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Jürgen Habermas currently ranks as one of the most influential philosophers in the world. Bridging continental and Anglo-American traditions of thought, he has engaged in debates with thinkers as diverse as Gadamer and Putnam, Foucault and Rawls, Derrida and Brandom. His extensive written work addresses topics stretching from social-political theory to aesthetics, epistemology and language to philosophy of religion, and his ideas have significantly influenced not only philosophy but also political-legal thought, sociology, communication studies, argumentation theory and rhetoric, developmental psychology and theology. Moreover, he has figured prominently in Germany as a public intellectual, commenting on controversial issues of the day in German newspapers such as Die Zeit.
However, if one looks back over his corpus of work, one can discern two broad lines of enduring interest, one having to do with the political domain, the other with issues of rationality, communication, and knowledge. (In what follows, unnamed citations refer to works by Habermas; quotations are from the English editions, where available.)
- 1. The Early Development Of Habermas's Interest In The Public Sphere And Reason
- 2. Important Transitional Works
- 3. Mature Positions
- 4. The Dialogue between Naturalism and Religion
- Academic Tools
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- Related Entries
Born outside Düsseldorf in 1929, Habermas came of age in postwar Germany. The Nuremberg Trials were a key formative moment that brought home to him the depth of Germany's moral and political failure under National Socialism. This experience was later reinforced when, as a graduate student interested in Heidegger's existentialism, he read the latter's reissued Introduction to Metaphysics, in which Heidegger had retained (or more accurately, reintroduced) an allusion to the “inner truth and greatness” of National Socialism (Heidegger 1959, 199). When Habermas (1953) publicly called for an explanation from Heidegger, the latter's silence confirmed Habermas's conviction that the German philosophical tradition had failed in its moment of reckoning, providing intellectuals with the resources neither to understand nor to criticize National Socialism. This negative experience of the relation between philosophy and politics subsequently motivated his search for conceptual resources from Anglo-American thought, particularly its pragmatic and democratic traditions. In moving outside the German tradition, Habermas joined a number of young postwar intellectuals such as Karl-Otto Apel (for Habermas's autobiographical sketch, see 2005b, chap. 1; also Wiggershaus 2004).
Habermas completed his dissertation in 1954 at the University of Bonn, writing on the conflict between the absolute and history in Schelling's thought. He first gained serious public attention, at least in Germany, with the 1962 publication of his habilitation, Strukturwandel der Öffentlichkeit (Structural Transformation of the Public Sphere; English ed., 1989), a detailed social history of the development of the bourgeois public sphere from its origins in the 18th century salons up to its transformation through the influence of capital-driven mass media. In his description of the salons we clearly see his interest in a communicative ideal that later would provide the core normative standard for his moral-political theory: the idea of inclusive critical discussion, free of social and economic pressures, in which interlocutors treat each other as equals in a cooperative attempt to reach an understanding on matters of common concern. As an ideal at the center of bourgeois culture, this kind of interchange was probably never fully realized; nonetheless, it “was not mere ideology” (1989, 160, also 36). As these small discussion societies grew into mass publics in the 19th century, however, ideas became commodities, assimilated to the economics of mass media consumption. Rather than give up on the idea of public reason, Habermas called for a socioinstitutionally feasible concept of public opinion-formation “that is historically meaningful, that normatively meets the requirements of the social-welfare state, and that is theoretically clear and empirically identifiable.” Such a concept “can be grounded only in the structural transformation of the public sphere itself and in the dimension of its development” (ibid., 244). His concluding sketch of such a concept (ibid., 244–48) already contains in outline the two-level model of democratic deliberation he later elaborates in his mature work on law and democracy, Between Facts and Norms (1996b; German ed., 1992b).
Habermas's interest in the political subsequently led him to a series of philosophical studies and critical-social analyses that eventually appeared in English in his Toward a Rational Society (1970) and Theory and Practice (1973b). Whereas the latter consists primarily of reflections on the history of philosophy, the former represents an attempt to apply his emerging theory of rationality to the critical analysis of contemporary society, in particular the student protest movement and its institutional target, the authoritarian and technocratic structures that held sway in higher education and politics.
Habermas's critical reflection takes a nuanced approach to both sides of the social unrest that characterized the late sixties. Although sympathetic with students' demand for more democratic participation and hopeful that their activism harbored a potential for positive social transformation, he also did not hesitate to criticize its militant aspects, which he labeled self-delusory and “pernicious” (1970, 48). In his critique of technocracy—governance by scientific experts and bureaucracy—he relied on a philosophical framework that anticipates categories in his later thought, minus the philosophy of language he would work out in the 1970s. Specifically, Habermas sharply distinguished between two modes of action, “work” and “interaction,” which correspond to enduring interests of the human species (ibid., chap. 6). The former includes modes of action based on the rational choice of efficient means, that is, forms of instrumental and strategic action, whereas the latter refers to forms of “communicative action” in which actors coordinate their behaviors on the basis of “consensual norms” (ibid., 91–92). Habermas's distinction in effect appropriates the classical Aristotelian contrast between techne and praxis for critical social theory (1973b, chap. 1). The result is a distinctively Habermasian critique of science and technology as ideology: by reducing practical questions about the good life to technical problems for experts, contemporary elites eliminate the need for public, democratic discussion of values, thereby depoliticizing the population (1970, chap. 6). The legitimate human interest in technical control of nature thus functions as an ideology—a screen that masks the value-laden character of government decisionmaking in the service of the capitalist status quo. Unlike Herbert Marcuse, who regarded that interest as specific to capitalist society, Habermas affirmed the technical control of nature as a genuinely universal species-interest; pace Horkheimer and Adorno in their Dialectic of Enlightenment, the technical interest did not necessitate social domination.
Habermas defended this philosophical anthropology most fully in his Knowledge and Human Interests (1971b; German ed., 1968b), the work that represents his first attempt to provide a systematic framework for an interdisciplinary critical social theory. As Habermas conceived his task, he had to establish critical social theory as a respectable, distinct form of knowledge, in large measure through a methodological critique of the then-dominant positivist philosophy of science and historicist hermeneutics. He thus develops a theory of “knowledge-constitutive interests” that are tied both to “the natural history of the human species” and to “the imperatives of the socio-cultural form of life,” but are not reducible to them (ibid., 168).
There are three knowledge-constitutive interests, each rooted in human existence and expressed in a particular type of scientific or scholarly inquiry. The first is the “technical interest,” the “anthropologically deep-seated interest” we have in the prediction and control of the natural environment. This interest structures modes of inquiry and knowledge-production in the “empirical-analytic” sciences, that is, the natural sciences and types of social science that aim at testable general explanations (in contrast to the interpretive social sciences, which aim at cultural understanding, and the “normative-analytic” sciences, such as rational choice theory, which rely on formal modeling and deduction based on counterfactual axioms; see 1988a, 43ff). As a deep-seated structure constitutive of knowledge, the technical “interest” refers not to the motivations of scientists or specific disciplinary aims, but rather to a way of approaching nature and society as objects of possible knowledge: in tying knowledge-production to controlled observation and methodical experimentation, the empirical-analytic sciences deploy basic species-capacities to master the natural world via feedback-monitored instrumental action. To be sure, Habermas's analysis relies heavily on a hypothetico-deductive model that was in serious trouble even as he wrote. But his core idea is arguably broader in scope: the empirical-analytic sciences are distinguished by their treatment of the object domain as governed by predictable law-like regularities that allow for certain types of methodologically controlled techniques of inquiry that would be inappropriate for the interpretive sciences. Thus the technical interest applies not only to sciences that promise technological benefits, but also to sciences like paleontology.
The interpretive, or cultural-hermeneutic sciences, rest on a second, equally deep-seated “practical interest” in securing and expanding possibilities of mutual and self-understanding in the conduct of life. These sciences presuppose and articulate modes of action-orienting (inter)personal understanding that operate within socio-cultural forms of life and the grammar of ordinary language. Human societies depend on such understanding, and the interpretive competences that go with it, just as much as they depend on mastering the natural environment. The hermeneutic sciences, then, bring methodical discipline to features of everyday interaction, and in that sense are on a par with the empirical-analytic sciences, which elevate everyday instrumental action to experimental method. By making these first two cognitive interests explicit, Habermas seeks to go beyond positivist accounts of the natural and social sciences. On his view, those accounts tend to ignore the role that deep-seated human interests play in the constitution of possible objects of inquiry.
In making cognitive interests explicit, Habermas also engages in a kind of critical self-reflection, more precisely a methodological reflection that aims to free science from its positivist illusions. Such reflection exemplifies the third cognitive interest, the emancipatory interest of reason in overcoming dogmatism, compulsion, and domination. For scientific expressions of this interest, he looked to Freudian psychology and a version of Marxist social theory. The status of the emancipatory interest, however, was problematic from the start, for it conflated two kinds of critical reflection. Whereas his critique of positivism and theory of cognitive interests involve reflective articulation of the formal structures of knowledge, Freudian and Marxist critique aim to unmask concrete cases of personal self-deception and social-political ideology (1973cd). Nor was it clear that psychoanalysis provided an apt model of liberatory reflection in any case, as critics pointed out how the asymmetries between patient and analyst could not represent the proper intersubjective form for emancipation. These and other deficits of his analysis posed a challenge for Habermas that would guide a decade-long search for the normative and empirical basis of critique. Whatever the best path to the epistemic and normative basis for critique might be, it would have to pass a democratic test: that “in Enlightenment there are only participants” (1973b, 44). Habermas will not resolve this methodological issue until a series of transitional studies in the 1970s culminates in his mature systematic work, The Theory of Communicative Action (1984a/1987; German ed., 1981; hereafter cited as TCA).
