you will confess to the robbery, implicating your
partner, and she does not also confess, then you'll go free and she'll
get ten years. If you both confess, you'll each get 5 years. If
neither of you confess, then you'll each get two years for the auto
theft.

Our first step in modeling the two prisoners' situation as a game is to represent it in terms of utility functions. Following the usual convention, let us name the prisoners ‘Player I’ and ‘Player II’. Both Player I's and Player II's utility functions are identical:

Go free ≫ 42 years ≫ 3

5 years ≫ 2

10 years ≫ 0

The numbers in the function above are now used to express each
player's *payoffs* in the various outcomes possible in the
situation. We can represent the problem faced by both of them on a
single matrix that captures the way in which their separate choices
interact; this is the strategic form of their game:

Figure 3

Each cell of the matrix gives the payoffs to both players for each combination of actions. Player I's payoff appears as the first number of each pair, Player II's as the second. So, if both players confess then they each get a payoff of 2 (5 years in prison each). This appears in the upper-left cell. If neither of them confess, they each get a payoff of 3 (2 years in prison each). This appears as the lower-right cell. If Player I confesses and Player II doesn't then Player I gets a payoff of 4 (going free) and Player II gets a payoff of 0 (ten years in prison). This appears in the upper-right cell. The reverse situation, in which Player II confesses and Player I refuses, appears in the lower-left cell.

Each player evaluates his or her two possible actions here by
comparing their personal payoffs in each column, since this shows you
which of their actions is preferable, just to themselves, for each
possible action by their partner. So, observe: If Player II confesses
then Player I gets a payoff of 2 by confessing and a payoff of 0 by
refusing. If Player II refuses, then Player I gets a payoff of 4 by
confessing and a payoff of 3 by refusing. Therefore, Player I is
better off confessing regardless of what Player II does. Player II,
meanwhile, evaluates her actions by comparing her payoffs down each
row, and she comes to exactly the same conclusion that Player I
does. Wherever one action for a player is superior to her other
actions for each possible action by the opponent, we say that the
first action
*strictly dominates* the second one. In the PD, then,
confessing strictly dominates refusing for both players. Both players
know this about each other, thus entirely eliminating any temptation
to depart from the strictly dominated path. Thus both players will
confess, and both will go to prison for 5 years.

The players, and analysts, can predict this outcome using a mechanical
procedure, known as iterated elimination of strictly dominated
strategies. Player 1 can see by examining the matrix that
his payoffs in each cell of the top row are higher than his payoffs
in each corresponding cell of the bottom row. Therefore, it can never
be utility-maximizing for him to play his bottom-row strategy, viz., refusing
to confess, *regardless of what Player II does*. Since
Player I's bottom-row strategy will never be played, we can simply
*delete* the bottom row from the matrix. Now it is obvious that
Player II will not refuse to confess, since her payoff from confessing
in the two cells that remain is higher than her payoff from refusing.
So, once again, we can delete the one-cell column on the right from
the game. We now have only one cell remaining, that corresponding to
the outcome brought about by mutual confession. Since the reasoning
that led us to delete all other possible outcomes depended at each
step only on the premise that both players are economically rational
— that is, will choose strategies that lead to higher payoffs
over strategies that lead to lower ones — there is very strong
grounds for viewing joint confession as the
*solution* to the game, the outcome on which its play
*must* converge to the extent that economic rationality
correctly models the motivations of the players. You should note that
the order in which strictly dominated rows and columns are deleted
doesn't matter. Had we begun by deleting the right-hand column and
then deleted the bottom row, we would have arrived at the same
solution.

It's been said a couple of times that the PD is not a typical game in many respects. One of these respects is that all its rows and columns are either strictly dominated or strictly dominant. In any strategic-form game where this is true, iterated elimination of strictly dominated strategies is guaranteed to yield a unique solution. Later, however, we will see that for many games this condition does not apply, and then our analytic task is less straightforward.

The reader will probably have noticed something disturbing about the outcome
of the PD. Had both players refused to confess, they'd have arrived at the
lower-right outcome in which they each go to prison for only 2 years,
thereby *both* earning higher utility than either receives when both
confess. This is the most important fact about the PD, and its
significance for game theory is quite general. We'll therefore return
to it below when we discuss equilibrium concepts in game theory. For
now, however, let us stay with our use of this particular game to
illustrate the difference between strategic and extensive forms.

When people introduce the PD into popular discussions, one will often hear them say that the police inspector must lock his prisoners into separate rooms so that they can't communicate with one another. The reasoning behind this idea seems obvious: if the players could communicate, they'd surely see that they're each better off if both refuse, and could make an agreement to do so, no? This, one presumes, would remove each player's conviction that he or she must confess because they'll otherwise be sold up the river by their partner. In fact, however, this intuition is misleading and its conclusion is false.

When we represent the PD as a strategic-form game, we implicitly assume that the prisoners can't attempt collusive agreement since they choose their actions simultaneously. In this case, agreement before the fact can't help. If Player I is convinced that his partner will stick to the bargain then he can seize the opportunity to go scot-free by confessing. Of course, he realizes that the same temptation will occur to Player II; but in that case he again wants to make sure he confesses, as this is his only means of avoiding his worst outcome. The prisoners' agreement comes to naught because they have no way of enforcing it; their promises to each other constitute what game theorists call ‘cheap talk’.

But now suppose that the prisoners do *not* move
simultaneously. That is, suppose that Player II can
choose *after* observing Player I's action. This is the sort of
situation that people who think non-communication important must have
in mind. Now Player II will be able to see that Player I has remained
steadfast when it comes to her choice, and she need not be concerned
about being suckered. However, this doesn't change anything, a point
that is best made by re-representing the game in extensive form. This
gives us our opportunity to introduce game-trees and the method of
analysis appropriate to them.

First, however, here are definitions of some concepts that will be helpful in analyzing game-trees:

Node: A point at which a player chooses an action.

Initial node: The point at which the first action in the game occurs.

Terminal node: Any node which, if reached, ends the game. Each terminal node corresponds to anoutcome.

Subgame: Any connected set of nodes and branches descending uniquely from one node.

Payoff: an ordinal utility number assigned to a player at an outcome.

Outcome: an assignment of a set of payoffs, one to each player in the game.

Strategy: a program instructing a player which action to take at every node in the tree where she could possibly be called on to make a choice.

These quick definitions may not mean very much to you until you follow them being put to use in our analyses of trees below. It will probably be best if you scroll back and forth between them and the examples as we work through them. By the time you understand each example, you'll find the concepts and their definitions quite natural and intuitive.

To make this exercise maximally instructive, let's suppose that Players I and II have studied the matrix above and, seeing that they're both better off in the outcome represented by the lower-right cell, have formed an agreement to cooperate. Player I is to commit to refusal first, after which Player II will reciprocate when the police ask for her choice. We will refer to a strategy of keeping the agreement as ‘cooperation’, and will denote it in the tree below with ‘C’. We will refer to a strategy of breaking the agreement as ‘defection’, and will denote it on the tree below with ‘D’. Each node is numbered 1, 2, 3, … , from top to bottom, for ease of reference in discussion. Here, then, is the tree:

Figure 4

Look first at each of the terminal nodes (those along the bottom).
These represent possible outcomes. Each is identified with an
assignment of payoffs, just as in the strategic-form game, with Player I's
payoff appearing first in each set and Player II's appearing second. Each of
the structures descending from the nodes 1, 2 and 3 respectively is a
subgame. We begin our backward-induction analysis—using a
technique called *Zermelo's algorithm*—with the sub-games
that arise last in the sequence of play. If the subgame descending
from node 3 is played, then Player II will face a choice between a
payoff of 4 and a payoff of 3. (Consult the second number,
representing her payoff, in each set at a terminal node descending
from node 3.) II earns her higher payoff by playing D. We may
therefore replace the entire subgame with an assignment of the payoff
(0,4) directly to node 3, since this is the outcome that will be
realized if the game reaches that node. Now consider the subgame
descending from node 2. Here, II faces a choice between a payoff of 2
and one of 0. She obtains her higher payoff, 2, by playing D. We may
therefore assign the payoff (2,2) directly to node 2. Now we move to
the subgame descending from node 1. (This subgame is, of course,
identical to the whole game; all games are subgames of themselves.)
Player I now faces a choice between outcomes (2,2) and
(0,4). Consulting the first numbers in each of these sets, he sees
that he gets his higher payoff—2—by playing D. D is, of
course, the option of confessing. So Player I confesses, and then Player II
also confesses, yielding the same outcome as in the
strategic-form representation.

What has happened here intuitively is that Player I realizes that if he plays C (refuse to confess) at node 1, then Player II will be able to maximize her utility by suckering him and playing D. (On the tree, this happens at node 3.) This leaves Player I with a payoff of 0 (ten years in prison), which he can avoid only by playing D to begin with. He therefore defects from the agreement.

We have thus seen that in the case of the Prisoner's Dilemma, the simultaneous and sequential versions yield the same outcome. This will often not be true of other games, however. Furthermore, only finite extensive-form (sequential) games of perfect information — can be solved using Zermelo's algorithm.

As noted earlier in this section, sometimes we must represent
simultaneous moves *within* games that are otherwise sequential.
(In all such cases the game as a whole will be one of
imperfect information, so we won't be able to solve it using Zermelo's
algorithm.) We represent such games using the device of *information
sets*. Consider the following tree:

Figure 5

The oval drawn around nodes *b* and *c* indicates that
they lie within a common information set. This means that at these
nodes players cannot infer back up the path from whence they came; Player II
does not know, in choosing her strategy, whether she is at *b*
or *c*. (For this reason, what properly bear numbers in
extensive-form games are information sets, conceived as ‘action
points’, rather than nodes themselves; this is why the nodes
inside the oval are labelled with letters rather than numbers.) Put
another way, Player II, when choosing, does not know what Player I has done at node
*a*. But you will recall from earlier in this section that this
is just what defines two moves as simultaneous. We can thus see that
the method of representing games as trees is entirely general. If no
node after the initial node is alone in an information set on its
tree, so that the game has only one subgame (itself), then the whole
game is one of simultaneous play. If at least one node shares its
information set with another, while others are alone, the game
involves both simultaneous and sequential play, and so is still a game
of imperfect information. Only if all information sets are inhabited
by just one node do we have a game of perfect information.

### 2.5 Solution Concepts and Equilibria

In the Prisoner's Dilemma, the outcome we've represented as (2,2),
indicating mutual defection, was said to be the ‘solution’
to the game. Following the general practice in economics, game
theorists refer to the solutions of games as *equilibria.*
Philosophically minded readers will want to pose a conceptual question
right here: What is ‘equilibrated’ about some game
outcomes such that we are motivated to call them
‘solutions’? When we say that a physical system is in
equilibrium, we mean that it is in a *stable* state, one in
which all the causal forces internal to the system balance each other
out and so leave it ‘at rest’ until and unless it is
perturbed by the intervention of some exogenous (that is,
‘external’) force. This is what economists have
traditionally meant in talking about ‘equilibria’; they
read economic systems as being networks of mutually constraining
(often causal) relations, just like physical systems, and the
equilibria of such systems are then their endogenously stable
states. As we will see in later sections, it is possible to maintain
this understanding of equilibria in the case of game theory. However,
as we noted in Section 2.1, some people interpret game theory as being
an explanatory theory of strategic reasoning. For them, a solution to
a game must be an outcome that a rational agent would
predict *using the mechanisms of rational computation
alone*. Such theorists face some puzzles about solution concepts
that are less important to the theorist who isn't trying to use game
theory to under-write a general analysis of rationality. The interest
of philosophers in game theory is more often motivated by this
ambition than is that of the economist or other scientist.

It's useful to start the discussion here from the case of the
Prisoner's Dilemma because it's unusually simple from the perspective
of the puzzles about solution concepts. What we referred to as its
‘solution’ is the unique *Nash equilibrium* of the
game. (The ‘Nash’ here refers to John Nash, the Nobel
Laureate mathematician who in
Nash (1950)
did most to extend and generalize von Neumann & Morgenstern's
pioneering work.) Nash equilibrium (henceforth ‘NE’)
applies (or fails to apply, as the case may be) to whole *sets*
of strategies, one for each player in a game. A set of strategies is a
NE just in case no player could improve her payoff, given the
strategies of all other players in the game, by changing her
strategy. Notice how closely this idea is related to the idea of
strict dominance: no strategy could be a NE strategy if it is strictly
dominated. Therefore, if iterative elimination of strictly dominated
strategies takes us to a unique outcome, we know that the vector of
strategies that leads to it is the game's unique NE. Now, almost all
theorists agree that avoidance of strictly dominated strategies is
a *minimum* requirement of economic rationality. A player who
knowingly chooses a strictly dominated strategy directly violates
clause (iii) of the definition of economic agency as given
in Section 2.2. This implies that *if* a
game has an outcome that is a unique NE, as in the case of joint
confession in the PD, that must be its unique solution. This is one of
the most important respects in which the PD is an ‘easy’
(and atypical) game.

We can specify one class of games in which NE is always not only
necessary but *sufficient* as a solution concept. These are
finite perfect-information games that are also *zero-sum*. A
zero-sum game (in the case of a game involving just two players) is
one in which one player can only be made better off by making the
other player worse off. (Tic-tac-toe is a simple example of such a
game: any move that brings me closer to winning brings you closer to
losing, and vice-versa.) We can determine whether a game is zero-sum
by examining players' utility functions: in zero-sum games these will
be mirror-images of each other, with one player's highly ranked
outcomes being low-ranked for the other and vice-versa. In such a
game, if I am playing a strategy such that, given your strategy, I
can't do any better, and if you are *also* playing such a
strategy, then, since any change of strategy by me would have to make
you worse off and vice-versa, it follows that our game can have no
solution compatible with our mutual rationality other than its unique
NE. We can put this another way: in a zero-sum game, my playing a
strategy that maximizes my minimum payoff if you play the best you
can, and your simultaneously doing the same thing, is just
*equivalent* to our both playing our best strategies, so this
pair of so-called ‘maximin’ procedures is guaranteed to
find the unique solution to the game, which is its unique NE. (In
tic-tac-toe, this is a draw. You can't do any better than drawing, and
neither can I, if both of us are trying to win and trying not to
lose.)

However, most games do not have this property. It won't be possible,
in this one article, to enumerate *all* of the ways in which
games can be problematic from the perspective of their possible
solutions. (For one thing, it is highly unlikely that theorists have
yet discovered all of the possible problems.) However, we can try to
generalize the issues a bit.

First, there is the problem that in most non-zero-sum games, there is more than one NE, but not all NE look equally plausible as the solutions upon which strategically rational players would hit. Consider the strategic-form game below (taken from Kreps (1990), p. 403):

Figure 6

This game has two NE: s1-t1 and s2-t2. (Note that no rows or columns
are strictly dominated here. But if Player I is playing s1 then Player
II can do no better than t1, and vice-versa; and similarly for the
s2-t2 pair.) If NE is our only solution concept, then we shall be
forced to say that either of these outcomes is equally persuasive as a
solution. However, if game theory is regarded as an explanatory and/or
normative theory of strategic reasoning, this seems to be leaving
something out: surely rational players with perfect information would
converge on s1-t1? (Note that this is *not* like the situation
in the PD, where the socially superior situation is unachievable
because it is not a NE. In the case of the game above, both players
have every reason to try to converge on the NE in which they are
better off.)

This illustrates the fact that NE is a relatively (logically)
*weak* solution concept, often failing to predict intuitively
sensible solutions because, if applied alone, it refuses to allow
players to use principles of equilibrium selection that, if not
*demanded* by economic rationality, at least seem both sensible
and computationally accessible. Consider another example from
Kreps (1990),
p. 397:

Figure 7

Here, no strategy strictly dominates another. However, Player I's top
row, s1, *weakly* dominates s2, since I does *at least as
well* using s1 as s2 for any reply by Player II, and on one reply
by II (t2), I does better. So should not the players (and the analyst)
delete the weakly dominated row s2? When they do so, column t1 is then
strictly dominated, and the NE s1-t2 is selected as the unique
solution. However, as Kreps goes on to show using this example, the
idea that weakly dominated strategies should be deleted just like
strict ones has odd consequences.
Suppose
we change the payoffs of the game just a bit, as follows:

Figure 8

s2 is still weakly dominated as before; but of our two NE, s2-t1 is
now the most attractive for both players; so why should the analyst
eliminate its possibility? (Note that this game, again, does
*not* replicate the logic of the PD. There, it makes sense to
eliminate the most attractive outcome, joint refusal to confess,
because both players have incentives to unilaterally deviate from it,
so it is not an NE. This is not true of s2-t1 in the present game. You
should be starting to clearly see why we called the PD game
‘atypical’.) The argument *for* eliminating weakly
dominated strategies is that Player 1 may be nervous, fearing that
Player II is not completely *sure* to be rational (or that
Player II fears that Player I isn't completely rational, or that
Player II fears that Player I fears that Player II isn't completely
rational, and so on ad infinitum) and so might play t2 with some
positive probability. If the possibility of departures from
rationality is taken seriously, then we have an argument for
eliminating weakly dominated strategies: Player I thereby insures
herself against her worst outcome, s2-t2. Of course, she pays a cost
for this insurance, reducing her expected payoff from 10 to 5. On the
other hand, we might imagine that the players could communicate before
playing the game and agree to play *correlated strategies* so as
to *coordinate* on s2-t1, thereby removing some, most or all of
the uncertainty that encourages elimination of the weakly dominated
row s1, and eliminating s1-t2 as a viable solution instead!