That said, we can discern enduring features in Habermas's early attempt at a comprehensive model of social criticism. As a theory of rationality and knowledge, his theory of knowledge-constitutive interests is both pragmatic and pluralistic: pragmatic, inasmuch as human interests constitute knowledge; pluralistic, in that different forms of inquiry and knowledge emerge from different core interests. In Knowledge and Human Interests we can thus see the beginnings of a methodologically pluralistic approach to critical social theory, more on which below. Besides the problems described above, however, the analysis was hampered by a framework that still relied on motifs from a “philosophy of consciousness” fixated on the constitution of objects of possible experience—an approach that cannot do justice to the discursive dimensions of inquiry (1973cd; 2000; also Müller-Doohm 2000). In the 1970s Habermas set about a fundamental overhaul of his framework for critical theory (see McCarthy 1978).
In the period between Knowledge and Human Interests and The Theory of Communicative Action, Habermas began to develop a distinctive method for elaborating the relationship between a theoretical social science of modern societies, on the one hand, and the normative and philosophical basis for critique, on the other. Following Horkheimer's definition of Critical Theory, Habermas pursued three aims in his attempt to combine social science and philosophical analysis: it must be at once explanatory, practical, and normative. This meant that philosophy could not, as it did for Kant, become the sole basis for normative reflection. Rather, Habermas argued, adequate critique requires a thoroughgoing cooperation between philosophy and social science. This sort of analysis is characteristic of Legitimation Crisis (1975; German ed., 1973e), in which Habermas analyzes the modern state as subject to endemic crises, which arise from the fact that the state cannot simultaneously meet the demands for rational problem solving, democracy, and cultural identity. Here the social science to which Habermas appeals is more sociological and functional. Similarly, in this work and in Communication and the Evolution of Society (1979), Habermas begins to develop a distinctive conception of rational reconstruction, which models societal development as a learning process. In these works, Habermas begins to incorporate the results of developmental psychology, which aligns stages of development with changes in the kinds of reasons that the maturing individual considers acceptable. Analogously, societies develop through similar changes in the rational basis of legitimacy on the collective level. At this point in his theorizing, Habermas's appropriation of the social sciences has become methodologically and theoretically pluralistic: on his view, a critical social theory is not distinctive in light of endorsing some particular theory or method but as uniting normative and empirical inquiry.
In this transitional phase from Knowledge and Human Interests to The Theory of Communicative Action, Habermas's basic philosophical endeavor was to develop a more modest, fallibilist, empirical account of the philosophical claim to universality and rationality. This more modest approach moves Critical Theory away from its strong transcendental framework, exemplified in the theory of cognitive interests with the unmistakably Kantian language of object-constitution. In setting that earlier project aside, Habermas adopts a more naturalistic, “postmetaphysical” approach (1992a), characterized by the fallible hermeneutic explication or "reconstruction" of shared competences and normative presuppositions that allow actors to engage in familiar practices of communication, discourse, and inquiry. In articulating presuppositions of practice, reconstructive analysis remains weakly transcendental. But it also qualifies as a “weak naturalism” inasmuch as the practices it aims to articulate are consistent with the natural evolution of the species and located in the empirical world (2003a, 10-30, 83ff); consequently, postmetaphysical reconstruction links up with specific forms of social-scientific knowledge in analyzing general conditions of rationality manifested in various human capacities and powers.
Habermas's encounter with speech act theory proved to be particularly decisive for this project. In speech act theory, he finds the basis for a conception of communicative competence (on the model of Chomsky's linguistic competence). Given this emphasis on language, Habermas is often said to have taken a kind of “linguistic turn” in this period. He framed his first essays on formal pragmatics (1976ab) as an alternative to Niklas Luhmann's systems theory. Habermas understands formal pragmatics as one of the “reconstructive sciences,” which aim to render theoretically explicit the intuitive, pretheoretical know-how underlying such basic human competences as speaking and understanding, judging and acting. Unlike Kant's transcendental analysis of the conditions of rationality, reconstructive sciences yield knowledge that is not necessary but hypothetical, not a priori but empirical, not certain but fallible. They are nevertheless directed to invariant structures and conditions and raise universal, but defeasible claims to an account of practical reason.
With the turn to language and reconstructive science, Habermas undermines both of the traditional Kantian roles for philosophy: philosophy as the sole judge in normative matters and as the methodological authority that assigns the various domains of inquiry to their proper questions. In Habermas's view, philosophy must engage in a fully cooperative relationship with the social sciences and the empirical disciplines in general. This step is completed in The Theory of Communicative Action, to which we now turn.
To understand Habermas's mature positions, we must start with his Theory of Communicative Action (TCA), a two-volume critical study of the theories of rationality that informed the classical sociologies of Weber, Durkheim, Parsons, and neo-Marxist critical theory (esp. Lukács, Horkheimer, Adorno). In TCA we find Habermas's conception of the task of philosophy and its relation to the social sciences—a conception that still guides much of his work. While TCA defends the emphasis on normativity and the universalist ambitions found in the philosophical tradition, it does so within a framework that includes particular sorts of empirical social research, with which philosophy must interact. Philosophers, that is, must cooperate with social scientists if they are to understand normative claims within the current historical context, the context of a complex, modern society that is characterized by social and systemic modes of integration. By recognizing both modes of integration, one avoids the pessimism associated with theories of modernity whose one-sided, primarily instrumental conception of rationality misses the cultural dimension of modernization.
Starting with Marx's historical materialism, large-scale macrosociological and historical theories have long been held to be the most appropriate explanatory basis for critical social science. However, such theories have two drawbacks for the critical project. First, comprehensiveness does not ensure explanatory power. Indeed, there are many such large-scale theories, each with their own distinctive and exemplary social phenomena that guide their attempt at unification. Second, a close examination of standard critical explanations, such as the theory of ideology, shows that such explanations typically appeal to a variety of different social theories (Bohman 1999). Habermas's actual employment of critical explanations bears this out. His criticism of modern societies turns on the explanation of the relationship between two very different theoretical terms: a micro-theory of rationality based on communicative coordination and a macro-theory of the systemic integration of modern societies through such mechanisms as the market (TCA, vol. 2). In concrete terms, this means that Habermas develops a two-level social theory that includes an analysis of communicative rationality, the rational potential built into everyday speech, on the one hand; and a theory of modern society and modernization, on the other (White 1989). On the basis of this theory, Habermas hopes to be able to assess the gains and losses of modernization and to overcome its one-sided version of rationalization.
Comprehensive critical theories make two problematic assumptions: that there is one preferred mode of critical explanation, and that there is one preferred goal of social criticism, namely a socialist society that fulfills the norm of human emancipation. Only with such a goal in the background does the two-step process of employing historical materialism to establish an epistemically and normatively independent stance make sense. The correctness or incorrectness of such a critical model depends not on its acceptance or rejection by its addressees, but on the adequacy of the theory to objective historical necessities or mechanisms (into which the critical theorist alleges to have superior insight). A pluralistic mode of critical inquiry suggests a different norm of correctness: that criticism must be verified by those participating in the practice and that this demand for practical verification is part of the process of inquiry itself.
Although Habermas's attitude toward these different modes of critical theory is somewhat ambivalent, he has given good reasons to accept the practical, pluralist approach. Just as in the analysis of modes of inquiry tied to distinct knowledge-constitutive interests, Habermas accepts that various theories and methods each have “a relative legitimacy.” Indeed, like Dewey he goes so far as to argue that the logic of social explanation is pluralistic and eludes the “apparatus of general theories.” In the absence of any such general theories, the most fruitful approach to social-scientific knowledge is to bring all the various methods and theories into relation to each other: “Whereas the natural and the cultural or hermeneutic sciences are capable of living in mutually indifferent, albeit more hostile than peaceful coexistence, the social sciences must bear the tension of divergent approaches under one roof” (1988a, 3). In TCA, Habermas casts critical social theory in a similarly pluralistic, yet unifying way. In discussing various accounts of societal modernization, for example, he argues that the main existing theories have their own “particular legitimacy” as developed lines of empirical research, and that Critical Theory takes on the task of critically unifying the various theories and their heterogeneous methods and presuppositions. “Critical social theory does not relate to established lines of research as a competitor; starting from its concept of the rise of modern societies, it attempts to explain the specific limitations and the relative rights of those approaches” (TCA, 2: 375).
To achieve these theoretical and methodological ends, Habermas begins this task with a discussion of theories of rationality and offers his own distinctive definition of rationality, one that is epistemic, practical, and intersubjective. For Habermas, rationality consists not so much in the possession of particular knowledge, but rather in “how speaking and acting subjects acquire and use knowledge” (TCA, 1: 11). Any such account is “pragmatic” because it shares a number of distinctive features with other views that see interpreters as competent and knowledgeable agents. Most importantly, a pragmatic approach develops an account of practical knowledge in the “performative attitude,” that is, from the point of view of a competent speaker. A theory of rationality thus attempts to reconstruct the practical knowledge necessary for being a knowledgeable social actor among other knowledgeable social actors. As already mentioned, Habermas's reconstruction attempts to articulate invariant structures of communication, and so qualifies as a “formal pragmatics.”