Any proposed principle for solving games that may have the effect of
eliminating one or more NE from consideration as solutions is referred to as a
*refinement* of NE. In the case just discussed, elimination of
weakly dominated strategies is one possible refinement, since it
refines away the NE s2-t1, and correlation is another, since it
refines away the other NE, s1-t2, instead. So which refinement is more
appropriate as a solution concept? People who think of game theory as
an explanatory and/or normative theory of strategic rationality have
generated a substantial literature in which the merits and drawbacks
of a large number of refinements are debated. In principle, there
seems to be no limit on the number of refinements that could be
considered, since there may also be no limits on the set of
philosophical intuitions about what principles a rational agent might
or might not see fit to follow or to fear or hope that other players
are following.

We now digress briefly to make a point about terminology. In previous
editions of the present article, we referred to theorists who adopt
the revealed preference interpretation of the utility functions in
game theory as ‘behaviorists’. This reflected the fact the
revealed preference approaches equate choices with economically
consistent actions, rather than intending to refer to mental
constructs. However, this usage is likely to cause confusion due to
the recent rise of *behavioral game theory*
(Camerer 2003). This program of research aims to
directly incorporate into game-theoretic models generalizations,
derived mainly from experiments with people, about ways in which
people differ from economic agents in the inferences they draw from
information (‘framing’). Applications also typically
incorporate special assumptions about utility functions, also derived
from experiments. For example, players may be taken to be willing to
make trade-offs between the magnitudes of their own payoffs and
inequalities in the distribution of payoffs among the players. We will
turn to some discussion of behavioral game theory
in Section 7.1, Section 7.2
and Section 7.3. For the moment, note that this
use of game theory crucially rests on assumptions about psychological
representations of value thought to be common among people. Thus it
would be misleading to refer to behavioral game theory as
‘behaviorist’. But then it just would invite confusion to
continue referring to conventional economic game theory that relies on
revealed preference as ‘behaviorist’ game theory. We will
therefore switch to calling it ‘non-psychological’ game
theory. We mean by this the kind of game theory used by most
economists who are not behavioral economists. They treat game theory
as the abstract mathematics of strategic interaction, rather than as
an attempt to directly characterize special psychological dispositions
that might be typical in humans.

Non-psychological game theorists tend to take a dim view of much of
the refinement program. This is for the obvious reason that it relies
on intuitions about inferences that people *should* find
sensible. Like most scientists, non-psychological game theorists are
suspicious of the force and basis of philosophical assumptions as
guides to empirical modeling.

Behavioral game theory, by contrast, can be understood as a refinement
of game theory, though not necessarily its solution concepts, in a
different sense. It restricts the theory's underlying axioms for
application to a special class of agents, individual, psychologically
typical humans. It motivates this restriction by reference to
inferences, along with preferences, that people *do*
find *natural*, regardless of whether these
seem *rational*, which they frequently do
not. Non-psychological and behavioral game theory have in common that
neither is intended to be normative — though both are often used to
try to *describe* norms that prevail in groups of players, as
well to *explain* why norms might persist in groups of players
even when they appear to be less than fully rational to philosophical
intuitions. Both see the job of *applied* game theory as being
to predict outcomes of empirical games *given* some
distribution of strategic dispositions, and some distribution of
expectations about the strategic dispositions of others, that are
shaped by dynamics in players' environments, including institutional
pressures and structures and evolutionary selection. Let us therefore
group non-psychological and behavioral game theorists together, just
for purposes of contrast with normative game theorists,
as *descriptive* game theorists.

Descriptive game theorists are often inclined to doubt that the goal
of seeking a
*general* theory of rationality makes sense as a
project. Institutions and evolutionary processes build many
environments, and what counts as rational procedure in one environment
may not be favoured in another. On the other hand, an entity that is
not rational in the minimal sense of economic rationality cannot,
except by accident, be accurately characterized as aiming to maximize
a utility function. To such entities game theory has no application in
the first place.

This does not imply that non-psychological game theorists abjure all principled ways of restricting sets of NE to subsets based on their relative probabilities of arising. In particular, non-psychological game theorists tend to be sympathetic to approaches that shift emphasis from rationality itself onto considerations of the informational dynamics of games. We should perhaps not be surprised that NE analysis alone often fails to tell us much of applied, empirical interest about strategic-form games (e.g., Figure 6 above), in which informational structure is suppressed. Equilibrium selection issues are often more fruitfully addressed in the context of extensive-form games.

### 2.6 Subgame Perfection

In order to deepen our understanding of extensive-form games, we need an example with more interesting structure than the PD offers.

Consider the game described by this tree:

Figure 9

This game is not intended to fit any preconceived situation; it is simply a mathematical object in search of an application. (L and R here just denote ‘left’ and ‘right’ respectively.)

Now consider the strategic form of this game:

Figure 10

If you are confused by this, remember that a strategy must tell a
player what to do at *every* information set where that player
has an action. Since each player chooses between two actions at each
of two information sets here, each player has four strategies in
total. The first letter in each strategy designation tells each
player what to do if he or she reaches their first information set,
the second what to do if their second information set is
reached. I.e., LR for Player II tells II to play L if information set
5 is reached and R if information set 6 is reached.

If you examine the matrix in Figure 10, you will discover that (LL,
RL) is among the NE. This is a bit puzzling, since if Player I reaches
her second information set (7) in the extensive-form game, she would
hardly wish to play L there; she earns a higher payoff by playing R at
node 7. Mere NE analysis doesn't notice this because NE is insensitive
to what happens *off the path of play*. Player I, in choosing L
at node 4, ensures that node 7 will not be reached; this is what is
meant by saying that it is ‘off the path of play’. In
analyzing extensive-form games, however, we *should* care what
happens off the path of play, because consideration of this is crucial
to what happens
*on* the path. For example, it is the fact that Player I
*would* play R if node 7 were reached that *would* cause
Player II to play L if node 6 were reached, and this is why Player I
won't choose R at node 4. We are throwing away information relevant to
game solutions if we ignore off-path outcomes, as mere NE analysis
does. Notice that this reason for doubting that NE is a wholly
satisfactory equilibrium concept in itself has nothing to do with
intuitions about rationality, as in the case of the refinement
concepts discussed in Section 2.5.

Now apply Zermelo's algorithm to the extensive form of our current example. Begin, again, with the last subgame, that descending from node 7. This is Player I's move, and she would choose R because she prefers her payoff of 5 to the payoff of 4 she gets by playing L. Therefore, we assign the payoff (5, −1) to node 7. Thus at node 6 II faces a choice between (−1, 0) and (5, −1). He chooses L. At node 5 II chooses R. At node 4 I is thus choosing between (0, 5) and (−1, 0), and so plays L. Note that, as in the PD, an outcome appears at a terminal node—(4, 5) from node 7—that is Pareto superior to the NE. Again, however, the dynamics of the game prevent it from being reached.

The fact that Zermelo's algorithm picks out the strategy vector (LR,
RL) as the unique solution to the game shows that it's yielding
something other than just an NE. In fact, it is generating the game's
*subgame perfect equilibrium* (SPE). It gives an outcome that
yields a NE not just in the *whole* game but in every subgame
as well. This is a persuasive solution concept because, again unlike
the refinements of Section 2.5, it does not demand ‘extra’
rationality of agents in the sense of expecting them to have and use
philosophical intuitions about ‘what makes sense’. It
does, however, assume that players not only know everything
strategically relevant to their situation but also *use* all of
that information. In arguments about the foundations of economics,
this is often referred to as an aspect of rationality (as in the
phrase ‘rational expectations’. It is helpful to be
careful not to confuse rationality in general with computational power
and the possession of budgets, in time and energy, to make the most of
it.

An agent playing a subgame perfect strategy simply chooses, at every
node she reaches, the path that brings her the highest payoff *in
the subgame emanating from that node*. SPE predicts a game's
outcome just in case, in solving the game, the players foresee that
they will all do that.

A main value of analyzing extensive-form games for SPE is that this
can help us to locate structural barriers to social optimization. In
our current example, Player I would be better off, and Player II no
worse off, at the left-hand node emanating from node 7 than at the SPE
outcome. But Player I's basic economic rationality, and Player II's
awareness of this, blocks the socially efficient outcome. If our
players wish to bring about the more socially efficient outcome (4,5)
here, they must do so by redesigning their institutions so as to
change the structure of the game. The enterprise of changing
institutional and informational structures so as to make efficient
outcomes more likely in the games that agents (that is, people,
corporations, governments, etc.) actually play is known
as *mechanism design*, and is one of the leading areas of
application of game theory. The main techniques are reviewed
in Hurwicz and Reiter (2006), the first author of
which was awarded the Nobel Prize for his pioneering work in the
area.

### 2.7 On Interpreting Payoffs: Morality and Efficiency in Games

Many readers, but especially philosophers, might wonder why, in the
case of the example taken up in the previous section, mechanism design
should be necessary unless players are morbidly selfish
sociopaths. Surely, the players might be able to just *see*
that outcome (4,5) is socially and morally superior; and since the
whole problem also takes for granted that they can also see the path
of actions that leads to this efficient outcome, who is the game
theorist to announce that, unless their game is changed, it's
unattainable? This objection, which applies the distinctive idea of
rationality urged by Immanuel Kant, indicates the leading way in which
many philosophers mean more by ‘rationality’ than
descriptive game theorists do. This theme is explored with great
liveliness and polemical force in Binmore (1994,
1998).

This weighty philosophical controversy about rationality is sometimes confused by misinterpretation of the meaning of ‘utility’ in non-psychological game theory. To root out this mistake, consider the Prisoner's Dilemma again. We have seen that in the unique NE of the PD, both players get less utility than they could have through mutual cooperation. This may strike you, even if you are not a Kantian (as it has struck many commentators) as perverse. Surely, you may think, it simply results from a combination of selfishness and paranoia on the part of the players. To begin with they have no regard for the social good, and then they shoot themselves in the feet by being too untrustworthy to respect agreements.

This way of thinking is very common in popular discussions, and badly
mixed up. To dispel its influence, let us first introduce some
terminology for talking about outcomes. Welfare economists typically
measure social good in terms of *Pareto efficiency*. A
distribution of utility β is said to be *Pareto superior*
over another distribution δ just in case from state δ
there is a possible redistribution of utility to β such that at
least one player is better off in β than in δ and no player
is worse off. Failure to move from a Pareto-inferior to a
Pareto-superior distribution is
*inefficient* because the existence of β as a possibility,
at least in principle, shows that in δ some utility is being
wasted. Now, the outcome (3,3) that represents mutual cooperation in
our model of the PD is clearly Pareto superior over mutual defection;
at (3,3)
*both* players are better off than at (2,2). So it is true that
PDs lead to inefficient outcomes. This was true of our example in
Section 2.6 as well.

However, inefficiency should not be associated with immorality. A
utility function for a player is supposed to represent *everything
that player cares about*, which may be anything at all. As we have
described the situation of our prisoners they do indeed care only about
their own relative prison sentences, but there is nothing essential in
this. What makes a game an instance of the PD is strictly and only its
payoff structure. Thus we could have two Mother Theresa types here,
both of whom care little for themselves and wish only to feed starving
children. But suppose the original Mother Theresa wishes to feed the
children of Calcutta while Mother Juanita wishes to feed the children
of Bogota. And suppose that the international aid agency will maximize
its donation if the two saints nominate the same city, will give the
second-highest amount if they nominate each others' cities, and the
lowest amount if they each nominate their own city. Our saints are in a
PD here, though hardly selfish or unconcerned with the social good.

To return to our prisoners, suppose that, contrary to our assumptions,
they *do* value each other's well-being as well as their
own. In that case, this must be reflected in their utility functions,
and hence in their payoffs. If their payoff structures are changed so
that, for example, they would feel so badly about contributing to
inefficiency that they'd rather spend extra years in prison than
endure the shame, then they will no longer be in a PD. But all this
shows is that not every possible situation is a PD; it
does *not* show that selfishness is among the assumptions of
game theory. It is the *logic* of the prisoners' situation, not
their psychology, that traps them in the inefficient outcome, and if
that really *is* their situation then they are stuck in it
(barring further complications to be discussed below). Agents who wish
to avoid inefficient outcomes are best advised to prevent certain
games from arising; the defender of the possibility of Kantian
rationality is really proposing that they try to dig themselves out of
such games by turning themselves into different kinds of agents.

In general, then, a game is partly *defined* by the payoffs
assigned to the players. In any application, such assignments should
be based on sound empirical evidence. If a proposed solution involves
tacitly changing these payoffs, then this ‘solution’ is in
fact a disguised way of changing the subject and evading the
implications of best modeling practice.

### 2.8 Trembling Hands

Our last point above opens the way to a philosophical puzzle, one of several that still preoccupy those concerned with the logical foundations of game theory. It can be raised with respect to any number of examples, but we will borrow an elegant one from C. Bicchieri (1993). Consider the following game:

Figure 11

The NE outcome here is at the single leftmost node descending from
node 8. To see this, backward induct again. At node 10, I would play L
for a payoff of 3, giving II a payoff of 1. II can do better than this
by playing L at node 9, giving I a payoff of 0. I can do better than
this by playing L at node 8; so that is what I does, and the game
terminates without II getting to move. A puzzle is then raised by
Bicchieri (along with other authors,
including Binmore (1987)
and Pettit and Sugden (1989)) by way of the
following reasoning. Player I plays L at node 8 because she knows that
Player II is economically rational, and so would, at node 9, play L
because Player II knows that Player I is economically rational and so
would, at node 10, play L. But now we have the following paradox:
Player I must suppose that Player II, at node 9, would predict Player
I's economically rational play at node 10 despite having arrived at a
node (9) that could only be reached if Player I is not economically
rational! If Player I is not economically rational then Player II is
not justified in predicting that Player I will not play R at node 10,
in which case it is not clear that Player II shouldn't play R at 9;
and if Player II plays R at 9, then Player I is guaranteed of a better
payoff then she gets if she plays L at node 8. Both players use
backward induction to solve the game; backward induction requires that
Player I know that Player II knows that Player I is economically
rational; but Player II can solve the game only by using a backward
induction argument that takes as a premise the economic irrationality
of Player I. This is the *paradox of backward induction*.

A standard way around this paradox in the literature is to invoke the so-called ‘trembling hand’ due to Selten (1975). The idea here is that a decision and its consequent act may ‘come apart’ with some nonzero probability, however small. That is, a player might intend to take an action but then slip up in the execution and send the game down some other path instead. If there is even a remote possibility that a player may make a mistake—that her ‘hand may tremble’—then no contradiction is introduced by a player's using a backward induction argument that requires the hypothetical assumption that another player has taken a path that an economically rational player could not choose. In our example, Player II could reason about what to do at node 9 conditional on the assumption that Player I chose L at node 8 but then slipped.

Gintis (2009) points out that the apparent
paradox does not arise merely from our supposing that both players are
economically rational. It rests crucially on the additional premise
that each player must know, and reasons on the basis of knowing, that
the other player is economically rational. This is the premise with
which each player's conjectures about what would happen off the
equilibrium path of play are inconsistent. A player has reason to
consider out-of-equilibrium possibilities if she either believes that
her opponent is rational but his hand may tremble *or* she
attaches some nonzero probability to the possibility that he is not
economically rational *or* she attaches some doubt to her
conjecture about his utility function. As Gintis also stresses, this
issue with solving extensive-form games games for SEP by Zermelo's
algorithm generalizes: a player has no reason to play even
a *Nash* equilibrium strategy unless she expects other players
to also play Nash equilibrium strategies. We will return to this issue
in Section 6 below.

The paradox of backward induction, like the puzzles raised by
equilibrium refinement, is mainly a problem for those who view game
theory as contributing to a normative theory of rationality
(specifically, as contributing to that larger theory the theory of
*strategic* rationality). The non-psychological game theorist
can give a different sort of account of apparently “irrational” play
and the prudence it encourages. This involves appeal to the empirical
fact that actual agents, including people, must *learn* the
equilibrium strategies of games they play, at least whenever the games
are at all complicated. Research shows that even a game as simple as
the Prisoner's Dilemma requires learning by people
(Ledyard 1995,
Sally 1995,
Camerer 2003,
p. 265). What it means to say that people must learn equilibrium
strategies is that we must be a bit more sophisticated than was
indicated earlier in constructing utility functions from behavior in
application of Revealed Preference Theory. Instead of constructing
utility functions on the basis of single episodes, we must do so on
the basis of observed runs of behavior *once it has
stabilized*, signifying maturity of learning for the subjects in
question and the game in question. Once again, the Prisoner's Dilemma
makes a good example. People encounter few one-shot Prisoner's
Dilemmas in everyday life, but they encounter many *repeated*
PD's with non-strangers. As a result, when set into what is intended to
be a one-shot PD in the experimental laboratory, people tend to
initially play as if the game were a single round of a repeated
PD. The repeated PD has many Nash equilibria that involve cooperation
rather than defection. Thus experimental subjects tend to cooperate at
first in these circumstances, but learn after some number of rounds to
defect. The experimenter cannot infer that she has successfully
induced a one-shot PD with her experimental setup until she sees this
behavior stabilize.

If players of games realize that other players may need to learn game
structures and equilibria from experience, this gives them reason to
take account of what happens off the equilibrium paths of
extensive-form games. Of course, if a player fears that other players
have not learned equilibrium, this may well remove her incentive to
play an equilibrium strategy herself. This raises a set of deep
problems about social learning
(Fudenberg and Levine 1998.
How do ignorant players learn to play equilibria if
sophisticated players don't show them, because the sophisticated are
incentivized to play equilibrium strategies until the ignorant have
learned? The crucial answer in the case of applications of game theory
to interactions among people is that young people
are *socialized* by growing up in networks
of *institutions*, including *cultural norms*. Most
complex games that people play are already in progress among people
who were socialized before them—that is, have learned game
structures and equilibria (Ross 2008. Novices
must then only copy those whose play appears to be expected and
understood by others. Institutions and norms are rich with reminders,
including homilies and easily remembered rules of thumb, to help
people remember what they are doing (Clark
1997).