What is the “performative attitude” that is to be reconstructed in such a theory? From a social-scientific point of view, language is a medium for coordinating action, although not the only such medium. The fundamental form of coordination through language, according to Habermas, requires speakers to adopt a practical stance oriented toward “reaching understanding,” which he regards as the “inherent telos” of speech. When actors address one another with this sort of practical attitude, they engage in what Habermas calls “communicative action,” which he distinguishes from strategic forms of social action. Because this distinction plays a fundamental role in TCA, it deserves some attention.
In strategic action, actors are not so much interested in mutual understanding as in achieving the individual goals they each bring to the situation. Actor A, for example, will thus appeal to B's desires and fears so as to motivate the behavior on B's part that is required for A's success. As reasons motivating B's cooperation, B's desires and fears are only contingently related to A's goals. B cooperates with A, in other words, not because B finds A's project inherently interesting or worthy, but because of what B gets out of the bargain: avoiding some threat that A can make or obtaining something A has promised (which may be of inherent interest to B but for A is only a means of motivating B).
In communicative action, or what Habermas later came to call “strong communicative action” in “Some Further Clarifications of the Concept of Communicative Rationality” (1998b, chap. 7; German ed., 1999b), speakers coordinate their action and pursuit of individual (or joint) goals on the basis of a shared understanding that the goals are inherently reasonable or merit-worthy. Whereas strategic action succeeds insofar as the actors achieve their individual goals, communicative action succeeds insofar as the actors freely agree that their goal (or goals) is reasonable, that it merits cooperative behavior. Communicative action is thus an inherently consensual form of social coordination in which actors “mobilize the potential for rationality” given with ordinary language and its telos of rationally motivated agreement.
To support his conception of communication action, Habermas must specify the mechanism that makes rationally motivated agreement possible. Toward that end, he argues for a particular account of utterance meaning as based on “acceptability conditions,” by analogy to the truth-conditional account of the meaning of sentences. But rather than linking meaning with representational semantics, Habermas takes a pragmatic approach, analyzing the conditions for the illocutionary success of the speech act. According to the core principle of his pragmatic theory of meaning, “we understand a speech act when we know the kinds of reasons that a speaker could provide in order to convince a hearer that he is entitled in the given circumstances to claim validity for his utterance—in short, when we know what makes it acceptable” (1998b, 232). With this principle, Habermas ties the meaning of speech acts to the practice of reason giving: speech acts inherently involve claims that are in need of reasons—claims that are open to both criticism and justification. In our everyday speech (and in much of our action), speakers tacitly commit themselves to explaining and justifying themselves, if necessary. To understand what one is doing in making a speech act, therefore, one must have some sense of the appropriate response that would justify one's speech act, were one challenged to do so. A speech act succeeds in reaching understanding when the hearer takes up “an affirmative position” toward the claim made by the speaker (TCA 1: 95–97; 282; 297). In doing so, the hearer presumes that the claims in the speech act could be supported by good reasons (even if she has not asked for them). When the offer made by the speaker fails to receive uptake, speaker and hearer may shift reflexive levels, from ordinary speech to “discourse”—processes of argumentation and dialogue in which the claims implicit in the speech act are tested for their rational justifiability as true, correct or authentic. Thus the rationality of communicative action is tied to the rationality of discourse, more on which in section 3.2.
What are these claims that are open to criticism and justification? In opposition to the positivist fixation on fact-stating modes of discourse, Habermas does not limit intersubjectively valid, or justifiable, claims to the category of empirical truth, but instead recognizes a spectrum of “validity claims” that also includes, at the least, claims to moral rightness, ethical goodness or authenticity, personal sincerity, and aesthetic value (TCA 1: 8–23; 1993, chap. 1). Although Habermas does not consider such claims to represent a mind-independent world in the manner of empirical truth claims, they can be both publicly criticized as unjustifiable and defended by publicly convincing arguments. To this extent, validity involves a notion of correctness analogous to the idea of truth. In this context, the phrase “validity claim,” as a translation of the German term Geltungsanspruch, does not have the narrow logical sense (truth-preserving argument forms), but rather connotes a richer social idea—that a claim (statement) merits the addressee's acceptance because it is justified or true in some sense, which can vary according to the sphere of validity and dialogical context.
By linking meaning with the acceptability of speech acts, Habermas moves the analysis beyond a narrow focus on the truth-conditional semantics of representation to the social intelligibility of interaction. The complexity of social interaction then allows him to find three basic validity claims potentially at stake in any speech act used for cooperative purposes (i.e., in strong communicative action). His argument relies on three “world relations” that are potentially involved in strongly communicative acts in which a speaker intends to say something to someone about something (TCA 1: 275ff). For example, a constative (fact-stating) speech act (a) expresses an inner world (an intention to communicate a belief); (b) establishes a communicative relation with a hearer (and thus relates to a social world, specifically one in which both persons share a piece of information, and know they do); and (c) attempts to represent the external world. This triadic structure suggests that many speech acts, including non-constatives, involve a set of tacit validity claims: the claim that the speech act is sincere (non-deceptive), is socially appropriate or right, and is factually true (or more broadly: representationally adequate). Conversely, speech acts can be criticized for failing on one or more of these scores. Thus fully successful speech acts, insofar as they involve these three world relations, must satisfy the demands connected with these three basic validity claims (sincerity, rightness, and truth) in order to be acceptable.
We can think of strong communicative action in the above sense as defining the end of a spectrum of communicative possibilities. At that end, social cooperation is both deeply consensual and reasonable: actors sincerely agree that their modes of cooperation can be justified as good, right, and free of empirical error. Given the difficulties of maintaining such deep consensus, however, it makes sense, particularly in complex, pluralistic societies, to relax these communicative demands for specified types of situations, allowing for weaker forms of communicative action (in which not all three types of validity claims are at stake) or strategic action (in which actors understand that everyone is oriented toward individual success).
Habermas distinguishes the “system” as those predefined situations, or modes of coordination, in which the demands of communicative action are relaxed in this way, within legally specified limits. The prime examples of systemic coordination are markets and bureaucracies. In these systemically structured contexts, nonlinguistic media take up the slack in coordinating actions, which proceeds on the basis of money and institutional power—these media do the talking, as it were, thus relieving actors of the demands of strongly communicative action. The term “lifeworld,” by contrast, refers to domains of action in which consensual modes of action coordination predominate. In fact, the distinction between lifeworld and system is better understood as an analytic one that identifies different aspects of social interaction and cooperation (1991b). “Lifeworld” then refers to the background resources, contexts, and dimensions of social action that enable actors to cooperate on the basis of mutual understanding: shared cultural systems of meaning, institutional orders that stabilize patterns of action, and personality structures acquired in family, church, neighborhood, and school (TCA 1: chap. 6; 1998b, chap. 4).
As a theory of meaning, TCA has encountered rather heavy weather. In the analytic philosophy of language, one of the standard requirements is to account for the compositionality of language, the fact that a finite set of words can be used to form an indefinite number of sentences. From that perspective, Habermas's theory falls short (Heath 2001, chap. 3). But perhaps we would do better to assess Habermas's theory of meaning from a different perspective. The compositionality requirement is important if one wants to explain grammatical competence. But early on Habermas (1976b) expressed a greater interest in explaining communicative, rather than grammatical, competence: the ability of speakers to use grammatically well-formed sentences in social contexts. Although Habermas often presents his pragmatics as a further development in analytic theories of meaning, his analysis focuses primarily on the context-sensitive acceptability of speech acts: acceptability conditions as a function of formal features that distinguish different speech situations. This suggests his theory of meaning involves a quite different sort of project: to articulate the “validity basis” of social order.
The significance of this conception of reaching understanding and of rationally motivated agreement can also be seen by contrasting this account with other conceptions of understanding and interpretation, such as Gadamer's hermeneutics. Given Habermas's conception of speech acts and their relation to validity claims, it is not surprising that he argues that “communicative actions always require interpretations that are rational in approach” (TCA 1: 106), that is, ones that are made in the performative attitude by an interpreter. In general, Habermas agrees with hermeneutics that the whole domain of the social sciences is accessible only through interpretation, precisely because processes of reaching understanding already at work in the social sciences have antecedently constituted them (ibid., 107). But he draws a distinctive conclusion. Although social scientists are not actors, they must employ their own pretheoretical knowledge to gain interpretive access through communicative experience. As a “virtual participant,” the social scientist must take a position on the claims made by those he observes: he has access through communicative experience only “under the presupposition that he judges the agreement and disagreement, the validity claims and potential reasons with which he is confronted” (ibid., 116). There is then no disjunction between the attitude of the critic and the interpreter as reflective participants. Social scientists may withhold judgments, but only at the cost of impoverishing their interpretation and putting out of play their pretheoretical, practical knowledge that they have in common with others who are able to reach understanding. Thus, various forms of rationality become essential to the social sciences, because of the nature of the social domain.