As noted in
Section 2.7 above, when observed behavior
does *not* stabilize around equilibria in a game, and there is
no evidence that learning is still in process, the analyst should
infer that she has incorrectly modeled the situation she is
studying. Chances are that she has either mis-specified players'
utility functions, the strategies available to the players, or the
information that is available to them. Given the complexity of many of
the situations that social scientists study, we should not be
surprised that mis-specification of models happens frequently. Applied
game theorists must do lots of learning, just like their subjects.

Thus the paradox of backward induction is only apparent. Unless players have experienced play at equilibrium with one another in the past, even if they are all economically rational and all believe this about one another, we should predict that they will attach some positive probability to the conjecture that understanding of game structures among some players is imperfect. This then explains why economically rational agents may often play as if they believe in trembling hands.

Learning of equilibria may take various forms for different agents and for games of differing levels of complexity and risk. Incorporating it into game-theoretic models of interactions thus introduces an extensive new set of technicalities. For the most fully developed general theory, the reader is referred to Fudenberg and Levine (1998).

## 3. Uncertainty, Risk and Sequential Equilibria

The games we've modeled to this point have all involved players
choosing from amongst *pure strategies*, in which each seeks a
single optimal course of action at each node that constitutes a best
reply to the actions of others. Often, however, a player's utility is
optimized through use of a *mixed* strategy, in which she flips
a weighted coin amongst several possible actions. (We will see later
that there is an alternative interpretation of mixing, not involving
randomization at a particular information set; but we will start here
from the coin-flipping interpretation and then build on it in
Section 3.1.)
Mixing is called for whenever no pure strategy maximizes the player's
utility against all opponent strategies. Our river-crossing game from
Section 1
exemplifies this. As we saw, the puzzle in that game consists in the
fact that if the fugitive's reasoning selects a particular bridge as
optimal, his pursuer must be assumed to be able to duplicate that
reasoning. The fugitive can escape only if his pursuer cannot
reliably predict which bridge he'll use. Symmetry of logical reasoning
power on the part of the two players ensures that the fugitive can
surprise the pursuer only if it is possible for him to surprise
*himself*.

Suppose that we ignore rocks and cobras for a moment, and imagine that
the bridges are equally safe. Suppose also that the fugitive has no
special knowledge about his pursuer that might lead him to venture a
specially conjectured probability distribution over the pursuer's
available strategies. In this case, the fugitive's best course is to
roll a three-sided die, in which each side represents a different
bridge (or, more conventionally, a six-sided die in which each bridge
is represented by two sides). He must then pre-commit himself to using
whichever bridge is selected by this *randomizing device*. This
fixes the odds of his survival regardless of what the pursuer does;
but since the pursuer has no reason to prefer any available pure or
mixed strategy, and since in any case we are presuming her epistemic
situation to be symmetrical to that of the fugitive, we may suppose
that she will roll a three-sided die of her own. The fugitive now has
a 2/3 probability of escaping and the pursuer a 1/3 probability of
catching him. Neither the fugitive nor the pursuer can improve their
chances given the other's randomizing mix, so the two randomizing
strategies are in Nash equilibrium. Note that if *one* player
is randomizing then the other does equally well on *any* mix of
probabilities over bridges, so there are infinitely many combinations of best replies. However,
each player should worry that anything other than a random strategy
might be coordinated with some factor the other player can detect and
exploit. Since any non-random strategy is exploitable by another non-random strategy, in a zero-sum game such as our example, only the vector of randomized strategies is a NE.

Now let us re-introduce the parametric factors, that is, the falling
rocks at bridge #2 and the cobras at bridge #3. Again, suppose that
the fugitive is sure to get safely across bridge #1, has a 90% chance
of crossing bridge #2, and an 80% chance of crossing bridge #3. We can
solve this new game if we make certain assumptions about the two
players' utility functions. Suppose that Player 1, the fugitive, cares
only about living or dying (preferring life to death) while the
pursuer simply wishes to be able to report that the fugitive is dead,
preferring this to having to report that he got away. (In other words,
neither player cares about *how* the fugitive lives or dies.)
In this case, the fugitive simply takes his original randomizing
formula and weights it according to the different levels of parametric
danger at the three bridges. Each bridge should be thought of as a
*lottery* over the fugitive's possible outcomes, in which each
lottery has a different *expected payoff* in terms of the items
in his utility function.

Consider matters from the pursuer's point of view. She will be using her prudent NE strategy when she chooses the mix of probabilities over the three bridges that makes the fugitive indifferent among his possible pure strategies. The bridge with rocks is 1.1 times more dangerous for him than the safe bridge. Therefore, he will be indifferent between the two when the pursuer is 1.1 times more likely to be waiting at the safe bridge than the rocky bridge. The cobra bridge is 1.2 times more dangerous for the fugitive than the safe bridge. Therefore, he will be indifferent between these two bridges when the pursuer's probability of waiting at the safe bridge is 1.2 times higher than the probability that she is at the cobra bridge. Suppose we use s1, s2 and s3 to represent the fugitive's parametric survival rates at each bridge. Then the pursuer minimizes the net survival rate across any pair of bridges by adjusting the probabilities p1 and p2 that she will wait at them so that

s1 (1 − p1) = s2 (1 − p2)

Since p1 + p2 = 1, we can rewrite this as

s1 × p2 = s2 × p1

so

p1/s1 = p2/s2.

Thus the pursuer finds her prudent NE strategy by solving the following simultaneous equations:

1 (1 − p1) = 0.9 (1 − p2) = 0.8 (1 − p3) p1 + p2 + p3 = 1.

Then

p1 = 49/121 p2 = 41/121 p3 = 31/121

Now let f1, f2, f3 represent the probabilities with which the fugitive chooses each respective bridge. Then the fugitive finds his prudent NE strategy by solving

s1 × f1 = s2 × f2 = s3 × f3

so

1 × f1 = 0.9 × f2 = 0.8 × f3

simultaneously with

f1 + f2 + f3 = 1.

Then

f1 = 36/121 f2 = 40/121 f3 = 45/121

These two sets of NE probabilities tell each player how to weight his
or her die before throwing it. Note the — perhaps surprising
— result that the fugitive uses riskier bridges with * higher
* probability. This is the only way of making the pursuer
indifferent over which bridge she stakes out, which in turn is what
maximizes the fugitive's probability of survival.

We were able to solve this game straightforwardly because we set the
utility functions in such a way as to make it *zero-sum*, or
*strictly competitive*. That is, every gain in expected utility
by one player represents a precisely symmetrical loss by the other.
However, this condition may often not hold. Suppose now that the
utility functions are more complicated. The pursuer most prefers an
outcome in which she shoots the fugitive and so claims credit for his
apprehension to one in which he dies of rockfall or snakebite; and she
prefers this second outcome to his escape. The fugitive prefers a
quick death by gunshot to the pain of being crushed or the terror of
an encounter with a cobra. Most of all, of course, he prefers to
escape. We cannot solve this game, as before, simply on the basis of
knowing the players' ordinal utility functions, since the
*intensities* of their respective preferences will now be
relevant to their strategies.

Prior to the work of
von Neumann & Morgenstern (1947),
situations of this sort were inherently baffling to analysts. This is
because utility does not denote a hidden psychological variable such
as *pleasure*. As we discussed in
Section 2.1,
utility is merely a measure of relative behavioural dispositions
given certain consistency assumptions about relations between
preferences and choices. It therefore makes no sense to imagine
comparing our players' *cardinal*—that is,
intensity-sensitive—preferences with one another's, since there
is no independent, interpersonally constant yardstick we could
use. How, then, can we model games in which cardinal information is
relevant? After all, modeling games requires that all players'
utilities be taken simultaneously into account, as we've seen.

A crucial aspect of
von Neumann & Morgenstern's (1947)
work was the solution to this problem. Here, we will provide a brief
outline of their ingenious technique for building cardinal utility
functions out of ordinal ones. It is emphasized that what follows is
merely an *outline*, so as to make cardinal utility
non-mysterious to you as a student who is interested in knowing about
the philosophical foundations of game theory, and about the range of
problems to which it can be applied. Providing a manual you could
follow in *building* your own cardinal utility functions would
require many pages. Such manuals are available in many
textbooks.

Suppose we have an agent whose ordinal utility function is known. Indeed, suppose that it's our river-crossing fugitive. Let's assign him the following ordinal utility function:

Escape ≫ 4Death by shooting ≫ 3

Death by rockfall ≫ 2

Death by snakebite ≫ 1

Now, we know that his preference for escape over *any* form of
death is likely to be stronger than his preference for, say, shooting
over snakebite. This should be reflected in his choice behaviour in
the following way. In a situation such as the river-crossing game, he
should be willing to run greater risks to increase the relative
probability of escape over shooting than he is to increase the
relative probability of shooting over snakebite. This bit of logic is
the crucial insight behind
von Neumann & Morgenstern's (1947)
solution to the cardinalization problem.

Begin by asking our agent to pick, from the available set of outcomes,
a *best* one and a *worst* one. ‘Best’ and
‘worst’ are defined in terms of a principle of decision
theory: an economically rational agent chooses so as to maximize the
probability of the best outcome—call
this **W**—and to minimize the probability of the
worst outcome—call this
**L**. Now consider prizes intermediate between
**W** and **L**. We find, for a set of
outcomes containing such prizes, a lottery over them such that our
agent is indifferent between that lottery and a lottery including only
**W** and **L**. In our example, this would
be a lottery having shooting and rockfall as its possible outcomes.
Call this lottery **T** . We define a utility function
*q* = *u*(**T**) such that if *q* is
the expected prize in **T** , the agent is indifferent
between winning **T** and winning a lottery in which
**W** occurs with probability
*u*(**T**) and **L** occurs with
probability
1 − *u*(**T**).

We now construct a *compound lottery* **T*** over
the outcome set {**W**, **L**} such that the
agent is indifferent between **T** and
**T***. A compound lottery is one in which the prize in
the lottery is another lottery. This makes sense because, after all,
it is still **W** and **L** that are at
stake for our agent in both cases; so we can then analyze
**T*** into a simple lottery over **W** and
**L**. Call this lottery **r**. It follows
from transitivity that **T** is equivalent to
**r**. (Note that this presupposes that our agent does
not gain utility from the complexity of her gambles.) The agent will
now choose the action that maximizes the probability of
winning **W**. The mapping from the set of outcomes to
*u*(**r**) is a *von Neumann-Morgenstern
utility function* (VNMuf).

What exactly have we done here? We've simply given our agent choices
over lotteries, instead of over prizes directly, and observed how much
extra risk he's willing to run to increase the chances of winning
escape over snakebite relative to getting shot or clobbered with a
rock. A VNMuf yields a *cardinal*, rather than an ordinal,
measure of utility. Our choice of endpoint-values, **W**
and **L**, is arbitrary, as before; but once these are
fixed the values of the intermediate points are determined. Therefore,
the VNMuf *does* measure the relative preference intensities of
a single agent. However, since our assignment of utility values to
**W** and **L** *is* arbitrary, we
can't use VNMufs to compare the cardinal preferences of one agent with
those of another. Furthermore, since we are using a
*risk-metric* as our measuring instrument, the construction of
the new utility function depends on assuming that our agent's
*attitude to risk itself* stays constant from one comparison of
lotteries to another. This seems reasonable for a single agent in a
single game-situation. However, two agents in one game, or one agent
under different sorts of circumstances, may display very different
attitudes to risk. Perhaps in the river-crossing game the pursuer,
whose life is not at stake, will enjoy gambling with her glory while
our fugitive is cautious. In general, a *risk-averse* agent
prefers a guaranteed prize to its equivalent expected value in a
lottery. A *risk-loving* agent has the reverse preference. A
*risk-neutral* agent is indifferent between these options. In
analyzing the river-crossing game, however, we don't *have to*
be able to compare the pursuer's cardinal utilities with the
fugitive's. Both agents, after all, can find their NE strategies if
they can estimate the probabilities each will assign to the actions of
the other. This means that each must know both VNMufs; but neither
need try to comparatively value the outcomes over which they're
gambling.

We can now fill in the rest of the matrix for the bridge-crossing game
that we started to draw in Section 2. If all that the fugitive cares
about is life and death, but not the manner of death, and if all the
hunter cares about is preventing the fugitive from escaping, then we
can now interpret both utility functions cardinally. This permits us
to assign expected utilities, expressed by multiplying the original
payoffs by the relevant probabilities, as outcomes in the matrix.
Suppose that the hunter waits at the cobra bridge with probability
*x* and at the rocky bridge with probability *y*. Since
her probabilities across the three bridges must sum to 1, this implies
that she must wait at the safe bridge with probability 1 −
(*x* + *y*). Then, continuing to assign the fugitive a
payoff of 0 if he dies and 1 if he escapes, and the hunter the reverse
payoffs, our complete matrix is as follows:

Figure 12

We can now read the following facts about the game directly from the matrix. No pair of pure strategies is a pair of best replies to the other. Therefore, the game's only NE require at least one player to use a mixed strategy.

### 3.1 Beliefs

How should we interpret the processes being modeled by computations of
NE strategy mixes in games like the river-crossing one? One possible
kind of interpretation is an * evolutionary * one. If the
hunter and the fugitive have regularly played games that structurally
*resemble* this river-crossing game, then selection pressures
will have encouraged habits in them that lead them both to play NE
strategies *and to sincerely rationalize doing so* by means of
some satisfying story or other. If neither party has ever been in a
situation like this, and if their biological and/or cultural ancestors
haven't either, and if neither is concerned with revealing information
to opponents in expected future situations of this sort (because they
don't expect them to arise again),and if both parties aren't trained
game theorists, then their behavior should be predicted not by a game
theorist but by friends of theirs who are familiar with their personal
idiosyncrasies. The spirit of science should be comfortable with the
idea that game theory isn't useful for modelling every possible
empirical circumstance that comes along.

However, the philosopher who wants game theory to serve as a
descriptive and/or normative theory of strategic rationality cannot
rest content with this answer. He must find a satisfying line of
advice for the players even when their game is alone in the universe
of strategic problems, unless he is prepared to admit that rationality
might recommend no definite course of action even in a situation where
all relevant parameters are known. No such advice can be given that is
*uncontroversially* satisfactory. A non-psychological game
theorist, after all, may favor this stance *because* she isn't
satisfied by any available approach here—and because she fears
the effort leaves empirical science behind. However, there is a way of
handling the matter that many game theorists have found worthy of
detailed pursuit. This involves the computation of *equilibria in
beliefs*.

In fact, the non-psychological game theorist can borrow the concept of equilibrium in beliefs for different purposes. As we've seen, the concept of NE sometimes doesn't go deep enough as an analytical instrument to tell us all that we think might be important in a game. Thus even the analyst who isn't impressed with the project of developing refinements for the sake of satisfying a priori intuitions about the concept of rationality might make use of the concept of subgame-perfect equilibrium (SPE), as discussed in Section 2.6, if they think they're dealing with agents who are very well informed (say, because they're in a familiar and strongly prescriptive institutional setting). But now consider the three-player imperfect-information game below known as ‘Selten's horse’ (for its inventor, Nobel Laureate Reinhard Selten, and because of the shape of its tree; taken from Kreps (1990), p. 426):

Figure 13

One of the NE of this game is Lr_{2}l_{3}. This is
because if Player I plays L, then Player II playing r_{2} has
no incentive to change strategies because her only node of action, 12,
is off the path of play. But this NE seems to be purely technical; it
makes little sense as a solution. This reveals itself in the fact that
if the game beginning at node 14 could be treated as a subgame,
Lr_{2}l_{3} would not be an SPE. Whenever she
*does* get a move, Player II should play l_{2}. But if
Player II is playing l_{2} then Player I should switch to
R. In that case Player III should switch to r_{3}, sending
Player II back to r_{2}. And here's a new,
‘sensible’, NE: Rr_{2}r_{3}. I and II in
effect play ‘keepaway’ from III.

This NE is stable under learning by players in just the same way that a SPE outcome in a perfect-information game is more stable than other non-SPE NE. However, we can't select it by applying Zermelo's algorithm. Because nodes 13 and 14 fall inside a common information set, Selten's Horse has only one subgame (namely, the whole game). We need a ‘cousin’ concept to SPE that we can apply in cases of imperfect information, and we need a new solution procedure to replace Zermelo's algorithm for such games.

Notice what Player III in Selten's Horse might wonder about as he
selects his strategy. “Given that I get a move,” he asks himself, “was
my action node reached from node 11 or from node 12?” What, in other
words, are the *conditional probabilities* that Player III is
at node 13 or 14 given that he has a move? Now, if conditional
probabilities are what Player III wonders about, then what Players I
and II must make conjectures about when they select *their*
strategies are Player III's estimates of these conditional
probabilities. These estimates are referred to as
‘beliefs’. This usage need not require that we imagine any
mental state, conscious or otherwise; a belief in this sense need only
be an expectation implicit in behavior. Player I, to conjecture about
Player III's beliefs, might conjecture about Player II's beliefs about
Players III's beliefs, and Player III's beliefs about Player II's
beliefs and so on. The relevant beliefs here are not merely strategic,
as before, since they are not just about what players will *do*
given a set of payoffs and game structures, but about which
distributions of probabilities are mutually consistent given that they
are conditional on one another.