Objecting to Habermas's line of argument, McCarthy and others have argued that it is not a necessary condition that interpreters take a position in order to understand reasons, even if we have to rely on our own competence to judge the validity and soundness of reasons and to identify them as reasons at all. Nonetheless, Habermas uses this conception in his social theory of modernity to show the ways in which modern culture has unleashed communicative rationality from its previous cultural and ideological constraints. In modern societies, social norms are no longer presumed to be valid but rather are subjected to critical reflection, as for example when the ethical life of a specific culture is criticized from the standpoint of justice. In a sense consistent with the Enlightenment imperative to use one's own reason, the everyday “lifeworld” of social experience has been rationalized, especially in the form of discourses that institutionalize reflective communicative action, as in scientific and democratic institutions.
The rationalization of the lifeworld in Western modernity went hand-in-hand with the growth of systemic mechanisms of coordination already mentioned above, in which the demands on fully communicative consensus are relaxed. If large and complex modern societies can no longer be integrated solely on the basis of shared cultural values and norms, new nonintentional mechanisms of coordination must emerge, which take the form of nonlinguistic media of money and power. For example, markets coordinate the collective production and distribution of goods nonintentionally, even if they are grounded in cultural and political institutions such as firms and states. Modernization can become pathological, as when money and power “colonize the lifeworld” and displace communicative forms of solidarity and inhibit the reproduction of the lifeworld (e.g., when universities become governed by market strategies). “Juridification” is another such pathological form, when law comes to invade more and more areas of social life, turning citizens into clients of bureaucracies with what Foucault might call “normalizing” effects. This aspect of TCA has less of an impact on Habermas's current work, which returns to the theme of improving democratic practice as a means of counteracting juridification and colonization. Democratic institutions, if properly designed and robustly executed, are supposed to ensure that the law does not take this pathological form but is subject to the deliberation of citizens, who thus author the laws to which they are subject (see sec. 3.4).
After TCA, then, Habermas begins to see law not as part of the problem, but as part of the solution, once he offers a more complete discourse-theoretical account of law and democracy. Nonetheless the theory of modernity still remains in his continued use of systems theory and its understanding of nonintentional integration. By insisting upon popular sovereignty as the outcome of the generation of “communicative power” in the public sphere, Habermas tries to save the substance of radical democracy. The unresolved difficulty is that in a complex society, as Habermas asserts, “public opinion does not rule” but rather points administrative power in particular directions; or, as he puts it, it does not “steer” but “countersteers” institutional complexity (1996b, chapter 8). That is, citizens do not control social processes; they exercise influence through particular institutionalized mechanisms and channels of communication. However successful democracy is in creating legitimacy, it cannot gain full control over large-scale complex societies, nor even of the necessary conditions for its own realization. In this sense, Habermas's emphasis on the limiting effect of complexity on democracy and his rejection of a fully democratic form of sociation continue the basic argument of the necessity of systems integration, even with its costs. Radical democracy may no longer be the only means to social transformation, though it is clear that it remains “the unfinished project of modernity”: realizing and transforming democracy is still a genuine goal even for complex and globalizing societies.
Habermas's theory of communicative action rests on the idea that social order ultimately depends on the capacity of actors to recognize the intersubjective validity of the different claims on which social cooperation depends. In conceiving cooperation in relation to validity claims, Habermas highlights its rational and cognitive character: to recognize the validity of such claims is to presume that good reasons could be given to justify them in the face of criticism. TCA thus points to and depends on an account of such justification—that is, on a theory of argumentation or discourse, which Habermas calls the “reflective form” of communicative action.
As mentioned above, Habermas proposes a multi-dimensional conception of reason that expresses itself in different forms of cognitive validity: not only in truth claims about the empirical world, but also in rightness claims about the kind of treatment we owe each other as persons, authenticity claims about the good life, technical-pragmatic claims about the means suitable to different goals, and so on. As he acknowledges, the surface grammar of speech acts does not suffice to establish this range of validity types. Rather, to ground the multi-dimensional system of validity claims, one must supplement semantic analysis with a pragmatic analysis of the different sorts of argumentative discourse—the different “logics of argumentation”—through which each type can be intersubjectively justified (TCA 1: 8–42). Thus, a type of validity claim counts as distinct from other types only if one can establish that its discursive justification involves features that distinguish it from other types of justification. Whether or not his pragmatic theory of meaning succeeds, the discursive analysis of validity illuminates important differences in the argumentative demands that come with different types of justifiable claims. To see how Habermas identifies these different features, it is first necessary to understand the general structures of argumentation.
The pragmatic analysis of argumentation in general. Habermas's discourse theory assumes that the specific type of validity claim one aims to justify—the cognitive goal or topic of argumentation—determines the specific argumentative practices appropriate for such justification. Discourse theory thus calls for a pragmatic analysis of argumentation as a social practice. Such analysis aims to reconstruct the normative presuppositions that structure the discourse of competent arguers. To get at these presuppositions, one cannot simply describe argumentation as it empirically occurs; as we already saw in TCA, one must adopt the performative attitude of a participant and articulate the shared, though often tacit, ideals and rules that provide the basis for regarding some arguments as better than others. Following contemporary argumentation theorists, Habermas assumes one cannot fully articulate these normative presuppositions solely in terms of the logical properties of arguments. Rather, he distinguishes three aspects of argument-making practices: argument as product, as procedure, and as process, which he loosely aligns with the traditional perspectives on argument evaluation of logic, dialectic, and rhetoric. Pragmatically, each of these perspectives functions as a “level of presupposition” involved in the assessment of the cogency—the goodness or strength—of arguments. Habermas seems to regard these perspectives, taken together, as constituting the pragmatic idea of cogency: “at no single one of these analytic levels can the very idea intrinsic to argumentative speech be adequately developed” (TCA 1: 26).
At the logical level, participants are concerned with arguments as products, that is, sets of reasons that support conclusions. From this perspective, arguers aim to construct “cogent arguments that are convincing in virtue of their intrinsic properties and with which validity claims can be redeemed or rejected” (ibid., 25). Following work by Stephen Toulmin and other informal logicians, Habermas regards most if not all argumentation as ultimately resting on ampliative arguments whose conclusions do not follow with deductive certainty but only as more or less plausible or probable. The logical strength of such arguments depends on how well one has taken into account all the relevant information and possible objections. Thus the term “logical” has a broad sense that includes not only formal but also informal logics, in which strength depends on the interrelated meanings of terms and background information that resists complete formalization: induction, analogy, narrative, and so on.
Given the ampliative character of most arguments, logical assessment presupposes the dialectical adequacy of argumentative procedures. That is, we may regard the products of our argument-making practices as logically strong only if we presume, at the dialectical level, that we have submitted arguments and counterarguments to sufficiently severe procedures of critical discussion—as Habermas (TCA 1: 26) puts it, a “ritualized competition for the better arguments.” Dialectical treatments of argumentation typically spell out the “dialectical obligations” of discussants: that one should address the issue at hand, should respond to relevant challenges, meet the specified burden of proof, and so on.
However, robust critical testing of competing arguments depends in turn on the rhetorical quality of the persuasive process. Habermas conceives the rhetorical level in terms of highly idealized properties of communication, which he initially presented as the conditions of an “ideal speech situation” (1973a; also 1971/2001). That way of speaking now strikes him as overly reified, suggesting an ideal condition that real discourses must measure up to, or at least approximately satisfy—motifs that Habermas himself employed until rather recently (cf. 1993, 54–55; 1996b, 322–23). He now understands the idea of rhetorically adequate process as a set of unavoidable yet counterfactual “pragmatic presuppositions” that participants must make if they are to regard the actual execution of dialectical procedures as a sufficiently severe critical test. Habermas (2005b, 89) identifies four such presuppositions as the most important: (i) no one capable of making a relevant contribution has been excluded, (ii) participants have equal voice, (iii) they are internally free to speak their honest opinion without deception or self-deception, and (iv) there are no sources of coercion built into the process and procedures of discourse. Such conditions, in effect, articulate what it would mean to assess all the relevant information and arguments (for a given level of knowledge and inquiry) as reasonably as possible, weighing arguments purely on the merits in a disinterested pursuit of truth. These conditions are counterfactual in the sense that actual discourses can rarely realize—and can never empirically certify—full inclusion, non-coercion, and equality. At the same time, these idealizing presuppositions have an operative effect on actual discourse: we may regard outcomes (both consensual and non-consensual) as reasonable only if our scrutiny of the process does not uncover obvious exclusions, suppression of arguments, manipulation, self-deception, and the like (2003a, 108). In this sense, these pragmatic idealizations function as “standards for a self-correcting learning process” (2005b, 91).
As an understanding of the rhetorical perspective, Habermas's highly idealized and formal model hardly does justice to the substantive richness of the rhetorical tradition. One can, however, supplement his model with a more substantive rhetoric that draws on Aristotle's account of ethos and pathos (Rehg 1997). In that case, the rhetorical perspective is concerned with designing arguments for their ability to place the particular audience in the proper social-psychological space for making a responsible collective judgment. Yet the “space of responsible judgment” still remains an idealization that may not be reduced to any observable actual behavior, but can at most be defeasibly presumed. The same probably holds for dialectical procedures. Although the dialectical perspective draws on the tradition of public debate, dialectical norms, when understood as pragmatic presuppositions, are not identical with institutionalized rules of debate (1990a, 91). A neutral observer can judge whether interlocutors have externally complied with institutional procedures, whereas engaged participants must judge how well they have satisfied the dialectical presupposition of severe critical testing.
The differentiation of argumentative discourses. If the different validity claims require different types of argumentation, then the relevant differences must emerge through a closer analysis of the ways the above aspects of argumentative practice adjust to different sorts of content, that is, the different validity claims at issue (cf. 2008, chap. 3). To be sure, Habermas does not regard every validity claim as open to discourse proper. Sincerity claims (or “truthfulness claims,” as it is sometimes translated) are the prime example. These are claims an actor makes about his or her interior subjectivity: feelings, moods, desires, beliefs, and the like. Such claims are open to rational assessment, not in discourse but by comparison with the actor's behavior: for example, if a son claims to care deeply about his parents but never pays them any attention, we would have grounds for doubting the sincerity of his claim. Note that such insincerity might involve self-deception rather than deliberate lying.
Truth and rightness claims, by contrast, are susceptible to argumentative justification in the proper sense, through what Habermas calls “strict discourses.” As he first analyzed the discourses connected with these two types of validity (1973a), they had much in common. Although the types of reasons differed—moral discourse rested primarily on need interpretations, empirical-theoretical discourse on empirical inductions—in both cases, the relevant reasons should, in principle, be acceptable to any reasonable agent. In the case of empirical truth claims, this process-level presupposition of consensus rests on the idea that the objective world is the same for all; in the case of moral rightness, it rests on the idea that valid moral rules and principles hold for all persons. In both cases, the appropriate audience for the testing of claims is universal, and in making a truth or rightness claim one counterfactually presupposes that a universal consensus would result, were the participants able to pursue a sufficiently inclusive and reasonable discourse for a sufficient length of time. Although his early statements are somewhat unclear, on one reading Habermas defined not only moral rightness but also empirical truth in terms of such ideal consensus (similar to C. S. Peirce). He now further distinguishes truth from moral rightness by defining the latter, but not the former, in terms of idealized consensus. More on that below.
Authenticity claims, unlike truth and rightness claims, do not come with such a strong consensual expectation. Habermas associates this type of claim with “ethical” discourse. Unlike moral discourse, in which participants strive to justify norms and courses of action that accord due concern and respect for persons in general, ethical discourses focus on questions of the good life, either for a given individual (“ethical-existential” discourse) or for a particular group or polity (“ethical-political” discourse). Consequently, the kind of reasons that constitute cogent arguments in ethical discourse depend on the life histories, traditions, and particular values of those whose good is at issue. This reference to individual- and group-related particularities means that one should not expect those reasons to win universal consensus (1993, 1–18; 1996b, 162–68). However, Habermas (2003b) seems to recognize one class of ethical questions that do admit of universal consensus. Choices of technologies that bear on the future of human nature, such as genetic enhancement engineering, pose species-wide ethical issues. Such issues concern not merely our self-understanding as members of this or that particular culture or tradition, but how we should understand our basic human dignity. In his view, the core of human dignity, and thus the basis for a human-species ethics, lies in the capacity of human beings for autonomous self-determination.
In sum, Habermas's discourse theory aligns different types of validity claim with different types of justificatory discourse. At the logical level, cogent arguments must employ somewhat different sorts of reasons to justify different types of claims. Although some sorts of reasons might enter into each type of discourse (e.g., empirical claims), the set of relevant considerations that are individually necessary and jointly sufficient for making logically strong arguments will differ. Thus, claims about what human beings need are relevant reasons in moral arguments about welfare obligations, but not for supporting the truth claim that quarks exist. At the dialectical level, one must meet different burdens of proof by answering different types of challenges. For example, in defending the ethical authenticity of Tom's pursuit of a career in medicine, one need not show that medicine is a career everyone must follow, but only that such a career makes sense, given Tom's personal background, talents, and desires. One can also examine Tom's career choice from a moral perspective, but in that case one need only show that anyone in his circumstances is morally permitted to pursue medicine. At the rhetorical level, finally, the scope and depth of agreement differs according to the type of claim. Moral rightness claims and empirical truth claims are justified by reasons that should be acceptable to a universal audience, whereas ethical claims are addressed to those who share a particular history and tradition of values.
Having differentiated types of discourse, Habermas must say something about how they interrelate. Clearly, some discourses depend on other types: most obviously, moral and ethical discourses partly depend on empirical claims, and thus depend on the outcome of empirical discourses about the circumstances and consequences of behavioral rules and the collective pursuit of the good life. The question of interrelationship becomes especially urgent in the political sphere, where different discourses intertwine and lead to competing conclusions, or when issues arise in which discourse types cannot be cleanly separated, so that the standards of cogency become obscure or deeply contested (McCarthy 1991, chap. 7; 1998). Because Habermas (1996c, 1534f) rejects the idea of a metadiscourse that sorts out these boundary issues, he must answer this challenge in his democratic theory. Before taking up that topic, Habermas's theory of truth deserves a closer look.
In his various essays on empirical truth, Habermas usually regards propositions as the truth-bearer: in making an assertion, “I am claiming that the proposition [Aussage] that I am asserting is true” (1971/2001, 86; cf. 2003a, 249ff). In his early treatment, however, he immediately equated empirical truth with ideal justifiability—the consensus theory of truth mentioned above. According to that theory, the “truth condition of propositions is the potential assent of all others”; thus “the universal-pragmatic meaning of truth…is determined by the demand of reaching a rational consensus” (1971/2001, 89; cf. 86). Such formulations suggest that Habermas equated the meaning of truth with the outcome of a universal, rational consensus, which he understood in reference to the ideal speech situation (ibid., 97–98). However, he soon saw the difficulties with consensus theory, and he never allowed “Wahrheitstheorien” (1973a), his main essay on the consensus theory of truth, to appear in English. Like the “epistemic” theories of truth that link truth with ideal warranted assertibility (e.g., Hilary Putnam, Crispin Wright), consensus theory downplays the justification-transcendent character of truth (2003a, 250–52).
Habermas now proposes instead a “pragmatic epistemological realism” (2003a, 7; 1998b, chap. 8). His theory of truth is realist in holding that the objective world, rather than ideal consensus, is the truth-maker. If a proposition (or sentence, statement) for which we claim truth is indeed true, it is so because it accurately refers to existing objects, or accurately represents actual states of affairs—albeit objects and states of affairs about which we can state facts only under descriptions that depend on our linguistic resources. The inescapability of language dictates the pragmatic epistemological character of his realism. Specifically, Habermas eschews the attempt to explicate the relationship between proposition and world metaphysically (e.g., as in correspondence theories). Rather, he explicates the meaning of accurate representation pragmatically, in terms of its implications for everyday practice and discourse. Insofar as we take propositional contents as unproblematically true in our daily practical engagement with reality, we act confidently on the basis of well-corroborated beliefs about objects in the world. What Habermas (1971/2001, 94; TCA 1: 23) calls “theoretico-empirical” or “theoretical” discourse becomes necessary when beliefs lose their unproblematic status as the result of practical difficulties, or when novel circumstances pose questions about the natural world. Such cases call for an empirical inquiry in which truth claims about the world are submitted to critical testing. Although Habermas tends to sharply separate action and discourse, it seems more plausible to regard such critical testing as combining discourse with experimental actions—as we see in scientific inquiry, which combines empirical arguments with practical actions, that is, field studies and laboratory experimentation.
To date Habermas has not drawn out the implications of his discourse theory for a detailed account of truth-oriented discourses, which we find most highly developed in the sciences (but see Rehg 2009, chaps. 4–6). As an argumentation theory, such an account would probably have to take the following broad lines: at the logical level, the discursive justification of problematic truth claims heavily relies on empirical reasons: observation reports, results of experimental tests, and the like. Similarly for the dialectical level: the chief challenges arise from theories and observations that seemingly conflict with the claim at issue or with its supporting reasons. At the rhetorical level, one seeks the agreement of a potentially universal audience, given that truth claims are about an objective world that is the same for all human beings. This sketch, however, leaves out precisely the details that would make a discourse theory of science interesting. For example, how do epistemic and aesthetic values (scope, accuracy, simplicity, etc.) affect the logical construction of scientific arguments? Must not the presupposition of a universal audience be attenuated, given that scientists investigate aspects of the world (e.g., subatomic particles) that are inaccessible to all but a small group of trained experts? How does the cogency of scientific arguments depend on or involve various institutional structures and mechanisms, such as peer review, assignment of credit, distribution of grant money, and so on?
Habermas's two enduring interests in political theory and rationality come together in his discourse theory of deliberative democracy. There we see him struggling to show how his highly idealized, multi-dimensional discourse theory has real institutional purchase in complex, modern societies. In that context, argumentation appears in the form of public discussion and debate over practical questions that confront political bodies. The challenge, then, is to show how an idealized model of practical discourse connects with real institutional contexts of decision-making.