What beliefs about conditional probability is it reasonable for
players to expect from each other? The normative theorist might insist
on whatever the best mathematicians have discovered about the subject.
Clearly, however, if this is applied then a theory of games that
incorporated it would not be descriptively true of most people. The
non-psychological game theorist should consider only expectations that
a plausible natural process of biological or, in the case of people,
cultural and institutional selection, might inculcate. Perhaps some
agents might follow habits that respect
*Bayes's rule*, which is the minimal true generalization about
conditional probability that an agent could know if it knows any such
generalizations at all. Adding more sophisticated knowledge about
conditional probability amounts to refining the concept of
equilibrium-in-belief, just as some game theorists refine NE. Such
refinements will tend only to be empirically plausible when applied to
highly competitive markets in which it is worth players' while to
intensively invest in expensive computational resources (e.g.,
financial markets).

Here, we will restrict our attention to the least refined equilibrium-in-belief concept, that obtained when we require players' expectations to accord with Bayes's rule. This rule tells us how to compute the probability of an event F given information E (written ‘pr(F/E)’):

pr(F/E) = [pr(E/F) × pr(F)] / pr(E)

We will henceforth assume that players do not hold beliefs inconsistent with this equality.

We may now define a *sequential equilibrium*. A SE has two
parts: (1) a strategy profile § for each player, as before, and
(2) a *system of beliefs* μ for each player. μ assigns
to each information set *h* a probability distribution over the
nodes *x* in *h*, with the interpretation that these are
the beliefs of player *i*(*h*) about where in his
information set he is, given that information set *h* has been
reached. Then a sequential equilibrium is a profile of strategies
§ and a system of beliefs μ consistent with Bayes's rule such
that starting from every information set *h* in the tree player
*i*(*h*) plays optimally from then on, given that what
he believes to have transpired previously is given by μ(*h*)
and what will transpire at subsequent moves is given by §.

We now demonstrate the concept by application to Selten's
Horse. Consider again the uninteresting NE
Lr_{2}l_{3}. Suppose that Player III assigns pr(1) to
her belief that if she gets a move she is at node 13. Then Player II,
given a consistent μ(II), must believe that Player III will play
l_{3}, in which case her only SE strategy is l_{2}. So
although Lr_{2}l_{3} is a NE, it is not a SE. This is
of course what we want.

The use of the consistency requirement in this example is somewhat trivial, so consider now a second case (also taken from Kreps (1990), p. 429):

Figure 14

Suppose that Player I plays L, Player II plays l_{2} and Player III plays
l_{3}. Suppose also that μ(II) assigns pr(.3) to node
16. In that case, l_{2} is not a SE strategy for Player II, since
l_{2} returns an expected payoff of .3(4) + .7(2) = 2.6, while
r_{2} brings an expected payoff of 3.1. Notice that if we
fiddle the strategy profile for player III while leaving everything
else fixed, l_{2} could *become* a SE strategy for
Player II. If §(III) yielded a play of l_{3} with pr(.5) and
r_{3} with pr(.5), then if Player II plays r_{2} his expected
payoff would now be 2.2, so Ll_{2}l_{3} would be a SE.
Now imagine setting μ(III) back as it was, but change μ(II) so
that Player II thinks the conditional probability of being at node 16 is
greater than .5; in that case, l_{2} is again not a SE
strategy.

The idea of SE is hopefully now clear. We can apply it to the river-crossing game in a way that avoids the necessity for the pursuer to flip any coins of we modify the game a bit. Suppose now that the pursuer can change bridges twice during the fugitive's passage, and will catch him just in case she meets him as he leaves the bridge. Then the pursuer's SE strategy is to divide her time at the three bridges in accordance with the proportion given by the equation in the third paragraph of Section 3 above.

It must be noted that since Bayes's rule cannot be applied to events
with probability 0, its application to SE requires that players assign
non-zero probabilities to all actions available in extensive form. This
requirement is captured by supposing that all strategy profiles be
*strictly mixed*, that is, that every action at every
information set be taken with positive probability. You will see that
this is just equivalent to supposing that all hands sometimes tremble,
or alternatively that no expectations are quite certain. A SE is said
to be *trembling-hand perfect* if all strategies played at
equilibrium are best replies to strategies that are strictly
mixed. You should also not be surprised to be told that no weakly
dominated strategy can be trembling-hand perfect, since the
possibility of trembling hands gives players the most persuasive
reason for avoiding such strategies.

## 4. Repeated Games and Coordination

So far we've restricted our attention to *one-shot* games, that
is, games in which players' strategic concerns extend no further than
the terminal nodes of their single interaction. However, games are
often played with *future* games in mind, and this can
significantly alter their outcomes and equilibrium strategies. Our
topic in this section is *repeated games*, that is, games in
which sets of players expect to face each other in similar situations
on multiple occasions. We approach these first through the limited
context of repeated prisoner's dilemmas.

We've seen that in the one-shot PD the only NE is mutual defection. This may no longer hold, however, if the players expect to meet each other again in future PDs. Imagine that four firms, all making widgets, agree to maintain high prices by jointly restricting supply. (That is, they form a cartel.) This will only work if each firm maintains its agreed production quota. Typically, each firm can maximize its profit by departing from its quota while the others observe theirs, since it then sells more units at the higher market price brought about by the almost-intact cartel. In the one-shot case, all firms would share this incentive to defect and the cartel would immediately collapse. However, the firms expect to face each other in competition for a long period. In this case, each firm knows that if it breaks the cartel agreement, the others can punish it by underpricing it for a period long enough to more than eliminate its short-term gain. Of course, the punishing firms will take short-term losses too during their period of underpricing. But these losses may be worth taking if they serve to reestablish the cartel and bring about maximum long-term prices.

One simple, and famous (but *not*, contrary to widespread
myth, necessarily optimal) strategy for preserving cooperation in
repeated PDs is called *tit-for-tat*. This strategy tells each
player to behave as follows:

- Always cooperate in the first round.
- Thereafter, take whatever action your opponent took in the previous round.

A group of players *all* playing tit-for-tat will never see any
defections. Since, in a population where others play tit-for-tat,
tit-for-tat is the rational response for each player, everyone playing
tit-for-tat is a NE. You may frequently hear people who know a
*little* (but not enough) game theory talk as if this is the end
of the story. It is not.

There are two complications. First, the players must be uncertain as to when their interaction ends. Suppose the players know when the last round comes. In that round, it will be utility-maximizing for players to defect, since no punishment will be possible. Now consider the second-last round. In this round, players also face no punishment for defection, since they expect to defect in the last round anyway. So they defect in the second-last round. But this means they face no threat of punishment in the third-last round, and defect there too. We can simply iterate this backwards through the game tree until we reach the first round. Since cooperation is not a NE strategy in that round, tit-for-tat is no longer a NE strategy in the repeated game, and we get the same outcome—mutual defection—as in the one-shot PD. Therefore, cooperation is only possible in repeated PDs where the expected number of repetitions is indeterminate. (Of course, this does apply to many real-life games.) Note that in this context any amount of uncertainty in expectations, or possibility of trembling hands, will be conducive to cooperation, at least for awhile. When people in experiments play repeated PDs with known end-points, they indeed tend to cooperate for awhile, but learn to defect earlier as they gain experience.

Now we introduce a second complication. Suppose that players' ability to distinguish defection from cooperation is imperfect. Consider our case of the widget cartel. Suppose the players observe a fall in the market price of widgets. Perhaps this is because a cartel member cheated. Or perhaps it has resulted from an exogenous drop in demand. If tit-for-tat players mistake the second case for the first, they will defect, thereby setting off a chain-reaction of mutual defections from which they can never recover, since every player will reply to the first encountered defection with defection, thereby begetting further defections, and so on.

If players know that such miscommunication is possible, they have
incentive to resort to more sophisticated strategies. In particular,
they may be prepared to sometimes risk following defections with
cooperation in order to test their inferences. However, if they
are *too* forgiving, then other players can exploit them
through additional defections. In general, sophisticated strategies
have a problem. Because they are more difficult for other players to
infer, their use increases the probability of miscommunication. But
miscommunication is what causes repeated-game cooperative equilibria
to unravel in the first place. The complexities surrounding
information signaling, screening and inference in repeated PDs help to
intuitively explain the *folk theorem*, so called because no
one is sure who first recognized it, that in repeated PDs,
for *any* strategy *S* there exists a possible
distribution of strategies among other players such that the vector
of *S* and these other strategies is a NE. Thus there is
nothing special, after all, about tit-for-tat.

Real, complex, social and political dramas are seldom
straightforward instantiations of simple games such as PDs.
Hardin (1995)
offers an analysis of two tragically real political cases, the
Yugoslavian civil war of 1991–95, and the 1994 Rwandan genocide, as
PDs that were nested inside *coordination games*.

A coordination game occurs whenever the utility of two or more players
is maximized by their doing the same thing as one another, and where
such correspondence is more important to them than whatever it is, in
particular, that they both do. A standard example arises with rules of
the road: ‘All drive on the left’ and ‘All drive on
the right’ are both outcomes that are NEs, and neither is more
efficient than the other. In games of ‘pure’ coordination,
it doesn't even help to use more selective equilibrium criteria. For
example, suppose that we require our players to reason in accordance
with Bayes's rule (see Section 3 above). In these circumstances, any
strategy that is a best reply to any vector of mixed strategies
available in NE is said to be *rationalizable*. That is, a
player can find a set of systems of beliefs for the other players such
that any history of the game along an equilibrium path is consistent
with that set of systems. Pure coordination games are characterized by
non-unique vectors of rationalizable strategies. In such situations,
players may try to predict equilibria by searching for *focal
points*, that is, features of some strategies that they believe
will be salient to other players, and that they believe other players
will believe to be salient to them. For example, if two people want to
meet on a given day in a big city but can't contact each other to
arrange a specific time and place, both might sensibly go to the
city's most prominent downtown plaza at noon. In general, the better
players know one another, or the more often they have been able to
observe one another's strategic behavior, the more likely they are to
succeed in finding focal points on which to coordinate.

Coordination was, indeed, the first topic of game-theoretic
application that came to the widespread attention of philosophers. In
1969, the philosopher
David Lewis (1969)
published *Convention*, in which the conceptual framework of
game-theory was applied to one of the fundamental issues of
twentieth-century epistemology, the nature and extent of conventions
governing semantics and their relationship to the justification of
propositional beliefs. The basic insight can be captured using a
simple example. The word ‘chicken’ denotes chickens and
‘ostrich’ denotes ostriches. We would not be better or
worse off if ‘chicken’ denoted ostriches and
‘ostrich’ denoted chickens; however, we *would* be
worse off if half of us used the pair of words the first way and half
the second, or if all of us randomized between them to refer to
flightless birds generally. This insight, of course, well preceded
Lewis; but what he recognized is that this situation has the logical
form of a coordination game. Thus, while particular conventions may be
arbitrary, the interactive structures that stabilize and maintain them
are not. Furthermore, the equilibria involved in coordinating on noun
meanings appear to have an arbitrary element only because we cannot
Pareto-rank them; but
Millikan (1984) shows implicitly that in this
respect they are atypical of linguistic coordinations. They are
certainly atypical of coordinating conventions in general, a point on
which Lewis was misled by over-valuing ‘semantic
intuitions’ about ‘the meaning’of
‘convention’
(Bacharach 2006, Ross 2008).

Ross & LaCasse (1995) present the following example of a real-life coordination game in which the NE are not Pareto-indifferent, but the Pareto-inferior NE is more frequently observed. In a city, drivers must coordinate on one of two NE with respect to their behaviour at traffic lights. Either all must follow the strategy of rushing to try to race through lights that turn yellow (or amber) and pausing before proceeding when red lights shift to green, or all must follow the strategy of slowing down on yellows and jumping immediately off on shifts to green. Both patterns are NE, in that once a community has coordinated on one of them then no individual has an incentive to deviate: those who slow down on yellows while others are rushing them will get rear-ended, while those who rush yellows in the other equilibrium will risk collision with those who jump off straightaway on greens. Therefore, once a city's traffic pattern settles on one of these equilibria it will tend to stay there. And, indeed, these are the two patterns that are observed in the world's cities. However, the two equilibria are not Pareto-indifferent, since the second NE allows more cars to turn left on each cycle in a left-hand-drive jurisdiction, and right on each cycle in a right-hand jurisdiction, which reduces the main cause of bottlenecks in urban road networks and allows all drivers to expect greater efficiency in getting about. Unfortunately, for reasons about which we can only speculate pending further empirical work and analysis, far more cities are locked onto the Pareto-inferior NE than on the Pareto-superior one.

Conventions on standards of evidence and scientific rationality, the topics from philosophy of science that set up the context for Lewis's analysis, are likely to be of the Pareto-rankable character. While various arrangements might be NE in the social game of science, as followers of Thomas Kuhn like to remind us, it is highly improbable that all of these lie on a single Pareto-indifference curve. These themes, strongly represented in contemporary epistemology, philosophy of science and philosophy of language, are all at least implicit applications of game theory. (The reader can find a broad sample of applications, and references to the large literature, in Nozick (1998).)

Most of the social and political coordination games played by people also have this feature. Unfortunately for us all, inefficiency traps represented by Pareto-inferior NE are extremely common in them. And sometimes dynamics of this kind give rise to the most terrible of all recurrent human collective behaviors. Hardin's analysis of two recent genocidal episodes relies on the idea that the biologically shallow properties by which people sort themselves into racial and ethnic groups serve highly efficiently as focal points in coordination games, which in turn produce deadly PDs between them.

According to Hardin, neither the Yugoslavian nor the Rwandan disasters
were PDs to begin with. That is, in neither situation, on either side,
did most people begin by preferring the destruction of the other to
mutual cooperation. However, the deadly logic of coordination,
deliberately abetted by self-serving politicians,
dynamically *created* PDs. Some individual Serbs (Hutus) were
encouraged to perceive their individual interests as best served
through identification with Serbian (Hutu) group-interests. That is,
they found that some of their circumstances, such as those involving
competition for jobs, had the form of coordination games. They thus
acted so as to create situations in which this was true for other
Serbs (Hutus) as well. Eventually, once enough Serbs (Hutus)
identified self-interest with group-interest, the identification
became almost universally *correct*, because (1) the most
important goal for each Serb (Hutu) was to do roughly what every other
Serb (Hutu) would, and (2) the most distinctively *Serbian*
thing to do, the doing of which signalled coordination, was to exclude
Croats (Tutsi). That is, strategies involving such exclusionary
behavior were selected as a result of having efficient focal
points. This situation made it the case that an individual—and
individually threatened—Croat's (Tutsi's) self-interest was best
maximized by coordinating on assertive Croat (Tutsi) group-identity,
which further increased pressures on Serbs (Hutus) to coordinate, and
so on. Note that it is not an aspect of this analysis to suggest that
Serbs or Hutus started things; the process could have been (even if it
wasn't in fact) perfectly reciprocal. But the outcome is ghastly:
Serbs and Croats (Hutus and Tutsis) seem progressively more
threatening to each other as they rally together for self-defense,
until both see it as imperative to preempt their rivals and strike
before being struck. If Hardin is right—and the point here is
not to claim that he *is*, but rather to point out the worldly
importance of determining which games agents are in fact
playing—then the mere presence of an external enforcer (NATO?)
would not have changed the game, pace the Hobbesian analysis, since
the enforcer could not have threatened either side with anything worse
than what each feared from the other. What was needed was
recalibration of evaluations of interests, which (arguably) happened
in Yugoslavia when the Croatian army began to decisively win, at which
point Bosnian Serbs decided that their self/group interests were
better served by the arrival of NATO peacekeepers. The Rwandan
genocide likewise ended with a military solution, in this case a Tutsi
victory. (But this became the seed for the most deadly war on earth
since 1945, the Congo War of 1998–2006.)

Of course, it is not the case that most repeated games lead to disasters. The biological basis of friendship in people and other animals is partly a function of the logic of repeated games. The importance of payoffs achievable through cooperation in future games leads those who expect to interact in them to be less selfish than temptation would otherwise encourage in present games. The fact that such equilibria become more stable through learning gives friends the logical character of built-up investments, which most people take great pleasure in sentimentalizing. Furthermore, cultivating shared interests and sentiments provides networks of focal points around which coordination can be increasingly facilitated.

## 5. Commitment

In some games, a player can improve her outcome by taking an action
that makes it impossible for her to take what would be her best
action in the corresponding simultaneous-move game. Such actions are
referred to as *commitments*, and they can serve as
alternatives to external enforcement in games which would otherwise
settle on Pareto-inefficient equilibria.

Consider the following hypothetical example (which is *not* a
PD). Suppose you own a piece of land adjacent to mine, and I'd like to
buy it so as to expand my lot. Unfortunately, you don't want to sell
at the price I'm willing to pay. If we move simultaneously—you
post a selling price and I independently give my agent an asking
price—there will be no sale. So I might try to change your
incentives by playing an opening move in which I announce that I'll
build a putrid-smelling sewage disposal plant on my land beside yours
unless you sell, thereby inducing you to lower your price. I've now
turned this into a sequential-move game. However, this move so far
changes nothing. If you refuse to sell in the face of my threat, it is
then not in my interest to carry it out, because in damaging you I
also damage myself. Since you know this you should ignore my
threat. My threat is *incredible*, a case of cheap talk.

However, I could make my threat credible by *committing*
myself. For example, I could sign a contract with some farmers
promising to supply them with treated sewage (fertilizer) from my
plant, but including an escape clause in the contract releasing me
from my obligation only if I can double my lot size and so put it to
some other use. Now my threat is credible: if you don't sell, I'm
committed to building the sewage plant. Since you know this, you now
have an incentive to sell me your land in order to escape its
ruination.