Habermas summarizes his idealized conception of practical discourse in the “discourse principle” (D), which we might state as follows: A rule of action or choice is justified, and thus valid, only if all those affected by the rule or choice could accept it in a reasonable discourse. Although he first understood (D) as a principle of moral discourse, he now positions it as an overarching principle of impartial justification that holds for all types of practical discourse (cf. 1990a, 66, 93; 1996b, 107). As such, it simply summarizes his argumentation theory for any question involving the various “employments of practical reason” (1993, chap. 1). (D) thus applies not only to moral rightness and ethical authenticity, but also to the justification of technical-pragmatic claims about the choice of effective means for achieving a given end. Each type of practical discourse then involves a further specification of (D) for the content at issue. In developing his democratic theory, Habermas has been especially concerned with two such specifications: moral discourse and legal-political discourse. In distinguishing these two types of discourse, Habermas tackles the traditional problem of the relationship between law and morality. He also shows how to bring ethereal discursive idealizations down to institutional earth. We start with his account of moral discourse.
Habermas's discourse ethics. Habermas's discourse theory of morality generally goes by the name “discourse ethics,” a somewhat misleading label given that “ethics” has a distinct non-moral sense for him, as noted above. The idea of a discourse ethics was anticipated by G. H. Mead (1962, 379–89) and has been pursued by a number of philosophers (e.g., Karl-Otto Apel, Seyla Benhabib). Habermas's version is heavily indebted to the Kantian tradition. Like Kant, he considers morality a matter of unconditional moral obligations: the prohibitions, positive obligations, and permissions that regulate interaction among persons. The task of moral theory is to reconstruct the unconditional force of such obligations as impartial dictates of practical reason that hold for any similarly situated agent. Also like Kant, Habermas links morality with respect for autonomous agency: in following the dictates of impartial reason, one follows one's own conscience and shows respect for other such agents. Unlike Kant, however, Habermas takes a dialogical approach to practical reason, as his discourse theory requires. Kant assumed that in principle each mature, reflective individual, guided by the Categorical Imperative, could reach the same conclusions about what duty requires. This assumption has long been recognized as problematic, but in pluralistic and multicultural settings it becomes entirely untenable: one may plausibly claim to take an impartial moral point of view only by engaging in real discourse with all those affected by the issue in question.
Habermas's (D)-Principle articulates this dialogical requirement. If one assumes this requirement, then one can arrive at Habermas's specific conception of reasonable moral discourse by working out the implications of his argumentation theory for the discursive testing of unconditional moral obligations. What one gets, according to Habermas, is a dialogical principle of universalization (U): “A [moral norm] is valid just in case the foreseeable consequences and side-effects of its general observance for the interests and value-orientations of each individual could be jointly accepted by all concerned without coercion” (i.e., in a sufficiently reasonable discourse) (1998a, 42; trans. amended). The (U)-Principle assumes that valid moral rules or norms allow for an egalitarian community of autonomous agents—as Kant put it, a “systematic union of different rational beings” governed by “common laws” (1785, Ak. 433; also 431). From the standpoint of argumentation theory, (U) seems to state the burden of proof that structures an adequate process and procedure of justification.
The (U)-Principle has been a site of controversy among discourse theorists, and not everyone considers it necessary for a discourse ethics (Benhabib and Dallmayr 1990; Wellmer 1991; Gottschalk-Mazouz 2000). Habermas has argued that (U) can be deduced from statements articulating the pragmatic implications of argumentative discourse over moral norms (1990a, 86–93; 1998a, 39–45). More precisely, a successful deduction probably depends on three assumptions: (D), a statement of the semantics of unconditional norms, and an articulation of the pragmatics of discourse. If we accept (D) and if we accept Habermas's explication of the rhetorical presuppositions of the discursive justification required by (D), then (U) would have to follow as an implication of what is required for discursively justifying norms with the specific content of moral norms, namely obligations that bind persons in general and whose acceptance thus affects each person's pursuit of interests and the good life.
Whether or not the argument for (U) goes through, Habermas's discourse ethics depends on some very strong assumptions about the capacity of persons for moral dialogue. Given that his discourse theory in general, and thus (U) in particular, rests on counterfactual idealizations, one might be tempted to regard (U) as a hypothetical thought experiment, analogous to what we find in other neo-Kantian or contractualist theories like those of John Rawls and T. M. Scanlon. To some extent this is correct: to regard a moral norm as valid, one must presume it would hold up in a fully inclusive and reasonable discourse. But Habermas takes a further step, insisting that (U) is a principle of real discourse: an individual's moral judgment counts as fully reasonable only if it issues from participation in actual discourse with all those affected. Moreover, (U) requires not simply that one seek the input of others in forming one's conscience, but that one gain their reasonable agreement.
To bring such strong idealizations down to earth, one must connect them with conscientious judgment in everyday moral practice. One way to do this is through an account of the appropriate application of moral rules in concrete circumstances. Following Günther 1993, Habermas (1993, 35–39) acknowledges the need for such an account. In moral discourses of application, one must test alternative normative interpretations of the particular situation for their acceptability before the limited audience of those immediately involved, on the assumption that one is applying valid general norms. But even at the level of application, discourse cannot always include all the affected parties (e.g., when the issue concerns the fate of a comatose patient). Habermas's discourse ethics thus implies that for many, if not most, of our moral rules and choices, the best we can achieve are partial justifications: arguments that are not conclusively convincing for all, but also are not conclusively defeated, in limited discourses with interlocutors we regard as reasonable (cf. Rehg 2003, 2004).
Habermas (1990a, 116–94) has also attempted to give discourse ethics some empirical foothold by looking to moral psychology and social anthropology. The psychological line of argument draws on the theory of communicative action to reconstruct theories of moral development such as Lawrence Kohlberg's. According to Habermas, moral maturation involves the growing ability to integrate the interpersonal perspectives given with the system of personal pronouns; the endpoint of that process coincides with the capacity to engage in the mutual perspective-taking required by (U). The anthropological line of argument focuses on identity formation, drawing on the social psychology of G. H. Mead. In broad agreement with Hegelian models of mutual recognition, Mead understands the individual's development of a stable personal identity as inextricably bound up with processes of socialization that depend on participation in relationships of mutual recognition. Habermas (ibid., 195–215; 1990b) extends this analysis to respond to feminist and communitarian criticisms of impartialist, justice-based moralities. According to the standard critiques, such moralities assume an implausibly atomistic view of the self and thus fail to appreciate the moral import of particularity and cultural substance: particular relationships between unique individuals, on the one hand, and membership in particular cultural communities or traditions, on the other. Mead's analysis shows that the critics are on to an important point: if individuation depends on socialization, then any anthropologically viable system of morality must protect not only the integrity of individuals but also the web of relationships and cultural forms of life on which individuals depend for their moral development. Discourse ethics, Habermas claims, meets this two-fold demand in virtue of the kind of mutual perspective-taking it requires. If we examine (U), we see that it requires participants to attend to the values and interests of each person as a unique individual; conversely, each individual conditions her judgment about the moral import of her values and interests on what all participants can freely accept. Consequently, moral discourse is structured in a way that links moral validity with solidaristic concern for both the concrete individual and the morally formative communities on which her identity depends.
These arguments are certainly ambitious, and they raise as many questions as they answer. It is hardly surprising, then, that many commentators have not been persuaded by discourse ethics as a normative ethics. Rather, they regard it as plausible only in the context of democratic politics, or as a model for the critical evaluation of formal dialogues (e.g., environmental conflict resolution, medical ethics committees, and the like). Other critics have targeted discourse ethics at a metaethical level. In fact, Habermas first unveiled his moral theory in answer to moral non-cognitivism and skepticism (1990a, 43–115). In this context, (U) explicates a moral epistemology: what it means for moral statements to count as justified. If moral statements are justifiable, then they have a cognitive character in the sense that they are correct or not depending on how they fare in reasonable discourse. However, Habermas proposes (U) not merely as articulating a consensus model of moral justification, but as an explication of the meaning of rightness itself. Unlike truth, the rightness of a moral norm does not consist in reference to an independently existing realm of objects, but rather in the worthiness of the norm for intersubjective recognition. Thus rightness, unlike truth, means ideal warranted assertibility (2005b, 93; 2003a, chap. 6). However, discourse theorists remain divided over the proper understanding of idealized consensus and its relation to rightness.
Habermas's discourse theory of law and politics. The central task of Habermas's democratic theory is to provide a normative account of legitimate law. His deliberative democratic model rests on what is perhaps the most complex argument in his philosophical corpus, found in his Between Facts and Norms (1996b; German ed., 1992b; for commentary, see Baynes 1995; Rosenfeld and Arato 1998; vom Schomberg and Baynes 2004). Boiled down to its essentials, however, the argument links his discourse theory with an analysis of the demands inherent in modern legal systems, which Habermas understands in light of the history of Western modernization. The analysis thus begins with a functional explanation of the need for positive law in modern societies. This analysis picks up on points he made in TCA (see sec. 3.1 above).
Societies are stable over the long run only if their members generally perceive them as legitimate: as organized in accordance with what is true, right, and good. In premodern Europe, legitimacy was grounded in a shared religious worldview that penetrated all spheres of life. As modernization engendered religious pluralism and functional differentiation (autonomous market economies, bureaucratic administrations, unconstrained scientific research), the potentials for misunderstanding and conflict about the good and the right increased—just as the shared background resources for the consensual resolution of such conflicts decreased. When we consider this dynamic simply from the standpoint of the (D)-principle, the prospects for legitimacy in modern societies appear quite dim.