This sort of case exposes one of many fundamental differences between the logic of non-parametric and parametric maximization. In parametric situations, an agent can never be made worse off by having more options. (Even if a new option is worse than the options with which she began, she can just ignore it.) But where circumstances are non-parametric, one agent's strategy can be influenced in another's favour if options are visibly restricted. Cortez's burning of his boats (see Section 1) is, of course, an instance of this, one which serves to make the usual metaphor literal.

Another example will illustrate this, as well as the applicability of
principles across game-types. Here we will build an imaginary
situation that is not a PD—since only one player has an
incentive to defect—but which is a social dilemma insofar as its
NE in the absence of commitment is Pareto-inferior to an outcome that
is achievable *with* a commitment device. Suppose that two of
us wish to poach a rare antelope from a national park in order to sell
the trophy. One of us must flush the animal down towards the second
person, who waits in a blind to shoot it and load it onto a truck. You
promise, of course, to share the proceeds with me. However, your
promise is not credible. Once you've got the buck, you have no reason
not to drive it away and pocket the full value from it. After all, I
can't very well complain to the police without getting myself arrested
too. But now suppose I add the following opening move to the
game. Before our hunt, I rig out the truck with an alarm that can be
turned off only by punching in a code. Only I know the code. If you
try to drive off without me, the alarm will sound and we'll both get
caught. You, knowing this, now have an incentive to wait for me. What
is crucial to notice here is that you *prefer* that I rig up
the alarm, since this makes your promise to give me my share
credible. If I don't do this, leaving your promise
*in*credible, we'll be unable to agree to try the crime in the
first place, and both of us will lose our shot at the profit from
selling the trophy. Thus, you benefit from my preventing you from
doing what's optimal for you in a subgame.

We may now combine our analysis of PDs and commitment devices in discussion of the application that first made game theory famous outside of the academic community. The nuclear stand-off between the superpowers during the Cold War was exhaustively studied by the first generation of game theorists, many of whom worked for the US military. (See Poundstone 1992 for historical details.) Both the USA and the USSR maintained the following policy. If one side launched a first strike, the other threatened to answer with a devastating counter-strike. This pair of reciprocal strategies, which by the late 1960s would effectively have meant blowing up the world, was known as ‘Mutually Assured Destruction’, or ‘MAD’. Game theorists objected that MAD was mad, because it set up a PD as a result of the fact that the reciprocal threats were incredible. The reasoning behind this diagnosis went as follows. Suppose the USSR launches a first strike against the USA. At that point, the American President finds his country already destroyed. He doesn't bring it back to life by now blowing up the world, so he has no incentive to carry out his original threat to retaliate, which has now manifestly failed to achieve its point. Since the Russians can anticipate this, they should ignore the threat to retaliate and strike first. Of course, the Americans are in an exactly symmetric position, so they too should strike first. Each power will recognize this incentive on the part of the other, and so will anticipate an attack if they don't rush to preempt it. What we should therefore expect, because it is the only NE of the game, is a race between the two powers to be the first to attack.

This game-theoretic analysis caused genuine consternation and fear on
both sides during the Cold War, and is reputed to have produced some
striking attempts at setting up strategic commitment devices. Some
anecdotes, for example, allege that President Nixon had the CIA try to
convince the Russians that he was insane or frequently drunk, so that
they'd believe that he'd launch a retaliatory strike even when it was
no longer in his interest to do so. Similarly, the Soviet KGB is
claimed to have fabricated medical reports exaggerating Brezhnev's
senility with the same end in mind. Ultimately, the strategic symmetry
that concerned the Pentagon's analysts was complicated and perhaps
broken by changes in American missile deployment tactics. They equipped
a worldwide fleet of submarines with enough missiles to destroy the
USSR. This made the reliability of their communications network less
straightforward, and in so doing introduced an element of
strategically relevant uncertainty. The President probably could be
less sure to be able to reach the submarines and cancel their orders
to attack if any Soviet missile crossed the radar trigger line in
Northern Canada. Of course, the value of this in breaking symmetry
depended on the Russians being aware of the potential problem. In
Stanley Kubrick's classic film *Dr. Strangelove*, the world is
destroyed by accident because the Russians build a doomsday machine
that will automatically trigger a retaliatory strike regardless of
their leadership's resolve to follow through on the implicit MAD
threat *but then keep it a secret*. As a result, when an
unequivocally mad American colonel launches missiles at Russia on his
own accord, and the American President tries to convince his Soviet
counterpart that the attack was unintended, the Russian Premier
sheepishly tells him about the secret doomsday machine. Now the two
leaders can do nothing but watch in dismay as the world is blown up
due to a game-theoretic mistake.

This example of the Cold War standoff, while famous and of considerable importance in the history of game theory and its popular reception, relied at the time on analyses that weren't very subtle. The military game theorists were almost certainly mistaken to the extent that they modeled the Cold War as a one-shot PD in the first place. For one thing, the nuclear balancing game was enmeshed in larger global power games of great complexity. For another, it is far from clear that, for either superpower, annihilating the other while avoiding self-annihilation was in fact the highest-ranked outcome. If it wasn't, in either or both cases, then the game wasn't a PD. A wise cynic might suggest that the operations researchers on both sides were playing a cunning strategy in a game over funding, one that involved them cooperating with one another in order to convince their politicians to allocate more resources to weapons.

In more mundane circumstances, most people exploit a ubiquitous
commitment device that Adam Smith long ago made the centerpiece of his
theory of social order: the value to people of their
own *reputations*. Even if I am secretly stingy, I may wish
others to think me generous by tipping in restaurants, including
restaurants in which I never intend to eat again. The more I do this
sort of thing, the more I invest in a valuable reputation which I
could badly damage through a single act of obvious, and observed,
mean-ness. Thus my hard-earned reputation for generosity functions as
a commitment mechanism in specific games, itself enforcing continued
re-investment. There is a good deal of evidence that the the
hyper-sociality of humans is supported by evolved biological
dispositions (found in most but not all people) to suffer emotionally
from negative gossip and the fear of it. People are also naturally
disposed to *enjoy* gossiping, which means that punishing
others by spreading the news when their commitment devices fail is a
form of social policing they don't find costly and happily take up. A
nice feature of this form of punishment is that it can, unlike (say)
hitting people with sticks, be withdrawn without leaving long-term
damage to the punishee. This is a happy property of a device that has
as its point the maintenance of incentives to contribute to joint
social projects; collaboration is generally more fruitful with
team-mates whose bones aren't broken. Thus forgiveness conventions
also play a strategic role in this extremely elegant commitment
mechanism that natural selection built for us. Finally, *norms*
are culturally evolved mutual expectations in a group of people (or,
for that matter, elephants or dolphins or monkeys) that have the
further property that individuals who violate them may
punish *themselves* by feeling guilt or shame. Thus they may
often take cooperative actions against their narrow self-interest even
when no one else is paying attention. Religious stories, or bogus
philosophical ones involving Kantian 'rationality', are especially
likely to be told in explanation of norms because the underlying
game-theoretic basis doesn't occur to people.

Though the so-called ‘moral emotions’are extremely useful
for maintaining commitment, they are not necessary for it. Larger
human institutions are, famously, highly morally obtuse; however,
commitment is typically crucial to their functional logic. For
example, a government tempted to negotiate with terrorists to secure
the release of hostages on a particular occasion may commit to a
‘line in the sand’ strategy for the sake of maintaining a
reputation for toughness intended to reduce terrorists' incentives to
launch future attacks. A different sort of example is provided by
Qantas Airlines of Australia. Qantas has never suffered an accident,
and makes much of this in its advertising. This means that its planes
probably *are* safer than average even if the initial advantage
was merely a bit of statistical good fortune, because the value of its
ability to claim a perfect record rises the longer it lasts, and so
gives the airline continuous incentives to incur greater costs in
safety assurance.

Certain conditions must hold if reputation effects are to underwrite
commitment. First, the game must be repeated. Reputation has no
strategic value in a one-shot game. Second, the value of the
reputation must be greater to its cultivator than the value to him of
sacrificing it in *any* particular round of the repeated
game. Thus players may establish commitment by reducing the value of
each round so that the temptation to defect in any round never gets
high enough to constitute a hard-to-resist temptation. For example,
parties to a contract may exchange their obligations in small
increments to reduce incentives on both sides to renege. Thus builders
in construction projects may be paid in weekly or monthly
installments. Similarly, the International Monetary Fund often
dispenses loans to governments in small tranches, thereby reducing
governments' incentives to violate loan conditions once the money is
in hand; and governments may actually prefer such arrangements in
order to remove domestic political pressure for non-compliant use of
the money. Of course, we are all familiar with cases in which the
payoff from a defection in a current round becomes too great relative
to the longer-run value of reputation to future cooperation, and we
awake to find that the society treasurer has absconded overnight with
the funds. Commitment through concern for reputation is the cement of
society, but any such natural bonding agent will be far from perfectly
effective.

## 6. Evolutionary Game Theory

Gintis (2000, 2009)
feels justified in stating that “game theory is a
universal language for the unification of the behavioral sciences.”
This may seem to many as if it must be a considerable rhetorical
exaggeration, but in my opinion it is entirely plausible. There are
good examples of such unifying work. Binmore
(1998,
2005a)
models social history as a series of convergences on increasingly
efficient equilibria in commonly encountered transaction games,
interrupted by episodes in which some people try to shift to new
equilibria by moving off stable equilibrium paths, resulting in
periodic catastrophes. (Stalin, for example, tried to shift his
society to a set of equilibria in which people cared more about the
future industrial, military and political power of their state than
they cared about their own lives. He was not successful; however, his
efforts certainly created a situation in which, for a few decades,
many Soviet people attached far less importance to *other
people's* lives than usual.) Furthermore, applications of game
theory to behavioral topics extend well beyond the political
arena. In Section 4, for example, we considered
Lewis's recognition that each human language amounts to a network of
Nash equilibria in coordination games around conveyance of
information.

Given his work's vintage, Lewis restricted his attention to static
game theory, in which agents are modeled as
deliberately *choosing* strategies given exogenously fixed
utility-functions. As a result of this restriction, his account
invited some philosophers to pursue a misguided quest for a general
analytic theory of the rationality of conventions
(as noted by Bickhard 2008). Though Ken Binmore has
criticized this focus repeatedly through a career's worth of
contributions (see the references for a
selection), Gintis (2009) has recently isolated
the underlying problem with particular clarity and tenacity. NE and
SPE are *brittle* solution concepts when applied to naturally
evolved computational mechanisms like animal (including human)
brains. As we saw in Section 3 above, in
coordination (and other) games with multiple NE, what it is
economically rational for a player to do is highly sensitive to the
learning states of other players. In general, when players find
themselves in games where they do not have strictly dominant
strategies, they only have uncomplicated incentives to play NE or SPE
strategies to the extent that other players can be expected to
find *their* NE or SPE strategies. Can a *general*
theory of strategic rationality, of the sort that philosophers have
sought, be reasonably expected to cover the resulting contingencies?
Resort to Bayesian reasoning principles, as we reviewed
in Section 3.1, is the standard way of trying
to incorporate such uncertainty into theories of rational, strategic
decision. However, as Binmore (2009) shows with
beautiful clarity in a recent book, Bayesian principles are only
plausible *as principles of rationality itself* in so-called
‘small worlds’, that is, environments in which
distributions of risk are quantified in a set of known and enumerable
parameters, as in the solution our river crossing game
from Section 3. In large worlds, where utility
functions, strategy sets and informational structure are difficult to
estimate and subject to change by contingent exogenous influences, the
idea that Bayes's rule tells players how to ‘be rational’
is quite implausible. But then why should we expect players to choose
NE or SPE or sequential-equilibrium strategies?

As Binmore (2009) and
Gintis (2009)
both stress, if game theory is to be used to model actual,
natural behavior and its history, outside of the small-world settings
on which microeconomists (but not macroeconomists or political
scientists or sociologists or philosophers of science) mainly traffic,
then we need some account of what is attractive about equilibria in
games even when no analysis can identify them by taming all
uncertainty in such a way that it can be represented as pure risk. To
make reference again to Lewis's topic, when human language developed
there was no external referee to care about and arrange for
Pareto-efficiency by providing focal points for coordination. Yet
somehow people agreed, within linguistic communities, to use roughly
the same words and constructions to say similar things. It seems
unlikely that any explicit, deliberate strategizing on anyone's part
played a role in these processes. Nevertheless, game theory has turned
out to furnish the essential concepts for understanding stabilization
of languages. This is a striking point of support for Gintis's
optimism about the reach of game theory. To understand it, we must
extend our attention to *evolutionary* games.

Game theory has been fruitfully applied in evolutionary biology,
where species and/or genes are treated as players, since pioneering
work by
Maynard Smith (1982)
and his collaborators. Evolutionary (or *dynamic*) game theory
now constitutes a significant new mathematical extension applicable to
many settings apart from the biological.
Skyrms (1996)
uses evolutionary game theory to try to answer questions Lewis could
not even ask, about the conditions under which language, concepts of
justice, the notion of private property, and other non-designed,
general phenomena of interest to philosophers would be likely to
arise. What is novel about evolutionary game theory is that moves are
not chosen by economically rational agents. Instead, agents are
typically hard-wired with particular strategies, and success for a
strategy is defined in terms of the number of copies of itself that it
will leave to play in the games of succeeding generations, given a
population in which other strategies with which it acts are
distributed at particular frequencies. In this kind of problem
setting, the strategies themselves are the players, and individuals
who play these strategies are their mere executors who receive the
immediate-run costs and benefits associated with outcomes.

The discussion here will closely follow Skyrms's. We begin by
introducing *the replicator dynamics*. Consider first how
natural selection works to change lineages of animals, modifying,
creating and destroying species. The basic mechanism is
*differential reproduction*. Any animal with *heritable*
features that increase its *expected number of offspring* in a
given environment will tend to leave more offspring than others so
long as the environment remains relatively stable. These offspring
will be more likely to inherit the features in question. Therefore,
the proportion of these features in the population will gradually
increase as generations pass. Some of these features may *go to
fixation*, that is, eventually take over the entire population
(until the environment changes).

How does game theory enter into this? Often, one of the most important aspects of an organism's environment will be the behavioural tendencies of other organisms. We can think of each lineage as ‘trying’ to maximize its reproductive fitness (= expected number of grandchildren) through finding strategies that are optimal given the strategies of other lineages. So evolutionary theory is another domain of application for non-parametric analysis.

In evolutionary game theory, we no longer think of individuals as choosing
strategies as they move from one game to another. This is because our
interests are different. We're now concerned less with finding the
equilibria of single games than with discovering which equilibria are
stable, and how they will change over time. So we now model *the
strategies themselves* as playing against each other. One
strategy is ‘better’ than another if it is likely to leave
more copies of itself in the next generation, when the game will be
played again. We study the changes in distribution of strategies in
the population as the sequence of games unfolds.

For dynamic game theory, we introduce a new equilibrium concept, due
to
Maynard Smith (1982).
A set of strategies, in some particular proportion (e.g., 1/3:2/3,
1/2:1/2, 1/9:8/9, 1/3:1/3:1/6:1/6—always summing to 1) is at an
*ESS* (Evolutionary Stable Strategy) equilibrium just in case
(1) no individual playing one strategy could improve its reproductive
fitness by switching to one of the other strategies in the proportion,
and (2) no mutant playing a different strategy altogether could
establish itself (‘invade’) in the population.

The principles of evolutionary game theory are best explained through examples. Skyrms begins by investigating the conditions under which a sense of justice—understood as a disposition to view equal divisions of resources as fair unless efficiency considerations suggest otherwise in special cases—might arise. He asks us to consider a population in which individuals regularly meet each other and must bargain over resources. Begin with three types of individuals:

*Fairmen*always demand exactly half the resource.*Greedies*always demand more than half the resource. When a greedy encounters another greedy, they waste the resource in fighting over it.*Modests*always demand less than half the resource. When a modest encounters another modest, they take less than all of the available resource and waste some.

Each *single* encounter where the total demands sum to 100% is a
NE of that individual game. Similarly, there can be many dynamic
equilibria. Suppose that Greedies demand 2/3 of the resource and
Modests demand 1/3. Then the following two proportions are ESS's:

- Half the population is greedy and half is modest. We can calculate the average payoff here. Modest gets 1/3 of the resource in every encounter. Greedy gets 2/3 when she meets Modest, but nothing when she meets another Greedy. So her average payoff is also 1/3. This is an ESS because Fairman can't invade. When Fairman meets Modest he gets 1/2. But when Fairman meets Greedy he gets nothing. So his average payoff is only 1/4. No Modest has an incentive to change strategies, and neither does any Greedy. A mutant Fairman arising in the population would do worst of all, and so selection will not encourage the propagation of any such mutants.
- All players are Fairmen. Everyone always gets half the resource, and no one can do better by switching to another strategy. Greedies entering this population encounter Fairmen and get an average payoff of 0. Modests get 1/3 as before, but this is less than Fairman's payoff of 1/2.

Notice that equilibrium (i) is inefficient, since the average payoff across the whole population is smaller. However, just as inefficient outcomes can be NE of static games, so they can be ESS's of dynamic ones.

We refer to equilibria in which more than one strategy occurs as
*polymorphisms*. In general, in Skyrms's game, any polymorphism
in which Greedy demands *x* and Modest demands
1−*x* is an ESS. The question that interests the student
of justice concerns the relative likelihood with which these different
equilibria arise.

This depends entirely on the proportions of strategies in the original
population state. If the population begins with more than one Fairman,
then there is some probability that Fairmen will encounter each other,
and get the highest possible average payoff. Modests by themselves do
not inhibit the spread of Fairmen; only Greedies do. But Greedies
themselves depend on having Modests around in order to be viable. So
the more Fairmen there are in the population relative to
*pairs* of Greedies and Modests, the better Fairmen do on
average. This implies a threshold effect. If the proportion of Fairmen
drops below 33%, then the tendency will be for them to fall to
extinction because they don't meet each other often enough. If the
population of Fairmen rises above 33%, then the tendency will be for
them to rise to fixation because their extra gains when they meet each
other compensates for their losses when they meet Greedies. You can
see this by noticing that when each strategy is used by 33% of the
population, all have an expected average payoff of 1/3. Therefore, any
rise above this threshold on the part of Fairmen will tend to push
them towards fixation.

This result shows that and how, given certain relatively general
conditions, justice as we have defined it *can* arise
dynamically. The news for the fans of justice gets more cheerful still
if we introduce *correlated play*.

The model we just considered assumes that strategies are not
*correlated*, that is, that the probability with which every
strategy meets every other strategy is a simple function of their
relative frequencies in the population. We now examine what happens in
our dynamic resource-division game when we introduce correlation.
Suppose that Fairmen have a slight ability to distinguish and seek out
other Fairmen as interaction partners. In that case, Fairmen on average
do better, and this must have the effect of lowering their threshold
for going to fixation.

An evolutionary game modeler studies the effects of correlation and other
parametric constraints by means of running large computer simulations
in which the strategies compete with one another, round after round, in
the virtual environment. The starting proportions of strategies, and
any chosen degree of correlation, can simply be set in the programme.
One can then watch its dynamics unfold over time, and measure the
proportion of time it stays in any one equilibrium. These proportions
are represented by the relative sizes of the *basins of
attraction* for different possible equilibria. Equilibria are
attractor points in a dynamic space; a basin of attraction for each
such point is then the set of points in the space from which the
population will converge to the equilibrium in question.

In introducing correlation into his model, Skyrms first sets the degree of correlation at a very small .1. This causes the basin of attraction for equilibrium (i) to shrink by half. When the degree of correlation is set to .2, the polymorphic basin reduces to the point at which the population starts in the polymorphism. Thus very small increases in correlation produce large proportionate increases in the stability of the equilibrium where everyone plays Fairman. A small amount of correlation is a reasonable assumption in most populations, given that neighbours tend to interact with one another and to mimic one another (either genetically or because of tendencies to deliberately copy each other), and because genetically and culturally similar animals are more likely to live in common environments. Thus if justice can arise at all it will tend to be dominant and stable.

Much of political philosophy consists in attempts to produce deductive
normative arguments intended to convince an unjust agent that she has
reasons to act justly. Skyrms's analysis suggests a quite different
approach. Fairman will do best of all in the dynamic game if he takes
active steps to preserve correlation. Therefore, there is evolutionary
pressure for both *moral approval of justice* and *just
institutions* to arise. Most people may think that 50–50 splits
are ‘fair’, and worth maintaining by moral and
institutional reward and sanction, *because* we are the
products of a dynamic game that promoted our tendency to think this
way.

The topic that has received most attention from evolutionary game
theorists is *altruism*, defined as any behaviour by an
organism that decreases its own expected fitness in a single
interaction but increases that of the other interactor. It is common
in nature. How can it arise, however, given Darwinian competition?

Skyrms studies this question using the dynamic Prisoner's Dilemma as his example. This is simply a series of PD games played in a population, some of whose members are defectors and some of whom are cooperators. Payoffs, as always in dynamic games, are measured in terms of expected numbers of copies of each strategy in future generations.

Let **U**(*A*) be the average fitness of strategy
*A* in the population. Let **U** be the average
fitness of the whole population. Then the proportion of strategy
*A* in the next generation is just the ratio
**U**(*A*)/**U**. So if *A*
has greater fitness than the population average *A*
increases. If *A* has lower fitness than the population average
then *A* decreases.

In the dynamic PD where interaction is random (i.e., there's no correlation), defectors do better than the population average as long as there are cooperators around. This follows from the fact that, as we saw in Section 2.4, defection is always the dominant strategy in a single game. 100% defection is therefore the ESS in the dynamic game without correlation, corresponding to the NE in the one-shot static PD.

However, introducing the possibility of correlation radically changes
the picture. We now need to compute the average fitness of a strategy
*given its probability of meeting each other possible
strategy*. In the evolutionary PD, cooperators whose probability of
meeting other cooperators is high do better than defectors whose
probability of meeting other defectors is high. Correlation thus
favours cooperation.

In order to be able to say something more precise about this
relationship between correlation and cooperation (and in order to be
able to relate evolutionary game theory to issues in decision theory,
a matter falling outside the scope of this article), Skyrms introduces
a new technical concept. He calls a strategy *adaptively
ratifiable* if there is a region around its fixation point in the
dynamic space such that from anywhere within that region it will go to
fixation. In the dynamic PD, both defection and cooperation are
adaptively ratifiable. The relative sizes of basins of attraction are
highly sensitive to the particular mechanisms by which correlation is
achieved. To illustrate this point, Skyrms builds several
examples.

One of Skyrms's models introduces correlation by means of a
*filter* on pairing for interaction. Suppose that in round 1 of
a dynamic PD individuals inspect each other and interact, or not,
depending on what they find. In the second and subsequent rounds, all
individuals who didn't pair in round 1 are randomly paired. In this
game, the basin of attraction for defection is large *unless*
there is a high proportion of cooperators in round one. In this case,
defectors fail to pair in round 1, then get paired mostly with each
other in round 2 and drive each other to extinction. A model which is
more interesting, because its mechanism is less artificial, does not
allow individuals to choose their partners, but requires them to
interact with those closest to them. Because of genetic relatedness
(or cultural learning by copying) individuals are more likely to
resemble their neighbours than not. If this (finite) population is
arrayed along one dimension (i.e., along a line), and both cooperators
and defectors are introduced into positions along it at random, then
we get the following dynamics. Isolated cooperators have lower
expected fitness than the surrounding defectors and are driven locally
to extinction. Members of groups of two cooperators have a 50%
probability of interacting with each other, and a 50% probability of
each interacting with a defector. As a result, their average expected
fitness remains smaller than that of their neighbouring defectors, and
they too face probable extinction. Groups of three cooperators form an
unstable point from which both extinction and expansion are equally
likely. However, in groups of four or more cooperators at least one
encounter of a cooperator with a cooperator sufficient to at least
replace the original group is guaranteed. Under this circumstance, the
cooperators as a group do better than the surrounding defectors and
increase at their expense. Eventually cooperators go *almost*
to fixation—but nor quite. Single defectors on the periphery of
the population prey on the cooperators at the ends and survive as
little ‘criminal communities’. We thus see that altruism
can not only be maintained by the dynamics of evolutionary games, but,
with correlation, can even spread and colonize originally
non-altruistic populations.

Darwinian dynamics thus offers qualified good news for cooperation.
Notice, however, that this holds only so long as individuals are stuck
with their natural or cultural programming and can't re-evaluate their
utilities for themselves. If our agents get too smart and flexible,
they may notice that they're in PDs and would each be best off
defecting. In that case, they'll eventually drive themselves to
extinction — unless they develop stable, and effective, moral
norms that work to reinforce cooperation. But, of course, these are
just what we would expect to evolve in populations of animals whose
average fitness levels are closely linked to their capacities for
successful social cooperation. Even given this, these populations will
go extinct unless they care about future generations for some
reason. But there's no rational reason as to why agents
*should* care about future generations if each new generation
wholly replaces the preceding one at each change of cohorts. For this
reason, economists use ‘overlapping generations’ models
when modeling distribution games. Individuals in generation 1 who will
last until generation 5 save resources for the generation 3
individuals with whom they'll want to cooperate; and by generation 3
the new individuals care about generation 6; and so on.

Gintis (2009) argues that when we set out to use evolutionary game theory to unify the behavioral sciences, we begin by using it to unify game theory itself. We have pointed out at several earlier points in the present article that NE and SPE are problematic solution concepts in many applications where explicit institutional rules are missing because agents only have incentives to play NE or SPE to the extent that they are confident that other agents will do likewise. To the extent that agents do not have such confidence — and this, by the way, is itself an insight due to game theory — what should be predicted is general disorder and social confusion. Gintis shows in detail how the key to this problem is the existence of what he calls a ‘choreographer’. By this means some exogenous element that informs agents about which equilibrium strategies they should expect others to play. As discussed in Section 5, cultural norms are probably the most important choreographers for people. Interesting utility functions that incorporate norms of the relevant sort are extensively studied in Bicchieri (2006). In this context, Gintis demonstrates a further unifying element of great importance: if agents attach positive utility to following the choreographer's suggestions (that is, to being strategically correlated with others for the sheer sake of it), then wherever competing potential payoffs do not overwhelm this incentive, agents can also be expected to consistently estimate Bayesian priors, and thus arrive at equilibria-in-beliefs, as discussed in Section 3.1, in games of imperfect information.

In light of this, when we wonder about the value of game-theoretic models in application to human behavior outside of well-structured markets, much hinges on what we take to be plausible and empirically validated sources of people's incentives to be coordinated with one another. This has been a subject of extensive recent debate, which we will review in Section 7.3 below.

## 7. Game Theory and Behavioral Evidence

In earlier sections, we reviewed some problems that arise from treating classical (non-evolutionary) game theory as a normative theory that tells people what they ought to do if they wish to be rational in strategic situations. The difficulty, as we saw, is that there seems to be no one solution concept we can unequivocally recommend for all situations, particularly where agents have private information. However, in the previous section we showed how appeal to evolutionary foundations sheds light on conditions under which utility functions that have been explicitly worked out can plausibly be applied to groups of people, leading to game-theoretic models with plausible and stable solutions. So far, however, we have not reviewed any actual empirical evidence from behavioral observations or experiments. Has game theory indeed helped empirical researchers make new discoveries about behavior (human or otherwise)? If so, what in general has the content of these discoveries been?

In addressing these questions, an immediate epistemological issue
confronts us. There is no way of applying game theory ‘all by
itself’, independently of other modelling technologies. Using
terminology standard in the philosophy of science, one can test a
game-theoretic model of a phenomenon only in tandem with
‘auxiliary assumptions’ about the phenomenon in
question. At least, this follows if one is strict about treating game
theory purely as mathematics, with no empirical content of its own. In
one sense, a theory with no empirical content is never open to testing
at all; one can only worry about whether the axioms on which the
theory is based are mutually consistent. A mathematical theory can
nevertheless be evaluated with respect to empirical
*usefulness*. One kind of philosophical criticism that has
sometimes been made of game theory, interpreted as a mathematical tool
for modelling behavioral phenomena, is that its application always or
usually requires resort to false, misleading or badly simplistic
assumptions about those phenomena. We would expect this criticism to
have different degrees of force in different contexts of application,
as the auxiliary assumptions vary.

So matters turn out. There is no interesting domain in which applications of game theory have been completely uncontroversial. However, there has been generally easier consensus on how to use game theory (both classical and evolutionary) to understand non-human animal behavior than on how to deploy it for explanation and prediction of the strategic activities of people. Let us first briefly consider philosophical and methodological issues that have arisen around application of game theory in non-human biology, before devoting fuller attention to game-theoretic social science.

The least controversial game-theoretic modelling has applied the classical form of the theory to consideration of strategies by which non-human animals seek to acquire the basic resource relevant to their evolutionary tournament: opportunities to produce offspring that are themselves likely to reproduce. In order to thereby maximize their expected fitness, animals must find optimal trade-offs among various intermediate goods, such as nutrition, security from predation and ability to out-compete rivals for mates. Efficient trade-off points among these goods can often be estimated for particular species in particular environmental circumstances, and, on the basis of these estimations, both parametric and non-parametric equilibria can be derived. Models of this sort have an impressive track record in predicting and explaining independent empirical data on such strategic phenomena as competitive foraging, mate selection, nepotism, sibling rivalry,herding, collective anti-predator vigilance and signaling, reciprocal grooming, and interspecific mutuality (symbiosis). (For examples see Krebs and Davies 1984, Bell 1991, Dugatkin and Reeve 1998, Dukas 1998, and Noe, van Hoof and Hammerstein 2001.) On the other hand, as Hammerstein (2003) observes, reciprocity, and its exploitation and metaexploitation, are much more rarely seen in social non-human animals than game-theoretic modeling would lead us to anticipate. One explanation for this suggested by Hammerstein is that non-human animals typically have less ability to restrict their interaction partners than do people. Our discussion in the previous section of the importance of correlation for stabilizing game solutions lends theoretical support to this suggestion.

Why has classical game theory helped to predict non-human animal
behavior more straightforwardly than it has done most human behavior?
The answer is presumed to lie in different levels of complication amongst the
relationships between auxiliary assumptions and phenomena.
Ross (2005a)
offers the following account. Utility-maximization and
fitness-maximization problems are the domain of economics. Economic
theory identifies the maximizing units — economic agents — with
unchanging preference fields. Identification of whole biological
individuals with such agents is more plausible the less cognitively
sophisticated the organism. Thus insects (for example) are tailor-made
for easy application of Revealed Preference Theory (see
Section 2.1).
As nervous systems become more complex, however, we encounter animals
that learn. Learning can cause a sufficient degree of permanent
modification in an animal's behavioral patterns that we can preserve
the identification of the biological individual with a single agent
across the modification only at the cost of explanatory emptiness
(because assignments of utility functions become increasingly ad
hoc). Furthermore, increasing complexity confounds simple modeling on
a second dimension: cognitively sophisticated animals not only change
their preferences over time, but are governed by distributed control
processes that make them sites of competition among *internal*
agents
(Schelling 1980;
Ainslie 1992,
Ainslie 2001). Thus they are not
straightforward economic agents even *at* a time. In setting
out to model the behavior of people using any part of economic theory,
including game theory, we must recognize that the relationship between
any given person and an economic agent we construct for modeling
purposes will always be more complicated than simple identity.

There is of course no sudden crossing point at which an animal
becomes too cognitively sophisticated to be modeled as a single economic agent,
and for all animals (including humans) there are contexts in which we
can usefully ignore the synchronic dimension of complexity. However,
we encounter a phase shift in modeling dynamics when we turn from
asocial animals to non-eusocial social ones. (That is, animals that
are social but that don't, like ants, bees, wasps, termites and naked
mole rats, achieve cooperation thanks to fundamental changes in their
population genetics that make individuals within groups into near
clones. Main known instances are parrots, corvids, bats, rats,
canines, hyenas, pigs, weasels, elephants, hyraxes, cetacians, and
primates.) In their cases stabilization of internal control dynamics
is partly located *outside* the individuals, at the level of
group dynamics. With these creatures, modeling an individual as an
economic agent, with a single comprehensive utility function, is a drastic
idealization, which can only be done with the greatest methodological
caution and attention to specific contextual factors relevant to the
particular modeling exercise. Applications of game theory here can
only be empirically adequate to the extent that the economic modeling
is empirically adequate.

*H. sapiens* is the extreme case in
this respect. Individual humans are socially controlled to a degree
unknown in any other non-eusocial species. At the same time, their
great cognitive plasticity allows them to vary significantly between
cultures. People are thus the least straightforward economic agents
among all organisms. (It might thus be thought ironic that they were
taken, originally and for many years, to be the exemplary instances of
economic agency.) We will consider the implications of this for
applications of game theory below.

First, however, comments are in order concerning the empirical
adequacy of *evolutionary* game theory to explain and predict
distributions of strategic dispositions in populations of agents. Such
modeling is applied both to animals as products of natural selection
(Hofbauer and Sigmund 1998), and to non-eusocial
social animals (but especially humans) as products of cultural
selection (Young 1998). There are two main
kinds of auxiliary assumptions one must justify, relative to a
particular instance at hand, in constructing such applications. First,
one must have grounds for confidence that the dispositions one seeks
to explain are (either biological or cultural, as the case may
be) *adaptations* — that is, dispositions that were
selected and are maintained because of the way in which they promote
their own fitness or the fitness of the wider system, rather than
being accidents or structurally inevitable byproducts of other
adaptations. (See Dennett 1995 for a general
discussion of this issue.) Second, one must be able to set the
modeling enterprise in the context of a justified set of assumptions
about interrelationships among nested evolutionary processes on
different time scales. (For example, in the case of a species with
cultural dynamics, how does slow genetic evolution constrain fast
cultural evolution? How does cultural evolution feed back into genetic
evolution, if it feeds back at all? For a supremely lucid discussion
of these issues, see Sterelny 2003.) Conflicting
views over which such assumptions should be made about human evolution
are the basis for lively current disputes in the evolutionary
game-theoretic modeling of human behavioral dispositions and
institutions. This is where issues in evolutionary game theory meet
issues in the booming field of *behavioral-experimental* game
theory. I will therefore first describe the second field before
closing the present article by giving a sense of the controversies
just alluded to, which now constitute the liveliest domain of
philosophical argument in the foundations of game theory and its
applications.

### 7.1 Game Theory in the Laboratory

Economists have been testing theories by running laboratory experiments with human and other animal subjects since pioneering work by Thurstone (1931). In recent decades, the volume of such work has become positively gigantic. The vast majority of it sets subjects in microeconomic problem environments that are imperfectly competitive. Since this is precisely the condition in which microeconomics collapses into game theory, most experimental economics has been experimental game theory. It is thus difficult to distinguish between experimentally motivated questions about the empirical adequacy of microeconomic theory and questions about the empirical adequacy of game theory.