Sociologically, then, one can understand modern law as a functional solution to the conflict potentials inherent in modernization. By opening up legally defined spheres of individual freedom, modern law reduces the burden of questions that require general (society-wide) discursive consensus. Within these legal boundaries, individuals are free to pursue their interests and happiness as they see fit, normally through various modes of association, whether that pursuit is primarily governed by modes of strategic action (as in economic markets), by recognized authority or consensual discourse (e.g., within religious communities; in the sciences), or by bureaucratic rationality (as in hierarchically organized voluntary enterprises). Consequently, modern law is fundamentally concerned with the definition, protection, and reconciliation of individual freedoms in their various institutional and organizational contexts.
The demands on the legitimation of law change with this functional realignment: to be legitimate, modern law must secure the private autonomy of those subject to it. The legal guarantee of private autonomy in turn presupposes an established legal code and a legally defined status of equal citizenship in terms of actionable basic rights that secure a space for individual freedom. However, such rights are expressions of freedom only if citizens can also understand themselves as the authors of the laws that interpret their rights—that is, only if the laws that protect private autonomy also issue from citizens' exercise of public autonomy as lawmakers acting through elected representatives. Thus, the rights that define individual freedom must also include rights of political participation. As Habermas understands the relation between private and public autonomy, each is “co-original” or “equiprimordial,” conceptually presupposing the other in the sense that each can be fully realized only if the other is fully realized. The exercise of public autonomy in its full sense presupposes participants who understand themselves as individually free (privately autonomous), which in turn presupposes that they can shape their individual freedoms through the exercise of public autonomy. This equiprimordial relationship, Habermas believes, enables his discourse theory to combine the best insights of the civic republican and classical liberal traditions of democracy, which found expression in Rousseau and Locke, respectively (1998a, chap. 9).
Habermas (1996b, chap. 3) understands these rights of liberty and political participation as an abstract system of basic rights generated by reflection on the nature of discursive legitimation (articulated in the D-Principle) in contexts shaped by the functional demands on modern law (or the “form” of positive law). Because these rights are abstract, each polity must further interpret and flesh them out for its particular historical circumstances, perhaps supplementing them with further welfare and environmental rights. In any case, the system of rights constitutes a minimum set of normative institutional conditions for any legitimate modern political order. The system of rights, in other words, articulates the normative framework for constitutional democracies, within which further institutional mechanisms such as legislatures and other branches of government must operate.
The idea of public autonomy means that the legitimacy of ordinary legislation must ultimately be traceable to robust processes of public discourse that influence formal decisionmaking in legislative bodies. Habermas summarizes this requirement in his democratic principle of legitimacy: “only those statutes may claim legitimacy that can meet with the assent of all citizens in a discursive process of legislation that in turn has been legally constituted” (1996b, 110). As he goes on to explain, this principle articulates the core requirement for “externally” institutionalizing the different types of practical discourse that are relevant for the justification of particular laws. Decisions about laws typically involve a combination of validity claims: not only truth claims about the likely consequences of different legal options, but also claims about their moral rightness (or justice), claims about the authenticity of different options in light of the polity's shared values and history, and pragmatic claims about which option is feasible or more efficient. Legitimate laws must pass the different types of discursive tests that come with each of these validity claims. Habermas also recognizes that many issues involve conflicts among particular interests that cannot be reconciled by discursive agreement on validity but only through fair bargaining processes.
This strong orientation toward cognitive validity qualifies Habermas's version of deliberative democracy as an “epistemic” theory. This puts his democratic principle in a rather puzzling position. On the one hand, it represents a specification of the discourse principle for a particular kind of discourse (legal-political discourse). This makes it analogous to the moral principle (U), which specifies (D) for moral discourse. As a specific principle of reasonable discourse, the democratic principle seems to have the character of an idealizing presupposition insofar as it presumes the possibility of consensual decisionmaking in politics. For Habermas, reasonable political discourse must at least begin with the supposition that legal questions admit in principle of single right answers (1996c, 1491–95), or at least a set of discursively valid answers on which a fair compromise, acceptable to all parties, is possible. This highly cognitive, consensualist presumption has drawn fire even from sympathetic commentators (Bohman 1996; McCarthy 1998).
On the other hand, the democratic principle lies at a different level from principles like (U), as Habermas himself emphasizes (1996b, 110). The latter specify (D) for this or that single type of practical discourse, in view of internal cognitive demands on justification, whereas the former pulls together all the forms of practical discourse and sets forth conditions on their external institutionalization. From this perspective, the democratic principle acts as a bridge that links the cognitive aspects of political discourse (as a combination of the different types of idealized discourse) with the demands of institutional realization in complex societies. As such, the democratic principle should refer not to consensus, but rather to something like a warranted presumption of reasonableness. In fact, in a number of places Habermas describes democratic legitimacy in just such terms, which we might paraphrase as follows: citizens may regard their laws as legitimate insofar as the democratic process, as it is institutionally organized and conducted, warrants the presumption that outcomes are reasonable products of a sufficiently inclusive deliberative process of opinion- and will-formation (2008, 103). The presumption of reasonable outcomes thus rests not so much on the individual capacities of citizens to act like the participants of ideal discourse, but rather on the aggregate reasonableness of a “subjectless communication” that emerges as the collective result of discursive structures—the formal and informal modes of organizing discussion (1996b, 184–86, 301, 341). This means that democracy is “decentered,” no longer fully under control of its own conditions and no longer based on a congruent subject of self-legislating discourse.
Habermas dubs his position an “epistemic proceduralism.” The position is proceduralist because collective reasonableness emerges from the operation of the democratic process; it is epistemic insofar as that process results in collective learning. The latter presupposes a fruitful interplay of three major discursive arenas: the dispersed communication of citizens in civil society; the “media-based mass communication” in the political public sphere; and the institutionalized discourse of lawmakers. When these arenas work well together, civil society and the public sphere generate a set of considered public opinions that then influence the deliberation of lawmakers (2009). In light of the above ambiguity in the status of (D), however, one might want to take a more pragmatic approach to democratic deliberation. Such an approach (e.g., Bohman 1996; McCarthy 1998) understands deliberation as less a matter of settling disputes over the cognitive validity of competing proposals than a matter of developing legal frameworks within which citizens can continue to cooperate despite disagreements about what is right or good.
Habermas's discourse theory also has implications for international modes of deliberation—hence for the debate about a potential cosmopolitan political order. To understand his position in this debate, it helps to sketch a typology of the main theories. The current discussion moves along four main axes: political or social, institutional or noninstitutional, democratic or nondemocratic, and transnational or cosmopolitan. Theories are informed by background assumptions about the scope of cosmopolitanism: whether it is moral to the extent that it is concerned with individuals and their life opportunities, social to the extent that it makes associations and institutions central, or political to the extent that it focuses on specifically legal and political institutions, including citizenship. Habermas's position in this debate is moderate. It is not minimal in the sense of Rawls's law of peoples, which denies the need for any strong international legal or political order, much less a democratic one. Nor is it a strongly democratic position, such as David Held's version of cosmopolitan order. However, both Held and Habermas share a common emphasis on the emergence of international public law as central to a just global political order.
In his essay “Kant's Idea of Perpetual Peace: At Two Hundred Years' Historical Remove” (1998a, chap. 7; German ed., 1996a, chap. 7), Habermas was optimistic about the prospects for a global political order as the continuation of the form of democracy based on human rights typical of nation states. Democracy on the nation-state model connects three central ideas: that the proper political community is a bounded one; that it possesses ultimate political authority; and that this authority enables political autonomy, so that the members of the demos may freely choose the conditions of their own association and legislate for themselves. The normative core of this conception of democracy lies in the conception of freedom articulated in the third condition: that the subject of legal constraints is free precisely in being the author of the laws. Earlier we introduced Habermas's argument for “decentering” democracy under the conditions of pluralism and complexity. If this applies to the modern state, then it would seem that cosmopolitan democracy would take this trend even further. Yet, when discussing “postnational” legitimacy, Habermas clearly makes self-determination by a singular demos the fundamental normative core of the democratic ideal.
For Held (1995), cosmopolitan democracy is clearly continuous with democracy, at least in form, as it is realized within states. Not only does Held show how international society is already thickly institutionalized well beyond the systems of negotiation that Habermas makes central, he further recognizes that “individuals increasingly have complex and multilayered identities, corresponding to the globalization of economic forces and the reconfiguration of political power.” Such potentially overlapping identities provide the basis for participation in global civil society, in nongovernmental organizations (NGOs), and in other transnational civil associations, movements, and agencies that create opportunities for political participation at the global level. Held's approach thus has three enormous advantages: an emphasis on a variety of institutions; a multiplicity of levels and sites for common democratic activity; and a focus on the need for organized political actors in international civil society to play an important role in a system of global democracy. For all these advantages, the self-legislating demos reappears in Held's explicitly Lockean insistence that “the artificial person at the center of the modern state must be reconceived in terms of cosmopolitan public law.” In order to reconstitute the community as sovereign, Held argues that the demoi must submit to the will of the global demos: “cosmopolitan law demands the subordination of regional, national and local sovereignties to an overarching legal framework.”