We can here give only a broad overview of an enormous and complicated
literature. Readers are referred to outstanding surveys in
Kagel and Roth (1995),
Camerer (2003),
Samuelson (2005), and
Guala (2005).
A useful high-level principle for sorting the literature indexes it
to the different auxiliary assumptions with which game-theoretic
axioms are applied. It is often said in popular presentations (e.g.,
Ormerod 1994)
that the experimental data generally refute the hypothesis that
people are rational economic agents. Such claims are too imprecise to
be sustainable interpretations of the results. All data are consistent
with the view that people are *approximate* economic agents, at
least for stretches of time long enough to permit game-theoretic
analysis of particular scenarios, in the minimal sense that their
behavior can be modeled compatibly with Revealed Preference Theory
(see Section 2.1).
However, RPT makes so little in the way of empirical demands that
this is not nearly as surprising as many non-economists suppose
(Ross (2005a).
What is really at issue in many of the debates around the general
interpretation of experimental evidence is the extent to which people
are maximizers of expected utility. As we saw in
Section 3,
expected utility theory (EUT) is generally applied in tandem with
game theory in order to model situations involving uncertainty —
which is to say, most situations of interest in behavioral
science. However, a variety of alternative mathematical accounts of
maximization lend themselves to Von Neumann-Morgenstern
cardinalization of utility; and the empirical adequacy of game theory
would be called into question only if we thought that people's
behavior is not generally describable by means of cardinal VNMufs on a
suitably liberal interpretation of these (i.e., as opposed to a narrow
interpretation in which VNM utility is defined strictly in terms of
EUT).

What the experimental literature truly appears to show is a world of behavior that is very ‘messy’ from the theorist's point of view. The messiness in question arises from enormous heterogeneity, both among people and among (person, situation) vectors. There is no single family of optimization functions such that people act so as to maximize a member of that family in all circumstances. Faced with well-learned problems in contexts that are not unduly demanding, or that are highly institutionally structured people often behave like expected utility maximizers. For general reviews of theoretical issues and evidence, see Smith (2008) and Binmore (2007). For an extended sequence of examples of empirical studies, see the so-called ‘continuous double auction’ experiments discussed in Plott and Smith 1978 and Smith 1962, 1964, 1965, 1976, 1982. As a result, classical game theory can be used in such domains with high reliability to predict behavior and implement public policy, as is demonstrated by the dozens of extremely successful government auctions of utilities and other assets designed by game theorists to increase public revenue (Binmore and Klemperer 2002).

In other contexts, interpreting people's behavior as expected-utility maximizing requires undue violence to the principle of parsimony in theory construction. We get better prediction using fewer assumptions if we suppose that subjects are maximizing according to one of several alternatives (which will not be described here because they are not directly about game theory): a version of prospect theory (Kahneman and Tversky 1979), or alpha-nu utility theory (Chew and MacCrimmon 1979), or expected utility theory with rank-dependent probabilities (Quiggin 1982, Yaari 1987). In general, in testing the empirical usefulness (for studying humans) of game theory in conjunction with some theory of the target of maximization, it is more often the latter than the former that is adjusted to special cases.

A more serious threat to the usefulness of game theory is evidence of
systematic reversal of preferences, in both humans and other
animals. This is more serious both because it extends beyond the human
case, and because it challenges Revealed Preference Theory (RPT)
rather than just EUT. As explained in
Section 2.1,
RPT, unlike EUT, is among the axiomatic foundations of game theory
interpreted non-psychologically. (Not all writers agree that apparent
preference reversal phenomena threaten RPT rather than EUT; but see
the discussions in
Camerer (1995), pp. 660–665, and
Ross (2005a), pp. 177–181.)
A basis for preference reversals that seems to be common in
animals with brains is *hyperbolic discounting of the future*
(Strotz 1956,
Ainslie 1992).
This is the phenomenon whereby agents discount future rewards more
steeply in close temporal distances from the current reference point
than at more remote temporal distances. This is best understood by
contrast with the idea found in most traditional economic models
of *exponential* discounting, in which there is a linear
relationship between the rate of change in the distance to a payoff
and the rate at which the value of the payoff from the reference point
declines. The figure below shows exponential and hyperbolic curves for
the same interval from a reference point to a future payoff. The
bottom one graphs the hyperbolic function; the bowed shape results
from the change in the rate of discounting.

Figure 15

A result of this is that, as later prospects come closer to the point of possible consumption, people and other animals will sometimes spend resources undoing the consequences of previous actions that also cost them resources. For example: deciding today whether to mark a pile of undergraduate essays or watch a baseball game, I procrastinate, despite knowing that by doing so I put out of reach some even more fun possibility that might come up for tomorrow (when there's an equally attractive ball game on if the better option doesn't arise). So far, this is consistent with rational preference: if the world might end tonight, with a tiny but nonzero probability, then there's some level of risk aversion at which I'd rather leave the essays unmarked. The figure below compares two exponential discount curves, the lower one for the value of the game I watch before finishing my marking, and the higher one for the more valuable game I enjoy after completing the job. Both have higher value from the reference point the closer they are to it; but the curves do not cross, so my revealed preferences are consistent over time no matter how impatient I might be.

Figure 16

However, if I bind myself against procrastination by buying a ticket for tomorrow's game, when in the absence of the awful task I wouldn't have done so, then I've violated intertemporal preference consistency. More vividly, had I been in a position to choose last week whether to procrastinate today, I'd have chosen not to. In this case, my discount curve drawn from the reference point of last week crosses the curve drawn from the perspective of today, and my preferences reverse. The figure below shows this situation.

Figure 17

This phenomenon complicates applications of classical game theory to
intelligent animals. However, it clearly doesn't vitiate it
altogether, since people (and other animals) often *don't*
reverse their preferences. (If this weren't true, the successful
auction models and other s-called ‘mechanism designs’ would be
mysterious.) Interestingly, the leading theories that aim to explain
why hyperbolic discounters often behave in accordance with RPT
themselves appeal to game theoretic principles.
Ainslie (1992,
2001)
has produced an account of people as communities of internal
bargaining interests, in which subunits based on short-term,
medium-term and long-term interests face conflict that they must
resolve because if they don't, and instead generate an internal
Hobbesian breakdown
(Section 1),
outside agents who avoid the Hobbesian outcome can ruin them
all. The device of the Hobbesian tyrant is unavailable to the
brain. Therefore, its behavior (when system-level insanity is avoided)
is a sequence of self-enforcing equilibria of the sort studied by
game-theoretic public choice literature on coalitional bargaining in
democratic legislatures. That is, the internal politics of the brain
consists in ‘logrolling’
(Stratmann 1997).
These internal dynamics are then partly regulated and stabilized by
the wider social games in which coalitions (people as wholes over
temporal subparts of their biographies) are embedded
(Ross 2005a ,
pp. 334–353). (For example: social expectations about someone's role
as a salesperson set behavioral equilibrium targets for the logrolling
processes in their brain.) This potentially adds further relevant
elements to the explanation of why and how stable institutions with
relatively transparent rules are key conditions that help people more
closely resemble straightforward economic agents, such that classical
game theory finds reliable application to them as entire units.

One important note of caution is in order for the reader here. Much of
the recent behavioral literature takes for granted that temporally
inconsistent discounting is the standard or default case for
people. However, Andersen *et al* (2008)
show empirically that this arises from (i) assuming that groups of
people are homogenous with respect to which functional forms best
describe their discounting behavior, and (ii) failure to independently
elicit and control for people's differing levels of risk aversion in
estimating their discount functions. In a range of populations that
have been studied with these two considerations in mind, data suggest
that temporally consistent discounting describes substantially higher
proportions of choices than does temporally inconsistent
choices. Over-generalization of hyperbolic discounting models should
thus be avoided.

### 7.2 Neuroeconomics and Game Theory

The idea that game theory can find novel application to the internal
dynamics of brains, as suggested in the previous section, has been
developed from independent motivations by the new research program
known as *neuroeconomics*
(Montague and Berns 2002,
Glimcher 2003,
Ross 2005a, pp. 320–334,
Camerer, Loewenstein and Prelec 2005).
Thanks to new non-invasive scanning technologies, especially
functional magnetic resonance imaging (fMRI), it has recently become
possible to study synaptic activity in working brains while they
respond to controlled cues. This has allowed direct monitoring access
to the brain's computation of expected values of rewards, which are
(naturally) taken to play a crucial role in determining
behavior. Economic theory is used to frame the derivation of the
functions maximized by synaptic-level computation of these expected
values; hence the name ‘neuroeconomics’.

Game theory plays a leading role in neuroeconomics at two levels. First, game theory has been used to predict the computations that individual neurons and groups of neurons serving the reward system must perform. In the best publicized example, Glimcher (2003) and colleagues have fMRI-scanned monkeys they had trained to play so-called ‘inspection games’ against computers. In an inspection game, one player faces a series of choices either to work for a reward, in which case he is sure to receive it, or to perform another, easier action (“shirking”), in which case he will receive the reward only if the other player (the “inspector”) is not monitoring him. Assume that the first player's (the “worker's”) behavior reveals a utility function bounded on each end as follows: he will work on every occasion if the inspector always monitors and he will shirk on every occasion if the inspector never monitors. The inspector prefers to obtain the highest possible amount of work for the lowest possible monitoring rate. In this game, the only NE for both players are in mixed strategies, since any pattern in one player's strategy that can be detected by the other can be exploited. For any given pair of specific utility functions for the two players meeting the constraints described above, any pair of strategies in which, on each trial, either the worker is indifferent between working and shirking or the inspector is indifferent between monitoring and not monitoring, is a NE.

Applying inspection game analyses to pairs or groups of agents
requires us to have *either* independently justified their
utility functions over all variables relevant to their play, in which
case we can define NE and then test to see whether they successfully
maximize expected utility; *or* to assume that they maximize
expected utility, or obey some other rule such as a matching function,
and then infer their utility functions from their behavior. Either
such procedure can be sensible in different empirical contexts. But
epistemological leverage increases greatly if the utility function of
the inspector is exogenously determined, as it often is. (Police
implementing random roadside inspections to catch drunk drivers, for
example, typically have a maximum incidence of drunk driving assigned
to them as a target by policy, and an exogenously set budget. These
determine their utility function, given a distribution of preferences
and attitudes to risk among the population of drivers.) In the case of
Glimcher's experiments the inspector is a computer, so its program is
under experimental control and its side of the payoff matrix is
known. Proxies for the subjects' expected utility, in this case
squirts of fruit juice for the monkeys, can be antecedently determined
in parametric test settings. The computer is then programmed with the
economic model of the monkeys, and can search the data in their
behavior in game conditions for exploitable patterns, varying its
strategy accordingly. With these variables fixed,
expected-utility-maximizing NE behavior by the monkeys can be
calculated and tested by manipulating the computer's utility function
in various runs of the game.

Monkey behavior after training tracks NE very robustly (as does the behavior of people playing similar games for monetary prizes; Glimcher 2003, pp. 307–308). Working with trained monkeys, Glimcher and colleagues could then perform the experiments of significance here. Working and shirking behaviors for the monkeys had been associated by their training with staring either to the right or to the left on a visual display. In earlier experiments, Platt and Glimcher (1999) had established that, in parametric settings, as juice rewards varied from one block of trials to another, firing rates of each parietal neuron that controls eye movements could be trained to encode the expected utility to the monkey of each possible movement relative to the expected utility of the alternative movement. Thus “movements that were worth 0.4 ml of juice were represented twice as strongly [in neural firing probabilities] as movements worth 0.2 ml of juice” (p. 314). Unsurprisingly, when amounts of juice rewarded for each movement were varied from one block of trials to another, firing rates also varied.

Against this background, Glimcher and colleagues could investigate the way in which monkeys' brains implemented the tracking of NE. When the monkeys played the inspection game against the computer, the target associated with shirking could be set at the optimal location, given the prior training, for a specific neuron under study, while the work target would appear at a null location. This permitted Glimcher to test the answer to the following question: did the monkeys maintain NE in the game by keeping the firing rate of the neuron constant while the actual and optimal behavior of the monkey as a whole varied? The data robustly gave the answer ‘yes’. Glimcher reasonably interprets these data as suggesting that neural firing rates, at least in this cortical region for this task, encode expected utility in both parametric and nonparametric settings. Here we have an apparent vindication of the empirical applicability of classical game theory in a context independent of institutions or social conventions.

Further analysis pushed the hypothesis deeper. The computer playing Inspector was presented with the same sequence of outcomes as its monkey opponent had received on the previous day's play, and for each move was asked to assess the relative expected values of the shirking and working actions available on the next move. Glimcher reports a positive correlation between small fluctuations around the stable NE firing rates in the individual neuron and the expected values estimated by the computer trying to track the same NE. Glimcher comments on this finding as follows:

The neurons seemed to be reflecting, on a play-by-play basis, a computation close to the one performed by our computer … [A]t a … [relatively] … microscopic scale, we were able to use game theory to begin to describe the decision-by-decision computations that the neurons in area LIP were performing. (Glimcher 2003, p. 317)

Thus we find game theory reaching beyond its traditional role as a
technology for framing high-level constraints on evolutionary dynamics
or on behavior by well-informed agents operating in institutional
straightjackets. In Glimcher's hands, it is used to directly model
activity in a monkey's brain.
Ross (2005a)
argues that groups of neurons thus modeled should not be identified
with the sub-personal game-playing units found in Ainslie's theory of
intra-personal bargaining described earlier; that would involve a kind
of straightforward reduction that experience in the behavioral and
life science has taught us not to expect. This issue has since arisen
in a direct dispute between neuroeconomists over rival interpretations
of fMRI observations of intertemporal choice and discounting
(McClure *et al*.
2004), Glimcher *et al*. 2007). The
weight of evidence so far favors the view that if it is sometimes
useful to analyze people's choices as equilibria in games amongst
sub-personal agents, the sub-personal agents in question should not be
identified with separate brain areas. The opposite interpretation is
unfortunately still most common in less specialized literature.

We have now seen the first level at which neuroeconomics applies game theory. A second level arises thanks to new research methodology developed by Read Montague's team centered at Baylor College of Medicine. As described earlier in this section, the majority of work in experimental/behavioral economics has involved studying subjects while they play games. Initial technical constraints imposed by the fMRI technology prevented analysts from being able to compare inter-personal brain data when subjects are asked to replicate these games under neuroimaging. The problem is that the brain doesn't necessarily (or even typically) perform the same task using exactly the same neural resources from one occasion to the next in a single brain, let alone from one brain to another. One thus cannot simply aggregate independent observations under generalizations that link types of behavior and their neural signatures. That is, one cannot first scan a subject playing one strategic position in a game, then scan a person in the next strategic position in a repetition of the game, and so on iteratively, all with a view to assembling a post hoc picture of the brains in interaction. Rather, the interaction itself must be directly scanned if one wants an aggregated neural image of a game. However, only one person at a time fits without extreme discomfort into a scanning capsule. Montague and colleagues have addressed this problem by developing what they call ‘hyperscanning’ software that allows two computers linked to separate scanners to jointly calibrate the data. Since the computers need only be virtually linked, this allows researchers to run experimental games with geographically separated subjects under scanning. Thirty years worth of results in experimental game theory thus stand waiting for re-interpretation under the discipline of a powerful new dimension of empirical measurement. Where formerly we could only conjecture up to the limits of behavioral discrimination which strategies agents implemented under various game conditions, we now look forward to the prospect of literally watching strategic computations as they are carried out.

An early instance of this kind of work is
King-Casas *et al*. (2005).
They took a standard protocol from behavioral game theory, the
so-called ‘trust’ game, and implemented it with subjects
under hyper-scanning. This game involves two players. In its repeated
format as used in the King-Casas *et al*. experiment, the first
player is designated the ‘investor’ and the second the
‘trustee’. The investor begins with $20, of which she can
keep any portion of her choice while investing the remainder with the
trustee. In the trustee's hands the invested amount is tripled by the
experimenter. The trustee may then return as much or as little of this
profit to the investor as he deems fit. The procedure is run for ten
rounds, with players' identities kept anonymous from one another.

This game has an infinite number of NE. Previous data from behavioral
economics are consistent with the claim that the modal NE in human
play *approximates* both players using
‘Tit-for-tat’ strategies (see
Section 4)
modified by occasional defections to probe for information, and some
post-defection cooperation that manifests (limited) toleration of such
probes. This is a very weak result, since it is compatible with a wide
range of hypotheses on exactly which variations of Tit-for-tat are
used and sustained, and thus licenses no inferences about potential
dynamics under different learning conditions, institutions, or
cross-cultural transfers.

When they ran this game under hyperscanning, the King-Casas and Montague group obtained the following results. Neurons in the trustee's caudate nucleus (generally thought to implement computations or outputs of midbrain dopaminergic systems) showed strong response when investors benevolently reciprocated trust — that is, responded to defection with increased generosity. As the game progressed, these responses shifted from being reactionary to being anticipatory. Thus reputational profiles as predicted by classical game-theoretic models were observed being constructed directly by the brain. A further aspect of play not predictable by theoretical modeling alone, and which purely behavioral observation had not been sufficient to discriminate, is that responses by the caudate neurons to malevolent reciprocity — reduced generosity in response to cooperation — were significantly smaller in amplitude. This may be the mechanism by which the brain implements modification of Tit-for-tat so as to prevent occasional defections for informational probing from unravelling cooperation permanently. The fact that these differences in response levels can be quantitatively measured suggest that, once more data from variations (including cross-cultural variations) on the experiment are in hand, we may come to know in detail which strategies people are disposed use in trust games under different conditions. As noted previously, purely behavioral evidence underdetermines this knowledge, merely ruling out strategies inconsistent with observed equilibria.

The advance in understanding promised by this sort
of investigation mainly consists not in what it tells us about
particular types of games, but rather in comparative inferences it
facilitates about the ways in which contextual framing influences
people's conjectures about which games they're playing. fMRI probes
enable us to quantitatively estimate degrees of strategic
*surprise*. This is a highly portentous new source of leverage
for the empirical application of game theory. Note that reciprocally
interacting expectations about surprise may themselves be subject to
strategic manipulation, but this is an idea that has barely begun to
be theoretically explored by game theorists (see
Ross and Dumouchel 2004).
That we now have the prospect of empirically testing such new
theories, as opposed to just hypothetically modeling them, should
stimulate their development.

### 7.3 Game Theoretic Models of Human Nature

The developments reviewed in the previous section bring us up to the
moving frontier of experimental / behavioral applications of classical
game theory. We can now return to the branch point left off several
paragraphs back, where this stream of investigation meets that coming
from evolutionary game theory. There is no serious doubt that, by
comparison to other non-eusocial animals —including our nearest
relatives, chimpanzees and bonobos — humans achieve prodigious
feats of coordination (see
Section 4)
(Tomasello *et al*. 2004).
A lively controversy, with important philosophical implications and
fought on both sides with game-theoretic arguments, currently rages
over the question of whether this capacity can be wholly explained by
cultural adaptation, or is better explained by inference to a genetic
change early in the career of *H. sapiens*.

Henrich *et al*.
(2004,
2005)
have run a series of experimental games with populations drawn from
fifteen small-scale human societies in South America, Africa, and
Asia, including three groups of foragers, six groups of slash-and-burn
horticulturists, four groups of nomadic herders, and two groups of
small-scale agriculturists. The games (Ultimatum, Dictator, Public
Goods) they implemented all place subjects in situations broadly
resembling that of the Trust game discussed in the previous
section. That is, Ultimatum and Public Goods games are scenarios in
which social welfare can be maximized, and each individual's welfare
maximized (Pareto efficiency achieved) if and only if at least some
players use strategies that are not sub-game perfect equilibrium
strategies (see
Section 2.6).
In Dictator games, a narrowly selfish first mover would capture all
available profits. Thus in each of the three game types, SPE players
who cared only about their own monetary welfare would get outcomes
that would involve highly inegalitarian payoffs. In none of the
societies studied by Henrich *et al*. (or any other society in
which games of this sort have been run) are such outcomes
observed. The players whose roles are such that they would take away
all but epsilon of the monetary profits if they and their partners
played SPE always offered the partners substantially more than
epsilon, and even then partners sometimes refused such offers at the
cost of receiving no money. Furthermore, unlike the traditional
subjects of experimental economics — university students in
industrialized countries — Henrich *et al*.'s subjects
did not even play *Nash* equilibrium strategies with respect to
monetary payoffs. (That is, strategically advantaged players offered
larger profit splits to strategically disadvantaged ones than was
necessary to induce agreement to their offers.) Henrich *et
al*. interpret these results by suggesting that all actual people,
unlike ‘rational economic man’, value egalitarian outcomes
to some extent. However, their experiments also show that this extent
varies significantly with culture, and is correlated with variations
in two specific cultural variables: typical payoffs to cooperation
(the extent to which economic life in the society depends on
cooperation with non-immediate kin) and aggregate market integration
(a construct built out of independently measured degrees of social
complexity, anonymity, privacy, and settlement size). As the values of
these two variables increase, game behavior shifts (weakly) in the
direction of Nash equilibrium play. Thus the researchers conclude that
people are genetically endowed with preferences for egalitarianism,
but that the relative weight of these preferences is programmable by
social learning processes conditioned on local cultural cues.

In evaluating Henrich *et al*.'s interpretation of these data, we
should first note that the axioms defining ‘rational economic
man’, which are incorporated into game theory in the way
discussed in
Section 2.1,
do not include the property of selfishness. (See
Ross (2005a) ch. 4;
Binmore (2005b) and (2009);
and any economics or game theory text that lets the mathematics do
the talking and doesn't insist on ‘spinning’ it in one
idealogical direction or another.) Orthodox game theory thus does not
predict that people will play SPE or NE strategies derived by treating
monetary payoffs as equivalent to utility.
Binmore (2005b)
is therefore justified in taking Henrich *et al*. to task over
their fashionable rhetoric suggesting that their empirical work
embarrasses orthodox theory. It does not.

This is not to suggest that the anthropological interpretation of the
empirical results should be taken as uncontroversial.
Binmore (1994,
1998,
2005a,
2005b)
has argued for many years, based on a wide range of behavioral data,
that when people play games with non-relatives they tend to learn to
play Nash equilibrium with respect to utility functions that
approximately correspond to income functions. As he points out in
Binmore (2005b),
Henrich *et al*.'s data do not test this hypothesis for their
small-scale societies, because their subjects were not exposed to the
test games for the (quite long, in the case of the Ultimatum game)
learning period that theoretical and computational models suggest are
required for people to converge on NE. When people play unfamiliar
games, they tend to model them by reference to games they are used to
in everyday experience. In particular, they tend to play one-shot
laboratory games as though they were familiar *repeated* games,
since one-shot games are rare in normal social life outside of special
institutional contexts. Many of the interpretive remarks made by
Henrich *et al*. are consistent with this hypothesis concerning
their subjects, though they nevertheless explicitly reject the hypothesis
itself. What is controversial here — the issues of spin around
‘orthodox' theory aside — is less about what the
particular subjects in this experiment were doing than about what
their behavior should lead us to infer about human evolution.

Gintis (2004), (2009) argues
that data of the sort we have been discussing support the following
conjecture about human evolution. Our ancestors were pure maximizers
of individual fitness. Somewhere along the evolutionary line these
ancestors arrived in circumstances where enough of them maximized
their individual fitness by maximizing that of their group
(Sober and Wilson 1998) that a genetic
modification went to fixation in the species: we developed preferences
not just over our own individual welfare, but over the relative
welfare of all members of our communities, indexed to social
norms *programmable* in each individual by cultural
learning. Thus the contemporary researcher applying game theory to
model a social situation is advised to unearth her subjects' utility
functions by (i) finding out what community (or communities) they are
members of, and then (ii) inferring the utility function(s) programmed
into members of that community (communities) by studying
representatives of each relevant community in a range of games and
assuming that the outcomes are coordinated equilibria. Since the
utility functions are the dependent variables here, the games must be
independently determined. We can typically hold at least the strategic
forms of the relevant games fixed, Gintis supposes, by virtue of (a)
our confidence that people prefer egalitarian outcomes, all else being
equal, to inegalitarian ones within the culturally evolved
‘insider groups’ to which they perceive themselves as
belonging and (b) a requirement that game equilibria are drawn from
stable attractors in plausible evolutionary game-theoretic models of
the culture's historical dynamics.

Requirement (b) as a constraint on game-theoretic modeling of general
human strategic dispositions is no longer very controversial —
or, at least, is no more controversial than the generic adaptationism
in evolutionary anthropology of which it is one expression. However,
some commentators are skeptical of Gintis's suggestion that there was
a genetic discontinuity in the evolution of human sociality. (For a
cognitive-evolutionary anthropology that explicitly denies such
discontinuity, see
Sterelny 2003.)
Based partly on such skepticism (but more directly on behavioral
data)
Binmore (2005a,
2005b)
resists modeling people as having built-in preferences for
egalitarianism. According to
Binmore's (1994,
1998,
2005a)
model,the basic class of strategic problems facing non-eusocial
social animals are coordination games. Human communities evolve
cultural norms to select equilibria in these games, and many of these
equilibria will be compatible with high levels of apparently
altruistic behavior in some (but not all) games. Binmore argues that
people adapt their conceptions of fairness to whatever happen to be
their locally prevailing equilibrium selection rules. However, he
maintains that the *dynamic* development of such norms must be
compatible, in the long run, with bargaining equilibria among
self-regarding individuals. Indeed, he argues that as societies evolve
institutions that encourage what Henrich *et al*. call
aggregate market integration (discussed above), their utility
functions and social norms tend to converge on self-regarding economic
rationality with respect to welfare. This does not mean that Binmore
is pessimistic about the prospects for egalitarianism: he develops a
model showing that societies of rational bargainers can be pulled
naturally along dynamically stable equilibrium paths towards norms of
distribution corresponding to Rawlsian justice
(Rawls 1971).
The principal barriers to such evolution, according to Binmore, are
precisely the kinds of other-regarding preferences that conservatives
valorize as a way of discouraging examination of more egalitarian
bargaining equilibria that are within reach along societies'
equilibrium paths.

Resolution of this debate between Gintis and Binmore fortunately need
not wait upon discoveries about the deep human evolutionary past that
we may never have. The models make rival empirical predictions of some
testable phenomena. If Gintis is right then there are limits, imposed
by the discontinuity in hominid evolution, on the extent to which
people can learn to be self-regarding. This is the main significance
of the controversy discussed above over Henrich *et al*.'s
interpretation of their field data. Binmore's model of social
equilibrium selection also depends, unlike Gintis's, on widespread
dispositions among people to inflict second-order punishment on
members of society who fail to sanction violators of social norms.
Gintis (2005)
shows using a game theory model that this is implausible if
punishment costs are significant. However,
Ross (2005b)
argues that the widespread assumption in the literature that
punishment of norm-violation must be costly results from failure to
adequately distinguish between models of the original evolution of
sociality, on the one hand, and models of the maintenance and
development of norms and institutions once an initial set of them has
stabilized. Finally, Ross also points out that Binmore's objectives
are as much normative as descriptive: he aims to show egalitarians how
to diagnose the errors in conservative rationalisations of the status
quo without calling for revolutions that put equilibrium path
stability (and, therefore, social welfare) at risk. It is a sound
principle in constructing reform proposals that they should be
‘knave-proof’ (as Hume put it), that is, should be
compatible with less altruism than *might* prevail in
people. Thus, despite the fact that the majority of researchers
working on game-theoretic foundations of social organization presently
appear to side with Gintis and the other members of the Henrich *et
al*. team, Binmore's alternative model has some strong
considerations in its favor. Here, then, is another issue along the
frontier of game theory application awaiting resolution in the years
to come.

An enormous range of further applications of both classical and evolutionary game theory have been developed, but we have hopefully now provided enough to convince the reader of the tremendous, and constantly expanding, utility of this analytical tool. The reader whose appetite for more has been aroused should find that she now has sufficient grasp of fundamentals to be able to work through the large literature, of which some highlights are listed below.

## Bibliography

### Annotations

In the following section, books and articles which no one seriously interested in game theory can afford to miss are marked with (**).

The most accessible textbook that covers all of the main branches of game theory is Dixit, Skeath and Reiley (2009). A student entirely new to the field should work through this before moving on to anything else.

Game theory has countless applications, of which this article has been able to suggest only a few. Readers in search of more, but not wishing to immerse themselves in mathematics, can find a number of good sources. Dixit and Nalebuff (1991) and (2008) are especially strong on political and social examples. McMillan (1991) emphasizes business applications.

The great historical breakthrough that officially launched game theory is von Neumann and Morgenstern (1944), which those with scholarly interest in game theory should read with classic papers of John Nash (1950a, 1950b, 1951). A very useful collection of key foundational papers, all classics, is Kuhn (1997). For a contemporary mathematical treatment that is unusually philosophically sophisticated, Binmore (2005c) (**) is in a class by itself. The second half of Kreps (1990) (**) is the best available starting point for a tour of the philosophical worries surrounding equilibrium selection for normativists. Koons (1992) takes these issues further. Fudenberg and Tirole (1991) remains the most thorough and complete mathematical text available. Gintis (2000) (**) has provided a text crammed with terrific problem exercises, which is also unique in that it treats evolutionary game theory as providing the foundational basis for game theory in general. Recent developments in fundamental theory are well represented in Binmore, Kirman and Tani (1993).

The philosophical foundations of the basic game-theoretic concepts as economists understand them are presented in LaCasse and Ross (1994). Ross and LaCasse (1995) outline the relationships between games and the axiomatic assumptions of microeconomics and macroeconomics. Philosophical puzzles at this foundational level are critically discussed in Bicchieri (1993) (**). Lewis (1969) puts game-theoretic equilibrium concepts to wider application in philosophy, though making some technically incorrect foundational assumptions. His program is carried a good deal further, and without repeating the foundational errors, by Skyrms (1996) (**) and (2004). (See also Nozick [1998].) Gauthier (1986) launches a literature not surveyed in this article, in which the possibility of game-theoretic foundations for contractarian ethics is investigated. This work is critically surveyed in Vallentyne (1991), and extended into a dynamic setting in Danielson (1992). Binmore (1994, 1998) (**), however, effectively demolishes this project. Philosophers will also find Hollis (1998) to be of interest.

In a class by themselves for insight, originality, readability and cross-disciplinary importance are the works of the Nobel laureate Thomas Schelling. He is the fountainhead of the huge literature that applies game theory to social and political issues of immediate relevance, and shows how lightly it is possible to wear one's mathematics if the logic is sufficiently sure-footed. There are four volumes, all essential: Schelling (1960) (**), Schelling (1978 / 2006) (**), Schelling (1984) (**), Schelling (2006) (**).

Hardin (1995) is one of many examples of the application of game theory to problems in applied political theory. Baird, Gertner and Picker (1994) review uses of game theory in legal theory and jurisprudence. Mueller (1997) surveys applications in political economy. Ghemawat (1997) does the same in business strategy. Poundstone (1992) provides a lively history of the Prisoner's Dilemma and its use by Cold War strategists. Durlauf and Young (2001) is a good collection on applications to social structures and social change.

Evolutionary game theory owes its explicit genesis to Maynard Smith (1982) (**). For a text that integrates game theory directly with biology, see Hofbauer and Sigmund (1998) (**). Sigmund (1993) presents this material in a less technical and more accessible format. Some exciting applications of evolutionary game theory to a range of philosophical issues, on which this article has drawn heavily, is Skyrms (1996) (**). These issues and others are critically discussed from various angles in Danielson (1998). Mathematical foundations for evolutionary games are presented in Weibull (1995), and pursued further in Samuelson (1997). As noted above, Gintis (2000) (**) now provides an introductory textbook that takes evolutionary modeling to be foundational to all of game theory. H.P. Young (1998) gives sophisticated models of the evolutionary dynamics of cultural norms through the game-theoretic interactions of agents with limited cognitive capacities but dispositions to imitate one another. Fudenberg and Levine (1998) gives the technical foundations for modeling of this kind.

Many philosophers will also be interested in Binmore (1994 1998, 2005a) (**), which shows that application of game-theoretic analysis can underwrite a Rawlsian conception of justice that does not require recourse to Kantian presuppositions about what rational agents would desire behind a veil of ignorance concerning their identities and social roles. (In addition, Binmore offers excursions into a vast range of other issues both central and peripheral to both the foundations and the frontiers of game theory; these books are a tour de force.) And almost everyone will be interested in Frank (1988) (**), where evolutionary game theory is used to illuminate basic features of human nature and emotion; though readers of this are also directed to criticism of Frank's model in Ross and Dumouchel (2004).

Behavioral and experimental applications of game theory are surveyed in Kagel and Roth (1995). Camerer (2003) (**) is a comprehensive study of this literature (that also brings it up to date), and cannot be missed by anyone interested in these issues. A shorter survey that emphasizes philosophical and methodological criticism is Samuelson (2005). Philosophical foundations are also carefully examined in Guala (2005).

Two volumes from leading theorists that offer comprehensive views on the philosophical foundations of game theory were published in 2009. These are Binmore (2009) (**) and Gintis (2009) (**). Both are indispensible to any new interventions on the subject.

A recent volume of interviews with nineteen leading game theorists, eliciting their views on motivations and foundational topics, is Hendricks and Hansen (2007).

Game-theoretic dynamics of the sub-person receive fascinating, and accessible, discussion in Ainslie (2001). Seminal texts in neuroeconomics, with extensive use of and implications for behavioral game theory, are Montague and Berns (2002), Glimcher 2003 (**), and Camerer, Loewenstein and Prelec (2005). Ross (2005a) studies the game-theoretic foundations of microeconomics in general, but especially behavioral economics and neuroeconomics, from the perspective of cognitive science.

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## Other Internet Resources

- History of Game Theory
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### Acknowledgments

I would like to thank James Joyce and Edward Zalta for their comments on the various versions — now up to four — of this entry. I would also like to thank Sam Lazell for not only catching a nasty patch of erroneous analysis in the second version, but going to the superogatory trouble of actually providing fully corrected reasoning. If there were many such readers, all authors in this project would become increasingly collective over time. One of my MBA students, Anthony Boting, noticed that my solution to an example I used in the second version rested on equivocating between relative-frequency and objective-chance interpretations of probability. Two readers, Brian Ballsun-Stanton and George Mucalov, spotted this too and were kind enough to write to me about it. Many thanks to them. Joel Guttman pointed out that I'd illustrated a few principles with some historical anecdotes that circulate in the game theory community, but told them in a way that was too credulous with respect to their accuracy. Michel Benaim and Mathius Grasselli noted that I'd identified the wrong Plato text as the source of Socrates's reflections on soldiers' incentives. Ken Binmore picked up another factual error while the third revision was in preparation, as a result of which no one else ever saw it. Not so for a mistake found by Bob Galesloot that survived in the article all the way into the third edition. (That error was corrected in July 2010.) Some other readers helpfully spotted typos: thanks to Fabian Ottjes, Brad Colbourne, Nicholas Dozet and Gustavo Narez. Nelleke Bak, my in-house graphics guru (and spouse) drew all figures except 15, 16, and 17, which were generously contributed by George Ainslie. My thanks to her and him. Finally, thanks go to Colin Allen for technical support (in the effort to deal with bandwidth problems to South Africa) prior to publication of the second version of this entry, and to Daniel McKenzie for procedural advice on preparation of the third version.