Contrary to his earlier essay on Kant's Perpetual Peace, Habermas has now pulled back from Held's strong conception of cosmopolitanism. In The Postnational Constellation (2001a; German ed., 1998c) and more recent essays on the European Union, Habermas seeks to accommodate a wider institutional pluralism. Still, he cannot have it both ways. When considering various disaggregated and distributed forms of transnational political order, he describes them in nondemocratic terms, as a “negotiating system” governed by fair bargaining. This is because he clearly, and indeed surprisingly, makes self-determination through legislation the deciding criterion of democracy. Consequently, at the transnational level, the fundamental form of political activity is negotiation among democracies. This demos is at best a civic, rather than political, transnational order. Nonetheless, Habermas links the possibility of a “postnational democracy” to a shared and therefore particular political identity, without which, he contends, we are left with mere “moral” rather than “civic” solidarity. According to Habermas, even if such a political community is based on the universal principles of a democratic constitution, “it still forms a collective identity, in the sense that it interprets and realizes these principles in light of its own history and in the context of its own particular form of life” (2001a, 117, 107). Without a common ethical basis, institutions beyond the state must look to a “less demanding basis of legitimacy in the organizational forms of an international negotiation system,” the deliberative processes of which will be accessible to various publics and to organizations in international civil society (ibid., 109).
More recently, he argues that regulatory political institutions at the global level could be effective only if they take on features of governance without government, even if human rights as juridical statuses must be constitutionalized in the international system (2004, 130–31). As in the case of Allen Buchanan's minimalism, this less demanding standard of legitimacy does not include the capacity to deliberate about the terms governing the political authority of the negotiation system itself. This position is transnational, but ultimately nondemocratic, primarily because it restricts its overly robust deliberative democracy to the level of the nation state. The stronger criteria for democracy are not applied outside the nation state, where governance is only indirectly democratic and left to negotiations and policy networks. Furthermore, the commitment to human rights as legal statuses pushes Habermas in the direction of Held's fundamentally legal form of political cosmopolitanism. At the moment, Habermas's view of cosmopolitan politics is not yet fully stable. But it is clear that he thinks that a cosmopolitan order must be political (and not merely juridical); institutional (and not merely organized informally or by policy networks); transnational (to the extent that it would be like the European Union, an order of political and legal orders); and in some sense democratic or at least subject to democratic norms. However, in order for him to fully adopt this last characteristic of the international system, he will have to rethink his conception of democracy as self-legislation. If he does not do so, it seems impossible to fit democracy onto a transnational rather than fully Kantian cosmopolitan order.
On the topic of religion, Habermas has taken a nuanced position that continues to develop. In his Theory of Communicative Action, he treated religion primarily from a sociological perspective, as an archaic mode of social integration. Since then, however, he has explored the role of religion in politics, on the one hand, and the relationships between religious and philosophical modes of discourse, on the other.
As a philosopher, Habermas has described his approach as a “methodological atheism,” by which he means a kind of experiment in radical demythologization whose outcome remains open. Taking this stance does not make him hostile or dismissive of faith and theological reflection; on the contrary, he grants that “indispensable potentials for meaning are preserved in religious language”—potentials that, at least so far, have not been fully reduced to philosophical and secular reasons (2002, 77, 162). At the same time, Habermas insists on the difference between theological and philosophical modes of discourse: as a reflection on faith, theology must not renounce its basis in religious experience and ritual. Consequently, he resists apologetic attempts to generate religious belief from philosophical premises. Rather, philosophers must satisfy themselves with the “transcendence from within” given with the context-transcending force of claims to truth and moral rightness.
Habermas has further developed his views on the relation between philosophy and faith in his dialogue with Cardinal Ratzinger (who would become Pope Benedict XVI)(2006b; German ed., 2005a; see also 2008, chap. 4). There he notes how much Western philosophy owes to its Christian heritage, which philosophers assimilated by developing ideas of “responsibility, autonomy and justification; history and remembering; new beginning, innovation, and return; alienation, internalization, and incarnation; individuality and community” (2006b, 44; trans. amended). The Christian idea of human beings as created in the image of God has been especially important for Western moral-political theory, which translated the religious idea into the secular view of persons as equal in dignity and deserving unconditional respect (ibid., 45). This assimilation of Christian ideas does not gut their substance, however. In fact, religious communities still harbor potentials of meaning from which philosophy can learn—potentials that have “been lost elsewhere and that cannot be restored by the professional knowledge of experts alone” (ibid., 43). As examples, he refers to the “differentiated possibilities of expression” and “sensitivities” regarding “lives that have gone astray, societal pathologies, the failure of individual life projects, and the deformation of misbegotten human relationships” (ibid., trans. amended). In acknowledging that religious modes of expression can harbor an integral cognitive content that is not exhausted by secular translations, Habermas seems to have located the boundaries of his methodological experiment in demythologization. He thus calls for a dialogue in which secular and religious forms of thought mutually inform and learn from each other.
This broad point on the relation between religious and secular modes of thought flows directly into the position Habermas takes in his “Religion in the Public Sphere“ regarding the relation between religion and public reasons (2006a; German ed., 2005b, chap. 5). At the center of contention are the duties of believing citizens to translate their religiously based claims into secular, publicly accessible reasons. Habermas stakes out his position between John Rawls and Robert Audi, on the one side, and Paul Weithmann and Nicholas Wolterstorff, on the other.
Audi places the heaviest burden on believers, requiring them to support only those laws for which they have sufficient public reasons; each citizen thus has a duty to translate religiously based arguments into secular ones. In his final statement on this issue, Rawls (1997) presents a “wide view” of public reason, according to which citizens may introduce reasons from reasonable comprehensive doctrines (which can include religious views), without translation, at any time into public discourse about constitutional essentials, provided that at some point in the future these reasons are translated into generally accessible public arguments. For Habermas, Audi and Rawls underestimate the existential force of religious belief—how such belief can, at least for some believers, provide the only sufficient basis for their political views, even when public reasons might also be taken as supporting the views in question. The demand that believers translate their comprehensive religious views into secular justifications imposes undue burdens on believers of this sort. The demand for translation, rather, pertains only to politicians and public officials with institutional power to make, apply, and execute the law.
As Habermas reads them, Weithmann and Wolterstorff take the opposite line from Rawls and Audi, opening up public discourse to untranslated religious arguments. Weithmann requires believers to argue for their positions as good for everyone, but he allows them to frame such arguments within their religiously based conception of justice. Wolterstorff removes even this mild constraint. Both thinkers do not impose any institutional filter: not only in the public sphere but also in the halls of power, religious reasons can suffice to justify coercive legal and administrative decisions. This move, Habermas maintains, undoes the neutrality principle that undergirds modern constitutional democracy, with its separation of church and state: the idea that “all enforceable political decisions must be formulated in a language that is equally accessible to all citizens, and it must be possible to justify them in this language as well” (2006a, 12). Indeed, Wolterstorff seems to reject a key idea behind democratic legitimation, namely the presumption that procedures and decisions should operate within a background framework of principles acceptable to all citizens. Consequently, it is unclear how a democracy should maintain its legitimacy and avoid devolving into an endless strife of factions simply vying for power.
In the background of these debates lay contention over the burdens of citizenship. Believers might object that Habermas still places an asymmetric burden on them. After all, they must eventually, at the institutional level, shift over to secular modes of justification, whereas non-believers need not carry out the same kind of move toward religious justification. In response, Habermas has offered the hypothesis that both believers and non-believers are involved in a complementary learning process in which each side can learn from the other. As a cooperative learning process, translation makes demands on both sides: the believer must seek publicly accessible arguments, whereas the non-believer must approach religion as a potential source of meaning, as harboring truths about human existence that are relevant for all.
In closing, we suggest three possible extensions to Habermas's reply to believers. First, one might note that in the West at least, Christians are not so burdened as one might think. After all, some of the most important secular ideas that inform constitutional democracy—ideas of inalienable individual rights, liberty, and the like—partly originated in Christianity. Second, one might point out that a reverse duty of translation on non-believers would involve a far heavier burden than that on believers, particularly in light of the first point. This is because some religious reasons, though they might have a surface intelligibility as propositions to non-believers, cannot be adequately appreciated or weighed apart from prolonged experience of living the faith. Although it remains important for non-believers to learn from believers, one should probably expect believers to have an epistemic advantage in the translation process, that is, the process of determining whether or not a given secular content adequately renders a religiously based reason. So if believers have the greater burden, then that makes sense: believers are actually in a better position to make the translation.
One might object that the second point presupposes an asymmetry between public secular reasons, to which both sides have access in principle, and religious reasons, to which only believers have initial and direct access. However, that objection supports Habermas's position, and so leads into the third extension of his view. The objection calls into question the assumption that everyone should in principle have equal access to secular reason. Once we question that assumption, it is unclear why secular reasons should have a privileged place in political discourse. However, to reject the public position of secular reasons, at least in a pluralistic polity, is to say there is no public reason. Rather, each citizen's perspective, religious or not, is comprehensive and somewhat opaque to others. In that case, however, every citizen now faces burdens of translation that she can shoulder only with the interlocutor's assistance. So the believer is not relieved of translation. Instead, everyone is now burdened by translation. To be sure, one might also remove the asymmetry between access to secular and religious reason by making each sort of discourse equally accessible to all in principle. But that view hardly does justice to the existential import of religious experience, and so should be rejected by believers.
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